The Definition of Morality

First published Wed Apr 17, 2002; substantive revision Mon Feb 8, 2016

The topic of this entry is not—at least directly—moral theory; rather, it is the definition of morality. Moral theories are large and complex things; definitions are not. The question of the definition of morality is the question of identifying the target of moral theorizing. Identifying this target enables us to see different moral theories as attempting to capture the very same thing. In this way, the distinction between a definition of morality and a moral theory parallels the distinction John Rawls (1971: 9) drew between the general concept of justice and various detailed conceptions of it. Rawls’ terminology, however, suggests a psychological distinction, and also suggests that many people have conceptions of justice. But the definition/theory distinction is not psychological, and only moral theorists typically have moral theories.

There does not seem to be much reason to think that a single definition of morality will be applicable to all moral discussions. One reason for this is that “morality” seems to be used in two distinct broad senses: a descriptive sense and a normative sense. More particularly, the term “morality” can be used either

  1. descriptively to refer to certain codes of conduct put forward by a society or a group (such as a religion), or accepted by an individual for her own behavior, or
  2. normatively to refer to a code of conduct that, given specified conditions, would be put forward by all rational persons.

Which of these two senses of “morality” a theorist is using plays a crucial, although sometimes unacknowledged, role in the development of an ethical theory. If one uses “morality” in its descriptive sense, and therefore uses it to refer to codes of conduct actually put forward by distinct groups or societies, one will almost certainly deny that there is a universal morality that applies to all human beings. The descriptive use of “morality” is the one used by anthropologists when they report on the morality of the societies that they study. Recently, some comparative and evolutionary psychologists (Haidt 2006; Hauser 2006; De Waal 1996) have taken morality, or a close anticipation of it, to be present among groups of non-human animals: primarily, but not exclusively, other primates.

Any definition of “morality” in the descriptive sense will need to specify which of the codes put forward by a society or group count as moral. Even in small homogeneous societies that have no written language, distinctions are sometimes made between morality, etiquette, law, and religion. And in larger and more complex societies these distinctions are often sharply marked. So “morality” cannot be taken to refer to every code of conduct put forward by a society.

In the normative sense, “morality” refers to a code of conduct that would be accepted by anyone who meets certain intellectual and volitional conditions, almost always including the condition of being rational. That a person meets these conditions is typically expressed by saying that the person counts as a moral agent. However, merely showing that a certain code would be accepted by any moral agent is not enough to show that the code is the moral code. It might well be that all moral agents would also accept a code of prudence or rationality, but this would not by itself show that prudence was part of morality.

As we’ve just seen, not all codes that are put forward by societies or groups are moral codes in the descriptive sense of morality, and not all codes that would be accepted by all moral agents are moral codes in the normative sense of morality. So any definition of morality—in either sense—will require further criteria. Still, each of these two very brief descriptions of codes might be regarded as offering some features of morality that would be included in any adequate definition. In that way they might be taken to be offering some definitional features of morality, in each of its two senses. When one has specified enough definitional features to allow one to classify all the relevant moral theories as theories of a common subject, one might then be taken to have given a definition of morality. This is the sense of “definition” at work in this entry.

Explicit attempts to define morality are hard to find, at least since the beginning of the 20th century. One possible explanation for this is the combined effect of early positivistic worries about the metaphysical status of normative properties, followed (or augmented) by Wittgensteinian worries about definitions of any significant terms whatsoever. Whatever the explanation, when definitions have been offered, they have tended to be directed at the notion of moral judgment (Hare 1952, 1981) rather than at morality itself. To the degree that these definitions are adequate, they might, without much effort, be converted into definitions of morality in the descriptive sense. For example, a particular person’s morality might be regarded as the content of the basic moral judgments that person is prepared to accept. However, as G. Wallace and A.D.M. Walker (1970) note, virtually all “definitions” of moral judgments are only the specification of one definitional feature or another.

What counts as definitional of morality, in either sense of “morality”, is controversial. Moreover, the line between what is part of a definition, in the sense at issue, and what is part of a moral theory, is not entirely sharp. For example, some might regard it as definitional of morality, in the normative sense, that it governs only interpersonal interactions. Others, however, might take this to be a substantive theoretical claim. Some might take it as definitional of “morality” in its descriptive sense that it be a code of conduct that a person or group takes to be most important. But others might say that attention to religion casts doubt on this idea.

“Morality”, when used in a descriptive sense, has an important feature that “morality” in the normative sense does not have: a feature that stems from its relational nature. This feature is the following: that if one is not a member of the relevant society or group, or is not the relevant individual, then accepting a certain account of the content of morality, in the descriptive sense, has no implications for how one should behave. On the other hand, if one accepts a moral theory’s account of moral agents, and the specifications of the conditions under which all moral agents would endorse a code of conduct as a moral code, then one accepts that moral theory’s normative definition of “morality”. Accepting an account of “morality” in the normative sense commits one to regarding some behavior as immoral, perhaps even behavior that one is tempted to perform. Because accepting an account of “morality” in the normative sense involves this commitment, it is not surprising that philosophers seriously disagree about which account to accept.

1. Descriptive definitions of “morality”

An initial naïve attempt at a descriptive definition of “morality” might take it to refer to the most important code of conduct put forward by a society and accepted by the members of that society. But the existence of large and heterogeneous societies raises conceptual problems for such a descriptive definition, since there may not be any such society-wide code that is regarded as most important. As a result, a definition might be offered in which “morality” refers to the most important code of conduct put forward and accepted by any group, or even by an individual. Apart from containing some prohibitions on harming (certain) others, different moralities—when “morality” is understood in this way—can vary in content quite substantially.

In the middle of the 20th century the dominant sense of “morality” seems to have been the descriptive sense. This is strikingly illustrated by the fact that both C.H. Whitely and Neil Cooper took themselves to be revealing the important ambiguity in the meaning of “morality” when they distinguished the sociological sense from the psychological (Whiteley 1959) and the social sense from the individual (Cooper 1966). But according to the taxonomy at the heart of this entry, all of these are versions of the descriptive sense, distinguished primarily by the size of the relevant group.

Etiquette is sometimes included as a part of morality, applying to norms that are considered less serious than the kinds of norms for behavior that are more central to morality. Hobbes expresses this sort of view when he uses the term “small morals” to describe “decency of behavior, as how one man should salute another, or how a man should wash his mouth or pick his teeth before company”, and distinguishes these from “those qualities of mankind that concern their living together in peace and unity” (1660/1994, Chapter XI, paragraph 1). When etiquette is included as part of morality, morality is almost always being understood in the descriptive sense. One reason for this is that it is clear that the rules of etiquette are relative to a society or group. Moreover, there are no plausible conditions under which we could pick out the “correct” rules of etiquette as those that would be accepted by all rational beings.

Law is distinguished from morality by having explicit written rules, penalties, and officials who interpret the laws and apply the penalties. Although there is often considerable overlap in the conduct governed by morality and that governed by law, laws are often evaluated—and changed—on moral grounds. Some theorists, including Ronald Dworkin (1986), have even maintained that the interpretation of law must make use of morality.

Although the morality of a group or society may derive from its religion, morality and religion are not the same thing, even in that case. Morality is only a guide to conduct, whereas religion is always more than this. For example, religion includes stories about events in the past, usually about supernatural beings, that are used to explain or justify the behavior that it prohibits or requires. Although there is often a considerable overlap in the conduct prohibited or required by religion and that prohibited or required by morality, religions may prohibit or require more than is prohibited or required by guides to behavior that are explicitly labeled as moral guides, and may allow some behavior that is prohibited by morality. Even when morality is not regarded as the code of conduct that is put forward by a formal religion, it is often thought to require some religious explanation and justification. However, just as with law, some religious practices and precepts are criticized on moral grounds, e.g., that the practice or precept involves discrimination on the basis of race, gender, or sexual orientation.

When “morality” is used simply to refer to a code of conduct put forward by an actual group, including a society, even if it is distinguished from etiquette, law, and religion, it is being used in a descriptive sense. It is also being used in the descriptive sense when it refers to important attitudes of individuals. Just as one can refer to the morality of the Greeks, so one can refer to the morality of a particular person. This descriptive use of “morality” is now becoming more prominent because of the work of psychologists such as Jonathan Haidt (2006), who have been influenced by the views of David Hume (1751), including his attempt to present a naturalistic account of moral judgments. In the 20th century R.M. Hare, in his earlier books (1952, 1963), regarded moral judgments as those judgments that override all nonmoral judgments and that would be universalized by the person making the judgment. This account of moral judgments naturally leads to a view of morality as being concerned with behavior that a person regards as most important and as a guide to conduct that he wants everyone to adopt.

Guides to behavior that are regarded as moralities normally involve avoiding and preventing harm to others (Frankena 1980), and perhaps some norm of honesty (Strawson 1961). But all of them involve other matters as well. Hare’s view of morality as that which is most important allows that these other matters may be more important than avoiding and preventing harm to others. This view of morality as concerning that which is most important to a person or group allows matters related to religious practices and precepts, or matters related to customs and traditions, e.g., purity and sanctity, to be more important than avoiding and preventing harm.

When “morality” is used in a descriptive sense, moralities can differ from each other quite extensively in their content and in the foundation that members of the society claim their morality to have. A society might have a moral code according to which practices as necessary for purity or sanctity are more important than practices related to whether other persons are harmed. A society may take as morally most important that certain rituals are performed or that certain sexual practices are prohibited, than that harms are avoided or prevented. Some societies may claim that their morality, which is more concerned with purity and sanctity, is based on the commands of God. The descriptive sense of “morality”, which allows for the view that morality is based on religion in this way, picks out codes of conduct that are often in significant conflict with all normative accounts of morality. When this happens, those who use “morality” in the normative sense discussed in the following section generally hold all moral agents should follow the moral code, independent of their religious beliefs. Moreover, most normative accounts entail that all moral agents would endorse morality, at least under certain circumstances. And most accounts of moral agency at work in such accounts do not include any negative attitudes toward harmless consensual sexual behavior. Many religions condemn certain harmless consensual sexual behavior as immoral, but other religions, which hold that morality is primarily concerned with avoiding and preventing harm, condemn these attitudes themselves as harmful and immoral.

A society might have a morality that takes accepting its traditions and customs, including accepting the authority of certain people and emphasizing loyalty to the group, as more important than avoiding and preventing harm. Such a morality might not count as immoral any behavior that shows loyalty to the preferred group, even if that behavior causes significant harm to innocent people who are not in that group. Acting altruistically, at least with regard to those in the group, might be nearly equated with acting morally, regardless of its effects on those outside of the group. The familiarity of this kind of morality, which makes in-group loyalty almost equivalent to morality, seems to allow some comparative and evolutionary psychologists, including Frans De Waal (1996), to regard non-human animals to be acting in ways very similar to those that are regarded as moral.

It is possible for a society have a morality that is concerned primarily with minimizing the harms that human beings can suffer. Such a society might claim that their morality is based on some universal features of human nature or of all rational beings. Although all societies include more than just a concern for minimizing harm to (some) human beings in their moralities, this feature of morality, unlike purity and sanctity, or accepting authority and emphasizing loyalty, is included in everything that is regarded as a morality by any society. Because minimizing harm can conflict with accepting authority and emphasizing loyalty, there can be fundamental disagreements within a society about the morally right way to behave in particular kinds of situations. Philosophers such as Bentham (1789) and Mill (1861), who accept a normative account of morality that takes the avoiding and preventing harm element of morality to be most important, criticize all actual moralities (referred to by “morality” in the descriptive sense) that give precedence to purity and loyalty when they are in conflict with avoiding and preventing harm.

Some psychologists, such as Haidt, take morality to include concern with, at least, all three of the triad of (1) harm, (2) purity, and (3) loyalty, and hold that different members of a society can and do take different features of morality to be most important. Most societies have moralities that are concerned with, at least, all three members of this triad. Concern with harm appears in the form of enforceable rules against killing, causing pain, mutilating, etc. But beyond a concern with avoiding and preventing such harms to members of certain groups, there may be no common content shared by all moralities in the descriptive sense. Nor may there be any common justification that those who accept morality claim for it; some may appeal to religion, others to tradition, and others to rational human nature. Beyond the concern with harm mentioned above, the only other features that all descriptive moralities have in common is that they are put forward by an individual or a group, usually a society, in which case they provide a guide for the behavior of the people in that group or society. In this descriptive sense of “morality”, morality might allow slavery or might allow people with one skin color or gender to behave in ways that those with a different skin color or gender are not allowed to behave. In this descriptive sense of “morality”, morality may not even incorporate impartiality with regard to all moral agents, and it may not be universalizable in any significant way (compare MacIntyre 1957).

Although most philosophers do not use “morality” in any of the above descriptive senses, some philosophers do. Ethical relativists such as Harman (1975), Westermarck (1960), Prinz (2007), and Wong (1984, 2006) deny that there is any universal normative morality and claim that the actual moralities of societies or individuals are the only moralities there are. These relativists hold that only when the term “morality” is used in this descriptive sense is there something that “morality” actually refers to: a code of conduct put forward by a society or accepted by an individual. They claim that it is a mistake to take “morality” to refer to a universal code of conduct that, under certain conditions, would be endorsed by all rational persons. Although ethical relativists admit that many speakers of English use “morality” to refer to such a universal code of conduct, they claim such persons are mistaken in thinking that there is anything that is the referent of the word “morality” taken in that sense. The harm caused by Christian missionaries who used morality as a basis for trying to change the practices of the societies with which they came in contact may have been one of the reasons why many anthropologists endorsed ethical relativism. It is interesting that one basis for criticizing the behavior of these Christian missionaries is that it caused harm to the people in those societies, since this is a basis that would be endorsed by those who use “morality” in the normative sense.

When used with its descriptive sense, “morality” can refer to codes of conduct with widely differing content, and still be used unambiguously. This parallels the way in which “law” is used unambiguously even though different societies have laws with widely differing content. However, when “morality” is used in its descriptive sense, it sometimes does not refer to the code of a society, but to the code of a group or an individual. As a result, when the guide to conduct put forward by, for example, a religious group conflicts with the guide to conduct put forward by a society, it is not clear whether to say that there are conflicting moralities, conflicting elements within morality, or that the code of the religious group conflicts with morality. Members of the society who are also members of a religious group may regard both guides as elements of morality and differ with respect to which of the conflicting elements of the moral guide they consider most important. There are likely to be significant moral disputes between those who consider different elements to be more important.

In small homogeneous societies there may be a guide to behavior that is put forward by the society and that is accepted by (almost) all members of the society. For such societies there is (almost) no ambiguity about which guide “morality” refers to. However, in larger societies people often belong to groups that put forward guides to behavior that conflict with the guide put forward by their society, and members of the society do not always accept the guide put forward by their society. If they accept the conflicting guide of some other group to which they belong (often a religious group) rather than the guide put forward by their society, in cases of conflict they will regard those who follow the guide put forward by their society as acting immorally.

The above considerations may suggest the use of a descriptive sense of “morality” according to which morality is that guide to behavior that is regarded by an individual as overriding and that he wants to be universally adopted. Understood in this way “morality” refers to a guide to behavior accepted by an individual rather than that put forward by a society or any other group. But, in this sense, “morality” does not refer to just any guide to behavior accepted by an individual; it is that guide to behavior that the individual accepts as his overriding guide, and wants everyone in his group to accept as their overriding guide as well. This sense of “morality” is a descriptive sense, because a person can refer to some other individual’s morality without endorsing it. When relativized to an individual in this way, morality has less limitation on content than when it is taken to refer to the code of conduct put forward by a society or group. Whatever guide to behavior an individual regards as overriding and wants to be accepted by everyone in his group is that individual’s morality. Still, if the person is rational, this guide will include prohibitions on causing harm.

When people explicitly talk about the morality of a group other than their own or of a person other than themselves, it is usually clear that they are using “morality” in a specific descriptive sense. However, when a person simply claims that morality prohibits or requires a given action, then the term “morality” is genuinely ambiguous. It is not clear whether it refers to (1) a guide to behavior that is put forward by a society, to which that person might or might not belong; (2) a guide that is put forward by a group, to which that person might or might not belong; (3) a guide that someone, perhaps that very person, regards as overriding and wants adopted by everyone else, or (4) a universal guide that all rational persons would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents. When a person uses “morality” to refer to a guide to conduct put forward by a group, unless it is his own group, it is usually only being used in its descriptive sense. Someone referring to morality in the descriptive sense of “morality” need not be endorsing it. When “morality” refers to a guide to conduct accepted by an individual, unless that individual is himself, it is usually being used in its descriptive sense. However, if the individual is referring to his own morality, he is usually using it normatively; that is, he would usually accept the claim that all rational persons, at least under certain conditions, would endorse it.

“Ethics” is sometimes taken to refer to a guide to behavior wider in scope than morality, and that an individual adopts as his or her own guide to life, as long as it is a guide that the individual views as a proper guide for others. When a general guide to behavior of this sort endorses self-interest as primary this is usually because acting in one’s self interest is taken as fostering the interests of all. However, Sidgwick (1874) regarded moral rules as any rational rules of conduct. Moreover, because he held that it is rational to take one’s self-interest as primary, even if others are seriously harmed, he held that “ethical egoism” was an ethical theory. He may have been the primary source of the current philosophical practice that includes ethical egoism—a view that endorses acting in one’s own self-interest even when this requires harming innocent people—as an ethical theory. Because all moralities in the descriptive sense include a prohibition on harming others, ethical egoism is not a morality in the descriptive sense. Because, as will be explained in the following section, all moralities in the normative sense not only include prohibitions on harming others but also are such that all rational persons would endorse that morality, ethical egoism is not a morality in the normative sense either. Only if one equates moral rules with rational rules of conduct—as Sidgwick does—is it possible to regard a guide to conduct that takes one’s own self-interest as sanctioning harming innocent others as a moral guide. Sidgwick does this, but he is decidedly in the minority in this respect.

In the descriptive sense of “morality”, a person’s own morality cannot be a guide to behavior that that person would prefer others not to follow. However, that fact that an individual adopts a moral code of conduct for his own use does not entail that the person requires it to be adopted by anyone else. An individual may adopt for himself a very demanding moral guide that he thinks may be too difficult for most others to follow. He may judge people who do not adopt his code of conduct as not being as morally good as he is, without judging them to be immoral if they do not adopt it. However, such cases do not undermine the restriction; a guide is plausibly referred to as a morality only when the individual would be willing for others to follow it, at least if “follow” is taken to mean “successfully follow”. For it may be that the individual would not be willing for others to try to follow that code, because of worries about the bad effects of predictable failures due to partiality or lack of sufficient foresight or intelligence.

2. Normative definitions of “morality”

Those who use “morality” normatively hold that morality is (or would be) the code that meets the following condition: all rational persons, under certain specified conditions, would endorse it. Indeed, this is a plausible basic schema for definitions of “morality” in the normative sense. Although some hold that no code could meet the condition, many theorists hold that there is one that does; we can call the former “moral skeptics” and the latter “moral realists”.

Many moral skeptics would reject the claim that there are any universal ethical claims, where the ethical is a broader category than the moral. But another interesting class of moral skeptics includes those who think that we should only abandon the narrower category of the moral—partly because of the notion of a code that is central to that category. These moral skeptics hold that we should do our ethical theorizing in terms of the good life, or the virtues. Elizabeth Anscombe (1958) gave expression to this kind of view, which also finds echoes in the work of Bernard Williams (1985). On the other hand, some virtue theorists might take perfect rationality to entail virtue, and might understand morality to be something like the code that such a person would implicitly endorse by acting in virtuous ways. In that case, even a virtue theorist might count as a moral realist in the sense above.

Consequentialist views might not seem to fit the basic schema for definitions of “morality”, since they do not appear to make reference to the notions of endorsement or rationality. But this appearance is deceptive. Mill (1861: 12) himself explicitly defines morality as

the rules and precepts for human conduct, by the observance of which [a happy existence] might be, to the greatest extent possible, secured.

And he thinks that the mind is not in a “right state” unless it is in “the state most conducive to the general happiness”—in which case it would certainly favor morality. And the act-consequentialist J.J.C. Smart (1956) is also explicit that he is thinking of ethics as the study of how it is most rational to behave. His embrace of utilitarianism is the result of his belief that maximizing utility is always the rational thing to do. On reflection this is not surprising. Unless one thinks that rational people would endorse the moral system one is defending, one will have to admit that, having been shown that a certain behavior is morally required, a rational person might simply shrug and say “So what? What is that to me?” And, though some exceptions are mentioned below, very few moral realists think that their arguments leave this option open. Even fewer think this option remains open if we are allowed to add some additional conditions beyond mere rationality: a restriction on beliefs, for example (similar to Rawls’ (1971: 118) veil of ignorance), or impartiality.

Definitions of morality in the normative sense—and, consequently, moral theories—differ in their accounts of rationality, and in their specifications of the conditions under which all rational persons would necessarily endorse the code of conduct that therefore would count as morality. These definitions and theories also differ in how they understand what it is to endorse a code in the relevant way. Related to these differences, definitions of “morality”—and moral theories—differ with regard to those to whom morality applies: that is, those whose behavior is subject to moral judgment. Some hold that morality applies only to those rational beings that have certain specific features of human beings: features that make it rational for them to endorse morality. These features might, for example, include fallibility and vulnerability. Other moral theories claim to put forward an account of morality that provides a guide to all rational beings, even if these beings do not have these human characteristics, e.g., God.

Among those who use “morality” normatively, virtually all hold that “morality” refers to a code of conduct that applies to all who can understand it and can govern their behavior by it, though many hold that it protects a larger group. Among such theorists it is also common to hold that morality should never be overridden. That is, it is common to hold that no one should ever violate a moral prohibition or requirement for non-moral reasons. This claim is trivial if “should” is taken to mean “morally should”. So the claim about moral overridingness is typically understood with “should” meaning “rationally should”, with the result that moral requirements are asserted to be rational requirements. Though common, this view is by no means always taken as definitional. Sidgwick (1874) despaired of showing that rationality required us to choose morality over egoism, though he certainly did not think rationality required egoism either. More explicitly, Gert (2005) held that though moral behavior is always rationally permissible, it is not always rationally required. Foot (1972) seems to have held that any reason—and therefore any rational requirement—to act morally would have to stem from a contingent commitment or an objective interest. And she also seems to have held that sometimes neither of these sorts of reasons might be available. Finally, moral realists who hold desire-based theories of reasons and formal, means/end theories of rationality would explicitly deny that moral behavior is always even rationally permissible (Goldman 2009). Still, even theorists such as Sidgwick, Gert, Foot, and Goldman are by no means precluded from using “morality” in the normative sense, since this entails only holding that rational people would put a certain system forward—not that they would always be motivated to follow that system themselves. But to the degree that a theorist would deny even the claim about endorsement, and therefore hold that rational people might not only fail to act morally, but might even reject it as a public system, that theorist is either not using “morality” in a normative sense, or is denying the existence of morality. Such a theorist may be using “morality” in a descriptive sense, or may not have any particular sense in mind, and explicitly be relying on context to fix the sense.

When “morality” is used in its normative sense, it need not have either of the two formal features that are essential to moralities referred to by the descriptive sense: that it be a code of conduct that is put forward by a society, group, or individual and that it be accepted as a guide to behavior by the members of that society or group, or by that individual. Indeed, it is possible that morality, in the normative sense, has never been put forward by any particular society, by any group at all, or even by any individual.

If one is a moral realist, and one also acknowledges the descriptive sense of “morality”, one may require that descriptive moralities at least approximate, in some ways, morality in the normative sense. That is, one might claim that the guides to behavior of some societies lack so many of the essential features of morality, in the normative sense, that it is incorrect to say that these societies even have a morality in a descriptive sense. This is an extreme view, however. A more moderate position would hold that all societies have something that can be regarded as their morality, but that many of these moralities—perhaps, indeed, all of them—are defective. That is, a moral realist might hold that although these actual guides to behavior have enough of the features of normative morality to be classified as descriptive moralities, they would not be endorsed in their entirety by all moral agents.

Moral realists do not claim that any actual society has or has ever had morality as its actual guide to conduct. However, “natural law” theories of morality claim that any rational person in any society, even one that has a defective morality, can know the general kinds of actions that morality prohibits, requires, discourages, encourages, and allows. In the theological version of natural law theories, such as that put forward by Aquinas, this is because God implanted this knowledge in the reason of all persons. In the secular version of natural law theories, such as that put forward by Hobbes (1660), natural reason is sufficient to allow all rational persons to know what morality prohibits, requires, etc. Natural law theorists also claim that morality applies to all rational persons, not only those now living, but also those who lived in the past. These are not empirical claims about morality; they are claims about what is essential to morality, or about what is meant by “morality” when it is used normatively.

In contrast to natural law theories, other moral theories do not hold quite so strong a view about the universality of knowledge of morality. Still, many hold that morality is known to all who can legitimately be judged by it. Baier (1958), Rawls (1971) and contractarians deny that there can be an esoteric morality: one that judges people even though they cannot know what it prohibits, requires, etc. For all of the above theorists, morality is what we can call a public system: a system of norms (1) that is knowable by all those to whom it applies and (2) that is not irrational for any of those to whom it applies to follow (Gert 2005: 10). Moral judgments of blame thus differ from legal or religious judgments of blame in that they cannot be made about persons who are legitimately ignorant of what they are required to do. Act consequentialists seem to hold that everyone should know that they are morally required to act so as to bring about the best consequences, but even they do not seem to think judgments of moral blame are appropriate if a person is legitimately ignorant of what action would bring about the best consequences (Singer 1993: 228). Parallel views seem to be held by rule consequentialists (Hooker 2001: 72).

The ideal situation for a legal system would be that it be a public system. But in any large society this is not possible. As a result, sometimes people are held legally responsible for violating rules about which they were legitimately ignorant, and even when it would have been irrational for them to have followed those rules. Games are closer to being public systems and most adults playing a game know its rules, or they know that there are judges whose interpretation determines what behavior the game prohibits, requires, etc. Although a game is often a public system, its rules apply only to those playing the game. If a person does not care enough about the game to abide by the rules, she can usually quit. Morality is the one public system that no rational person can quit. This is the point that Kant, without completely realizing it, captured by saying that morality is categorical. This characteristic goes beyond what Brink (1997) intended by saying morality is “inescapable”, since for him inescapability is merely a negative matter of not depending on one’s desires or interests. The rules of a club are inescapable in this way, even though one can escape them by quitting the club. Rather, the fact that one cannot quit morality means that one can do nothing to escape being legitimately liable to sanction for violating its norms, except by ceasing to be a moral agent. Morality applies to people simply by virtue of their being rational persons who know what morality prohibits, requires, etc., and being able to guide their behavior accordingly. Of course there is dispute about what it takes to be able to guide one’s behavior according to morality. For example, some (Levy 2007) might say that psychopaths cannot do so, while others might make the opposite claim (Haji 2003). But in general one’s answer to this question about psychopaths will parallel one’s views about whether or not morality applies to them.

Public systems can be formal or informal. To say a public system is informal is to say that it has no authoritative judges and no decision procedure that provides a unique guide to action in all situations, or that resolves all disagreements. To say that a public system is formal is to say that it has one or both of these things (Gert 2005: 9). Professional basketball is a formal public system; all the players know that what the referees call a foul determines what is a foul. Pickup basketball is an informal public system. The existence of persistent moral disagreements shows that morality is most plausibly regarded as an informal public system. This is true even for such moral theories as the Divine Command theory and act utilitarianism, inasmuch as there are no authoritative judges of God’s will, or of which act will maximize utility, and there are no decision procedures for determining these things (Scanlon 2011: 261–2). When persistent moral disagreement is recognized, those who understand that morality is an informal public system admit that how one should act is morally unresolvable, and if some resolution is required, the political or legal system can be used to resolve it. These formal systems have the means to provide unique guides, but they do not provide the uniquely correct moral guide to the action that should be performed.

An important example of a moral problem left unsettled by the informal public system of morality is whether fetuses are impartially protected by morality and so whether or under what conditions abortions are allowed. There is continuing disagreement among fully informed moral agents about this moral question, even though the legal and political system in the United States has provided fairly clear guidelines about the conditions under which abortion is legally allowed. Despite this important and controversial issue, morality, like all informal public systems, presupposes agreement on how to act in most moral situations, e.g., all agree that killing or seriously harming any moral agent requires strong justification in order to be morally allowed. No one thinks it is morally justified to cheat, deceive, injure, or kill a moral agent simply in order to gain sufficient money to take a fantastic vacation. Many violations of moral rules are such that no rational person would be willing for all moral agents to know that violating the moral rule in these circumstances is morally allowed. However, moral matters are often thought to be controversial because these everyday decisions, about which there is no controversy, are rarely discussed. The amount of agreement concerning what rules are moral rules, and on when it is justified to violate one of these rules, explains why morality can be a public system even though it is an informal system.

Now that we have the notion of an informal public system available, we can improve the basic schema for definitions of “morality” in the normative sense. The old schema was that morality is the code that all rational persons, under certain specified conditions, would endorse. The improved schema is that morality is the informal public system that all rational persons, under certain specified conditions, would endorse. Some theorists might not regard the informal nature of the moral system as definitional, holding that morality might give precise answers to every question. This would have the result that conscientious moral agents often cannot know what morality permits, requires, or allows. Some philosophers deny that this is a genuine possibility.

On any definition of “morality”, whether descriptive or normative, it is a code of conduct. However, on ethical- or group-relativist accounts or on individualistic accounts—all of which are best regarded as accounts of morality in the descriptive sense—morality often has no special content that distinguishes it from nonmoral codes of conduct, such as law or religion. Just as a legal code of conduct can have almost any content, as long as it is capable of guiding behavior, and a religious code of conduct has no limits on content, most relativist and individualist accounts of morality place few limits on the content of a moral code (an exception is Wong 2006). Of course, actual codes do have certain minimal limits—otherwise the societies they characterize would lack the minimum required degree of social cooperation required to sustain their existence over time. On the other hand, for moral realists who explicitly hold that morality is an informal public system that all rational persons would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents, it has a fairly definite content. Hobbes (1660), Mill (1861), and most other non-religiously influenced philosophers in the Anglo-American tradition limit morality to behavior that, directly or indirectly, affects others.

The claim that morality only governs behavior that affects others is somewhat controversial, and so probably should not be counted as definitional, even if it turns out to be entailed by the correct moral theory. Some have claimed that morality also governs behavior that affects only the agent herself, such as taking recreational drugs, masturbation, and not developing one’s talents. Kant (1785) may provide an account of this wide concept of morality. Interpreted this way, Kant’s theory still fits the basic schema, but includes these self-regarding moral requirements because of the particular account of rationality he employs. However, pace Kant, it is doubtful that all moral agents would put forward a universal guide to behavior that governs behavior that does not affect them at all. Indeed, when the concept of morality is completely distinguished from religion, moral rules do seem to limit their content to behavior that directly or indirectly causes or risks harm to others. Some behavior that seems to affect only oneself, e.g., taking recreational drugs, may have a significant indirect harmful effect on others by supporting the illegal and harmful activity of those who benefit from the sale of those drugs.

Confusion about the content of morality sometimes arises because morality is not distinguished sufficiently from religion. Regarding self-affecting behavior as governed by morality is supported by the idea that we are created by God and are obliged to obey God’s commands, and so may be a holdover from the time when morality was not clearly distinguished from religion. This religious holdover might also affect the claim that some sexual practices such as homosexuality are immoral. Those who clearly distinguish morality from religion typically do not regard sexual orientation as a moral matter. Many secular American colleges and universities prohibit discrimination on the basis of sexual orientation, and it is quite common for these college and university officials, as well as other public officials, to condemn homophobic behavior as immoral just as they condemn racist behavior as immoral.

It is possible to hold that having a certain sort of social goal is definitional of morality (Frankena 1963). Stephen Toumlin (1950) took it to be the harmony of society. Baier (1958) took it to be “the good of everyone alike”. Utilitarians sometimes claim it is the production of the greatest good. Gert (2005) took it to be the lessening of evil or harm. This latter goal may seem to be a significant narrowing of the utilitarian claim, but utilitarians always include the lessening of harm as essential to producing the greatest good and almost all of their examples involve the avoiding or preventing of harm. In favor of the focus on lessening harm, it is notable that the paradigm cases of moral rules are those that prohibit causing harm directly or indirectly, such as rules prohibiting killing, causing pain, deceiving, and breaking promises. Even those precepts that require or encourage positive action, such as helping the needy, are almost always related to preventing or relieving harms, rather than promoting goods such as pleasure. It should be clear that all rational persons would include these paradigm moral precepts in the moral code that they would put forward to guide the behavior of all moral agents. The question is whether they would also include precepts that require or encourage the promotion of positive benefits when such benefits do not count as the relieving of deprivation. For example, if they would include a moral precept encouraging people to be more entertaining or to cook tastier meals, then Gert would be wrong.

Among the views of moral realists, differences in content are less significant than similarities. For all such philosophers, morality prohibits actions such as killing, causing pain, deceiving, and breaking promises. For some, morality also requires charitable actions, but failure to act charitably on every possible occasion does not require justification in the same way that any act of killing, causing pain, deceiving, and breaking promises requires justification. Both Kant (1785) and Mill (1861) distinguish between duties of perfect obligation and duties of imperfect obligation and regard not harming as the former kind of duty and helping as the latter kind of duty. For Gert (2005), morality encourages charitable action, but does not require it; it is always morally good to be charitable, but it is not immoral not to be charitable.

Even if the plausible basic schema for definitions of “morality” in the normative sense is accepted, one’s understanding of what morality is, in this sense, will still depend very significantly on how one understands rationality. As has already been mentioned, morality, in the normative sense, is sometimes taken to prohibit certain forms of consensual sexual activity, or the use of recreational drugs. However, such prohibitions need not be included in an account of morality as a universal guide that all rational persons would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents. One need not regard it as irrational to favor harmless consensual sexual activities, or to favor the use of certain drugs for purely recreational purposes.

One concept of rationality that supports the exclusion of sexual matters, at least at the basic level, from the norms of morality, is that for an action to count as irrational it must be an act that harms oneself without producing a compensating benefit for someone—perhaps oneself, perhaps someone else. Such an account of rationality might be called “hybrid”, since it gives different roles to self-interest and to altruism. An account of morality based on the hybrid concept of rationality could agree with Hobbes (1660) that morality is concerned with promoting people living together in peace and harmony, which includes obeying the rules prohibiting causing harm to others. Although moral prohibitions against actions that cause harm or significantly increase the risk of harm are not absolute, in order to avoid acting immorally, justification is always needed when violating these prohibitions. Kant (1797) seems to hold that it is never justified to violate some of these prohibitions, e.g., the prohibition against lying. This is largely a result of the fact that Kant’s (1785) concept of rationality is purely formal, in contrast with the hybrid concept of rationality described above.

Most moral realists who offer moral theories do not bother to offer anything like a definition of morality. Instead, what these philosophers offer is a theory of the nature and justification of a set of norms with which they take their audience already to be acquainted. In effect, they tacitly pick morality out by reference to certain salient and relative uncontroversial bits of its content: that it prohibits killing, stealing, deceiving, cheating, and so on. In fact, this would not be a bad way of defining morality, if the point of such a definition were only to be relatively theory-neutral, and to allow theorizing to begin. We could call it “the reference-fixing definition” or “the substantive definition”.

Some, including Hare (1952, 1963), have been tempted to argue against the possibility of a substantive definition of morality, on the basis of the claim that moral disapproval is an attitude that can be directed at anything whatsoever. Foot (1958a, 1958b), argued against this idea, but the substantive definition still has the drawback is that it does not, somehow, seem to get at the essence of morality. One might suggest that the substantive definition has the advantage of including Divine Command theories of morality, while such theories might seem to make trouble for definitions based on the plausible schema given above. But it is plausible to hold that Divine Command theories rest on Natural Law theories, which do in fact fit the schema. Divine Command theory that do not rest on Natural Law might make trouble for the schema, but one might also think that such theories rest instead on a confusion, since they seem to entail that God might have made it immoral to act beneficently.

3. Variations

As one gives more substance and detail to the general notions of endorsement, rationality, and the relevant conditions under which rational people would endorse morality, one moves further from providing a definition of morality in the normative sense, and closer to providing an actual moral theory. And a similar claim is true for definitions of morality in the descriptive sense, as one specifies in more detail what one means in claiming that a person or group endorses a system or code. In the following four sections, four broad ways of making the definitions of morality more precise are presented. They are all sufficiently schematic to be regarded as varieties of definition, rather than as theories.

3.1 Morality as linked to norms for responses to behavior

Expressivists about morality do not take there to be any objective content to morality that could underwrite what we above called “the substantive definition”. Rather, they explicitly recognize the existence of significant variation in what rules and ideals different people put forward as morality in the normative sense. And they doubt that this variation is compatible with moral realism. Consequently, they need to offer some unifying features of these different sets of rules and ideals, despite variation in their content. As a result of this pressure, some expressivists end up offering explicit accounts of a distinctively moral attitude one might hold towards an act token or type. These accounts can of course be taken to underwrite various forms of morality in the descriptive sense. But they can also be taken to provide the basis of one form of moral realism.

To see how an expressivist view can be co-opted by a moral realist of a certain sort, consider Allan Gibbard’s (1990) moral expressivism. Gibbard holds that moral judgments are expressions of the acceptance of norms for feeling the emotions of guilt and anger. One can accept Gibbard’s view of what it is to endorse a moral claim without accepting the view that, in conflicts, all disagreements are faultless. That is, even a moral realist can use Gibbard’s view of the nature of moral judgment, and extract from it a definition of morality. Used by such a theorist, Gibbard’s view entails that morality, in the normative sense, is the code that is picked out by the correct set of norms for feeling guilt and anger: that is, the norms a rational person would endorse. This is equivalent to accepting the plausible general schema for a definition of “morality” given above, and understanding endorsement in a special sense. To endorse a code in the relevant way, on this definition, is to think that violations of its norms make guilt and anger appropriate.

Closely related to Gibbard’s account is one according to which the norms of relevance are not norms for the emotions, but are norms for other reactions to behavior. For example, a person’s morality might be the set of rules and ideals they regard as picked out by appropriate norms for praise and blame, and other social sanctions (Sprigge 1964: 317). In fact, reference to praise and blame may be more adequate than reference to guilt and anger, since the latter seem only to pick out moral prohibitions, and not to make room for the idea that morality also recommends or encourages certain behaviors even if it does not require them. For example, it is plausible that there is such a thing as supererogatory action, and that the specification of what counts as supererogatory is part of morality—whether in the descriptive or normative sense. But it does not seem likely that we can account for this part of morality by appeal to norms for guilt and anger, and it is not at all clear that there are emotions that are as closely linked to supererogation as guilt and anger are to moral transgression. On the other hand, it seems plausible that norms for praising action might help to pick out what counts as supererogatory.

Another version of the present strategy would replace talk of praise and blame with talk of reward and punishment. This view would take morality to be a system that explained what kinds of actions are appropriately rewarded and—more centrally—punished. This sort of view, which remains closely related to Gibbard’s suggestion, can also be regarded as fitting the general schema given above. On this view, the notion of endorsing a code is unpacked in terms of the acceptance of norms for reward and punishment. Skorupksi (1993), following Mill (1861), advocates a definition of morality along these lines, though he then understands punishment primarily in terms of blame, and understands blame as very closely linked to emotion—indeed, merely having the emotion can count as blaming—so that the resulting view is similar to Gibbard’s in one important way, at least when one focuses on moral wrongness.

It is certainly plausible that it is appropriate to feel guilt when one acts immorally, and to feel anger at those who act immorally towards those one cares about. It is even plausible that it is only appropriate, in some particular sense of “appropriate”, to feel guilt and anger in connection with moral transgressions. So norms for guilt and anger may well uniquely pick out certain moral norms. And similar claims might be made about norms for praise and blame. However, it is not equally clear that morality is properly defined in terms of emotions or other reactions to behavior. For it may be, as Skorupski emphasizes, that we need to understand guilt and anger, and praise and blame, in terms of moral concepts. This worry about direction of explanation seems less pressing for the notions of reward and punishment. These responses to behavior, at least in themselves, might simply be understood in terms of the meting out of benefits and harms. Of course they will only count as reward and punishment when they are linked to someone’s having followed or violated a rule that all rational people would want to see enforced by such responses.

3.2 Morality as linked to advocacy of a code

One way of understanding the notion of endorsement is as advocacy. Advocating a code is a second- or third-personal matter, since one advocates a code to others. Moreover, it is consistent with advocating a code, that one does not plan on following that code oneself. Just as asserting something one believes to be false still counts as asserting it, hypocritical advocacy of a code still counts as advocacy of that code. When endorsement is understood as advocacy, it can be used in definitions of morality, in the descriptive sense, as long as it is the morality of a group or society. And advocacy can also be used as an interpretation of endorsement when providing a definition of morality in the normative sense. Of course those who accept a definition of morality in any of these senses—as the code that a group or society endorses, or as the code that would be universally advocated by all rational agents under certain conditions—do not hold that the advocacy would necessarily, or even probably, be hypocritical. But they do hold that the important thing about a moral code—what picks it out as a moral code—is that it would be put forward by all the relevant agents, not that it would be followed by all of them. The notion of advocacy has less of a place in a descriptive account of a single person’s morality, since when someone is hypocritical we often deny that they really hold the moral view that they advocate. Of course it is possible to fail to live up to one’s own morality, but in that case one would be expected to feel guilt, or to be torn in some way. And if we use such feelings to pick out a person’s morality, we are relying on the sort of definition described above, in section 3.1.

Mill (1861), in addition to offering a moral theory, takes pains to explain how morality differs from other normative systems. For him, norms that simply promote utility are norms of expediency. In order to qualify as morally wrong, an act must be one that ought to be punished. Thinking that an act of a certain kind ought to be punished is a third-personal matter, so it seems plausible to put Mill’s view of what is definitional of morality into the category being discussed in this section. It is worth noting that hypocrisy is, for Mill, not only a possibility, but—given the present sorry state of moral education—virtually unavoidable. That is because being motivated to advocate punishment for a certain kind of act is quite different from being motivated to refrain from that same kind of act. Advocating punishment for a certain kind of act might be one’s utility-maximizing choice, while actually performing that kind of act (trying, of course, to avoid detection) might also be utility-maximizing. And for Mill what determines what a person will advocate, and how a person will act, is the foreseeable consequences for that person.

Bernard Gert’s (2005) moral view also operates with a definition of morality that understands endorsement as advocacy, in the sense of putting forward as a guide for all rational agents. Gert’s way of filling in the schema for a definition of “morality” makes use of a normative sense of “rationality”: one according to which no moral agent would ever advise anyone for whom he was concerned, including himself, to act irrationally. The hybrid concept of rationality described in section 2 satisfies this condition because no moral agent would ever advise anyone for whom she cared, including herself, to act in any way that harms herself with no compensating benefit to anyone.

Gert offers the following two conditions as the conditions under which all rational persons would put forward a universal guide for governing the behavior of all moral agents. The first condition is that they are seeking agreement with all other rational persons or moral agents. The second condition is that they use only those beliefs that are shared by all rational persons: for example, that they themselves are fallible and vulnerable and that all those to whom morality applies are also fallible and vulnerable. The second condition rules out both religious beliefs and scientific beliefs since there are no religious beliefs or scientific beliefs that all rational persons share. This condition is plausible because no universal guide to behavior that applies to all rational persons can be based on beliefs that some of these rational persons do not share.

Gert offers the following explicit definition of morality: Morality is an informal public system applying to all rational persons, governing behavior that affects others, and has the lessening of evil or harm as its goal. It might seem that this definition is quite different from the general schema offered above. But Gert argues that this definition—as he interprets it—results in morality being a universal guide to behavior that all rational persons would put forward for governing the behavior of all moral agents.

3.3 Morality as linked to acceptance of a code

Another way of understanding the notion of endorsement is as acceptance. Unlike advocating a code, accepting a code is a first-personal matter. It might include intending to conform one’s own behavior to that code, feeling guilty when one does not, and so on. One cannot hypocritically accept a code. Indeed, hypocrisy is simply a matter of advocating a code one does not accept. So this notion of endorsement is available to someone who is trying to provide a definition of morality in the descriptive sense, even when considering a single person’s morality.

Paradigmatic views in the natural law tradition starting with Aquinas hold both that the laws of morality have their source in God, and that these laws constitute the principles of human practical rationality (Finnis 1980; MacIntyre 1999). Views in this tradition may be seen as using the basic schema for definitions of morality in the normative sense, understanding endorsement as acceptance. Members of this tradition typically hold that all rational persons know what kinds of actions morality prohibits, requires, discourages, encourages, and allows. It is central to Aquinas’s view that morality is known to all those whose behavior is subject to moral judgment, even if they do not know of the revelations of Christianity. This is why Aquinas holds that knowing what morality prohibits and requires does not involve knowing why morality prohibits and requires what it does.

Those who belong to the natural law tradition also hold that reason endorses acting morally. This sort of endorsement of course has a cognitive component. But it is also motivational. Aquinas does not hold that knowledge of morality is always effective: it can be blotted out by evil persuasions or corrupt habits. But if reason is not opposed by such forces, any rational person would not only know what was prohibited and required by morality, but would follow those prohibitions and requirements. So, for natural law theorists, endorsement amounts to acceptance.

3.4 Morality as linked to justification to others

The lack of an explicit and widely accepted definition of morality may partially explain the resilience of act-consequentialist accounts of morality. Without an explicit definition, it may be easier to ignore the fact that act-consequentialist theories are not particularly concerned with interpersonal interactions, but typically apply just as well to desert island scenarios as to individuals who live in societies. In any case, it has been recognized that in order to combat consequentialism, it would be helpful to have something more like a plausible definition of morality that made it clear that the subject matter of morality is something different from simply the goodness and badness of consequences. T.M. Scanlon (1982, 1998), applying this strategy, suggests that the subject matter of morality—what we are talking about, when we talk about morality—is a system of rules for the regulation of behavior that is not reasonably rejectable based on a desire for informed unforced general agreement.

Scanlon’s suggestion regarding the subject matter of morality can easily be seen as an instance of the general schema given above. His “system of rules” is a specific kind of informal public system; he understands endorsement by all rational people as non-rejection by all reasonable people; and he offers a specific account of the conditions under which moral agents would reach the relevant agreement. But Scanlon also places very heavy emphasis on the fact that if he is right about the subject matter of morality, then what compliance with moral norms allows us to do is to justify our behavior to others in ways that they cannot reasonably reject. Indeed, the ability to justify ourselves to reasonable people is a primary source of moral motivation for Scanlon (see also Sprigge 1964: 319). This might seem to suggest a somewhat different definitional claim about morality: that morality consists in the most basic norms in terms of which we justify ourselves to others. But it is plausible that this purportedly definitional claim is better thought of as a corollary of Scanlon’s particular version of the general schema, with endorsement understood as non-rejection. For, if morality is the system of norms that would be endorsed in this way, we can justify our actions to others by pointing out that even they, were they reasonable, would have endorsed rules that allowed our behavior.

Stephen Darwall’s (2006) moral view can also be seen as flowing from a version of general schema, and yielding claims about justifiability to others. Darwall claims that morality is a matter of an equal accountability among free and rational beings. On his view, I behave morally towards you to the degree that I respect the claims you have authority to make on me. Darwall also holds that I will respect those claims if I acknowledge certain assumptions to which I am committed simply in virtue of being a rational, deliberating agent. As a result, his view is that morality—or at least the morality of obligation—is a “scheme of accountability” (a certain sort of informal public system) that all rational people will endorse. Unlike Scanlon’s view, however, Darwall’s view makes use of a stronger sense of endorsement than non-rejection. Specifically, it includes the recognition of the reasons provided by the authoritative demands of other people. And that recognition is positively motivational.

Both Scanlon’s and Darwall’s views emphasize the social nature of morality, taken in the normative sense: Scanlon, by reference to justification to others; Darwall, by appeal to the relevance of second-personal reasons. But Darwall builds a responsiveness to second-personal reasons into the relevant notion of rationality, while Scanlon simply makes the empirical claim that many people are motivated by a desire to justify themselves to others, and notes that his definition of morality will yield rules that will allow one to do this, if one follows them. The sort of definition described in section 3.1 also makes the social nature of morality essential to it, since it centrally features the notion of a response to the behavior of others. The definitions described in sections 3.2 and 3.3 do not entail the social nature of morality—though of course they are compatible with it—since it is possible to accept, and even to advocate, a code that concerns only self-regarding behavior. But on any plausible account of rationality a code that would be advocated by all moral agents will govern interpersonal interactions, and will include rules that prohibit causing harm without sufficient reason. Only the definition offered in section 3.3 therefore can be taken as realistically compatible with an egoistic morality.

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Other Internet Resources

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Copyright © 2016 by
Bernard Gert
Joshua Gert <jngert@wm.edu>

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