First published Wed Sep 17, 2008; substantive revision Mon Oct 16, 2023

Proper names are familiar expressions of natural language, whose semantics remains a contested subject. Do names have meanings, or do they simply refer to particular things without that reference being mediated by a meaning?

1. Syntax

The Cambridge Grammar of English distinguishes the syntactic category of proper name from that of proper noun (Payne & Huddleston 2002: 516). A proper noun is a word-level unit of the category noun, while a proper name is a type of noun phrase. So, for example, the proper name “Alice Walker” consists of two proper nouns: “Alice” and “Walker”. A proper name (the noun phrase) may also—and often does—consist of a single proper noun, just as a verb phrase may consist of a lone verb. Hence, the sentence “Alice sleeps” is comprised of a noun phrase/proper name and a verb phrase; the noun phrase contains a single proper noun, and the verb phrase consists of a lone verb. Its analysis into syntactic constituents would look like this:

\[\left[_{\textsf{S}} \left[_{\textsf{PName}} \left[_{\textsf{PNoun}} \textsf{Alice} \right]\right] \left[_{\textsf{VP}} \left[_{\textsf{V}} \textsf{sleeps}\right]\right]\right]\]

Proper names may contain other parts of speech, too: “Brooklyn Bridge” places the common noun “Bridge” alongside the proper noun “Brooklyn”. “The Raritan River” includes the determiner “the”. “The Bronx” combines a determiner and a proper noun. Finally, “the Golden Gate Bridge” is a proper name with no proper nouns in it at all.

Proper names occur in different formats depending on the sort of thing named (Carroll 1985). For instance, official names of persons in many cultures consist of (at least) first and last names, themselves proper nouns. Names of bridges have an optional definite article and often include the common noun “bridge”. We have bridge names that embed other proper names like “The George Washington Bridge”. We can even imagine structurally ambiguous names, such as “the New New York Public Library”.

To accommodate the full range of proper names, we need one more syntactic category. Following the Cambridge English Grammar once again for convenience, a noun phrase consists of an optional determiner followed by a nominal phrase. Thus in the noun phrase “the man who was Thursday”, the nominal phrase constituent is “man who was Thursday”. If we assume a similar construction for proper names, then “the Raritan River” has a constituent “Raritan River” (itself made up of the proper noun “Raritan” and the common noun “River”). We will call the constituent that is the complement of the (optional) determiner in a proper name a proper nominal. Thus the full analysis of the proper name “Alice” looks like this:

\[[_{\textsf{PName}} [_{\textsf{PNom}} [_{\textsf{PNoun}} \textsf{Alice} ]]]\]

Names are standardly categorized as definite noun phrases (Mulkern 1996; Abbott 2002). They can occur with markers of definiteness, such as the definite article “the” in English (though in some languages, such as Samoan, proper names obligatorily occur with a special proprial article, distinguished from the ordinary definite article). Since definite descriptions also belong under the general head of definite noun phrases (along with pronouns and demonstratives), this evidence is used to support views on which names are a type of definite description (Sloat 1969; Larson & Segal 1995: 354–355; Elbourne 2005), but is consistent with names forming their own species of definite.

Proper nominals (proper names without their determiner) can modify other nouns, as in “a Bronx resident”. They can also occur as the restrictor of determiners other than “the”, as in “every University of California, from Berkeley to Santa Cruz”. Some (Sloat 1969; Burge 1973) see the predicate meanings of proper nominals as primary, and attempt to generate the meaning of the more common argumental occurrences of proper names from them. However, it is also reasonable to regard predicative proper nominals as on a par with “coerced” expressions such as the verb “to google” (Leckie 2013; Schoubye 2017), or as having a meaning separately bestowed by convention (Johnson 2018).

Is there just one proper name “Alice,” or are there many homonyms, one for each person or thing so named? It is tempting to infer the uniqueness of the name, on syntactic grounds, from the uniqueness of the proper noun. Arguably the same noun recurs in the different names “Alice Waters” and “Alice Walker”, as well as in the phrase “two famous Alices” (though see Sainsbury 2015 and Gray 2015 on the latter). And if the name “Alice” is a complex expression built up from a unique noun, then presumably there should be only one such expression built up in that particular way.

On the other hand, the name “Alice” can be used to refer to many different people. If the same syntactic item is responsible in each case, this profligacy must be explained. Supposing the name is meaningful (the topic of the next section), it is either (massively) ambiguous, or else has the sort of meaning that constrains, without determining, the reference of a specific utterance. It might alternatively have a general meaning that identifies a different referent when uttered in different contexts (in the manner of indexicals like “here” and “now”).

If instead there are many homonyms, then each may be allocated its own convention, independently determining its proper referent (see Kripke 1980: 7–8; Kaplan 1990). It is reasonable to see the uniquely denoting name as a technical innovation responding to a specific theoretical need in semantics. Alternative terminology employed with the same goal in mind, but a greater reluctance to embrace genuine homonymy, includes that of the particular “use” of a name (Strawson 1950), “name-using practice” (Evans 1982), “naming convention” (Matushansky 2008: 592; Recanati 1997), and even “discourse entity” (Cumming 2014).

For the exposition to come, we will not presume the issue settled, and will speak, at different times, of the many homonymous specific names “Alice”, as well as the unique generic name “Alice”.

2. Semantics

2.1 Meaning and Extension

As well as having a range of entities to which it applies, the common noun “bachelor” has a meaning; it means man who has never been married. Is the same true of names? “Socrates” certainly applies to things. It applies, most obviously, to the founder of Western philosophy. When understood as a generic name (see Section 1), “Socrates” applies to several individuals: to a first approximation, all those who are called “Socrates.” But does “Socrates” also possess a meaning?

Some names have meanings in a sense. I have heard “Merlot” used on the playground to summon a child, and knew of a married couple whose respective names were “Sunshine” and “Moonlight.” These names, we would say, have meanings. “Moonlight,” for instance, means light from the Moon. Something similar goes on when we say that “Theodore” means gift of god, or interpret a Mohawk name with a verb phrase. But this sense of meaning turns out not to be the one we are after.

Consider that for “bachelor” the meaning—man who has never been married—is also what determines the noun’s range of application. When the noun “bachelor” applies to someone, it’s because they are a man who has never been married. And when it fails to apply to someone, it’s because they are not. By contrast, the kind of meaning just canvassed for the names “Merlot” or “Moonlight” places no direct constraint on who they apply to. One may be named “Merlot”, and so fall within the name’s range of application, no matter what relationship one bears to the wine grape variety, Merlot (Mill 1843: 34). Moreover, a relationship to the grape does not constitute the reason for the name applying.

In this long tail of the article on semantics, we will confine ourselves to the question of whether names have a meaning in the sense that “bachelor” does. Do they have a meaning that determines, or restricts, their extension (i.e., their range of application or reference)? As we will see, even pursuing this reduced target, philosophers have had to consider a series of foundational questions about language and meaning. It is not off-limits to ask a different question about names, or to think about their meaning in some other way, but this question will open a path through the important topics in the semantics of names, and indeed the philosophy of language.

Let’s begin with the generic name “Alice”. Consider the range of individuals to which it applies. Unlike the range of “bachelor”, this set is not united under a brief definition, but consists of all the various people (including Alice Cooper), and perhaps things, referred to by (occurrences of) the name “Alice”. A natural view, then, is that the individual referential relationships are what’s basic here, and any generalization concerning a generic name’s range of application is based on them, rather than the other way around. According to this view, there is no general meaning of the name, responsible for determining to whom or to what it correctly applies. While it is possible to articulate a (complex) condition that correctly sorts Alices from non-Alices on some basis other than those referential relationships (for instance, a disjunction consisting of each Alice’s unique time and place of birth), it is clear that any such condition is based on those pre-existing relationships, rather than being, with any plausibility, their originating source.

The only concise way of delimiting the range of generic “Alice” is with a metalinguistic feature, such as being named “Alice”. And indeed some have defended a metalinguistic account of the meaning of generic names (see Section 2.10 below). The challenge for the account is to distinguish the relevant feature from that of being in the extension of “Alice”, which clearly cannot determine the extension in the robust sense required of a meaning (Kripke 1980: 68; Geurts 1997: 326ff; Bach 2002: 83; Gray 2014).

Next consider the specific name “Socrates.” It refers to a certain citizen of Athens, and, in contrast to the generic case, this (unitary) extension may be delimited concisely without appeal to its onomastic features. Moreover, just like “bachelor,” “Socrates” appears in (some) dictionaries along with an explanation supplying just this kind of non-linguistic identifying information. The following is from Lexico (see the link in Other Internet Resources):

(469–399 BC), Greek philosopher. As represented in the writings of his disciple Plato, he engaged in dialogue with others in an attempt to define ethical concepts by exposing and dispelling error (the Socratic method). Charged with introducing strange gods and corrupting the young, Socrates was sentenced to death and died by drinking hemlock.

Of course, the majority of specific names do not appear in any dictionary. Moreover, it should not be thought that dictionary “definitions” always give the meaning of the word they appear under (one entry for “Socrates” on Wiktionary just says “A male given name of mostly historical use”). But suppose we have a condition satisfied by, and only by, the referent of “Socrates”; one which is, moreover, listed below the name in certain dictionaries. For the sake of argument, suppose it is the teacher of Plato and Xenophon. Would it follow that “Socrates” meant the teacher of Plato and Xenophon?

Not necessarily. First note that, prima facie, “Socrates” simply does not mean the teacher of Plato and Xenophon. While we would agree that Socrates was the teacher of Plato and Xenophon, we would not be inclined to say that this is what the word “Socrates” means. By contrast, we are happy to say that “bachelor” means man who has never been married.

Similarly, though a dictionary might offer a definition of “cat” as domestic animal with retractile claws, we would not be inclined to say that “cat” meant domestic animal with retractile claws, though we would admit that cats were such animals. Even if cats are the only domestic animals in existence with retractile claws, it does not seem correct to say that this is the meaning of “cat”. The meaning of a word is something more than just an accurate description of the contents of its extension.

In the first place, a condition that selects the correct range for a word is not necessarily the condition that determines that the word has that range. Suppose all and only ascetics have matted hair. Still, “ascetic” doesn’t mean person with matted hair, because having matted hair, though it may be a distinguishing mark of ascetics, is not what makes someone an ascetic. But even supposing our condition is the one in virtue of which “Socrates” applies to the relevant Athenian, it still doesn’t follow that it is the meaning of “Socrates”. It may yet be that “Socrates” doesn’t have a meaning (compare Kripke 1980: 32–33). Though we take the meaning of a word to determine its range of application, we do not assume the converse, that whatever determines the range of application of a word must be its meaning. We allow that names might work differently from “bachelor”. Their extension might be determined by something other than a meaning; for instance, their previous use (Section 2.7).

To put it another way, the question as to whether a name has a meaning is not trivial. The name “Socrates” refers to a particular Athenian, and, unless reference is metaphysically basic, there must be some feature of the world in virtue of which it does (cf. Kripke 1980: 88, fn.38). However, this feature may or may not comprise the meaning of the specific name “Socrates”. It is really a further question whether this feature is semantic or meta-semantic, whether it is part of the meaning, or whether it establishes the name’s reference without belonging to its meaning. The theory of (nominal) reference (see the entry on Reference) should be distinguished from the—intertwined—theory of the semantics of names (Dickie 2011).

2.2 Cognitive Significance and Identification

Another issue we must disentangle from the semantics of names is that of their cognitive significance and allied behavior in opaque contexts, including especially attitude reports (see the entry on Propositional Attitude Reports).

Names that corefer do not always communicate the same information. For instance, to one who is ignorant of the fact that the names “Hesperus” (i.e., the Evening Star) and “Phosphorus” (i.e., the Morning Star) both refer to the planet Venus, the sentence “Hesperus is a planet” and the sentence “Phosphorus is a planet” transmit different information, producing different cognitive states and resultant action (Frege 1892). One who mishears an utterance of one of these sentences, mistaking it for the other, has misunderstood the speaker, despite arriving at an interpretation that is extensionally correct (Loar 1976).

Moreover, coreferring names may be used with distinguishing import even by those in the know. When (in Wharton’s novel) Miranda falls upon the Abbot’s mercy, and admits she has been playing the part of a man to sidestep an ecclesiastical restriction on female performers, he mercifully lifts the ban:

My only condition,” he added with a truly paternal smile, “is that, after the Signorina Miranda’s performance at the theatre her twin brother the Signor Mirandolo shall return every evening to the monastery. (Wharton, The Valley of Decision)

The Abbot’s condition is not met unless Miranda returns to the monastery each night in male guise (compare Saul 2007).

Relatedly, coreferring names cannot always be substituted salva veritate in the context of a propositional attitude report (Frege 1892). If Daphnis doesn’t know that Hesperus is Phosphorus, then it could be true that

  • (1) Daphnis believes that Hesperus appears in the evening.

While being false that

  • (2) Daphnis believes that Phosphorus appears in the evening.

These observations are connected with the main question of this section—do names have meanings? For names with the same reference could yet differ in meaning, and this might explain their differing cognitive significance. In particular, if a name’s meaning is (part of) what it contributes to the truth condition of an utterance, then a difference in meaning, in spite of an equivalence in reference, could lead to a different truth-value for the sentence.

Nevertheless, we will not consider this source of evidence for nominal meaning further in the article. In the first place, the phenomena just recounted are general to all kinds of referring expression (and perhaps other sorts of expression too), rather than being particular to names, and so their discussion properly belongs under a more general head. Second, in cases where we are less uncertain that meaning exists, it does not seem to correspond to cognitive significance. For example, given the right scenario, “bachelor” and the phrase documenting its meaning—“man who has not been married”—would also fail to substitute salva veritate in an attitude report. Finally, the debate over cognitive significance devolves into a stalemate, as any detailed explanation of the phenomena that relies on names having meanings can be approximated by one that relies instead on information which, while associated with a name, is not considered its meaning (Soames 2002).

I will substantiate the last point at length, by considering a particular account of the cognitive significance of names. The account relates cognitive significance to the identifying information associated with a specific name in an agent’s mind (Strawson 1974: 43ff). To illustrate this, suppose I know of two individuals bearing the name “Zera Yacob”. Most likely, I associate a different sobriquet, or description, with each specific version of the name, as a way of maintaining the distinction in my mind. Moreover, whenever I speak or hear the name “Zera Yacob”, I implicitly associate the utterance with one of those descriptions; either it is the seventeenth century philosopher or the fifteenth century Emperor of Ethiopia who is being named in this instance. Plausibly, I cannot felicitously utter “Zera Yacob” without selecting either the prince or the philosopher as my intended referent, and I can’t fully interpret another’s utterance of the name without forming a parallel determination.

If each specific name is annexed to some identifying information—enough to single out its bearer at least in the mind of the agent—then this could explain the different cognitive significances of coreferring names. But does the identifying sobriquet also represent the meaning of the name? There are several reasons to doubt that it does. First, different agents might well associate different identifying information with the same referring use of a name (Frege 1892), which would seem to conflict with the natural assumption that a name like “Socrates” has a single meaning throughout a community. Different responses are available here. We might say that the meaning of a name is relative to the idiolect of the individual, rather than the dialect of the group. Another option would be to claim that the meaning of a name in a public language is aggregated in some way from the identifying information associated with it by each member of the relevant public (Strawson 1959: 191–192). Note that, on the latter sort of account, it would be possible for a user (or even every user) of the name to only have a partial grip on its (aggregate) meaning (see Section 2.3).

Second, information that is sufficient for identificational purposes (internally distinguishing one bearer of a name from another) may yet be inadequate to determine the extension of a name (Strawson 1959: 20–21). For instance, “the Roman author” is enough to distinguish Marcus Tullius Cicero from Cicero, Illinois; but it is not sufficient to select a unique Cicero in the world (Kripke 1980: 81; Donnellan 1970: 343). There is, for instance, Cicero’s younger brother, Quintus Tullius Cicero, also an author of several works.

A description can also have the identifying function though it is false of the proper referent of the specific name. For instance, many would have inaccurately identified Christopher Columbus as the first European to visit the Americas (Searle 1958: 168; Strawson 1964: 102; Donnellan 1970: 341; Kripke 1980: 83–84).

If the feature used for identificational purposes is false of the referent of the name, then by our earlier criterion it cannot serve as the meaning of the name. If it is true, but insufficient to discriminate the referent, then the situation is different. It is possible to claim that the identifying feature is the meaning of the name, while admitting that nominal meaning merely constrains, without fully determining, nominal reference. Names would then be akin to certain pronouns (arguably, the meaning of “she” merely limits its possible referents in certain respects).

Thus, it is possible to find a place in one’s theory for identifying descriptions, and even use them to explain cognitive significance, while still denying that they correspond to the meanings of names. Strawson himself, who developed the account of identification on display, and who thought that a name’s reference was determined by its associated identifying description (1959: 181–182), did not conceive of that description as expressing the name’s meaning (1950: 340).

More generally, suppose we call whatever theoretical posit captures the cognitive significance of names, sense, following Frege. The crucial point is that we need not conflate the linguistic meaning of a name with its sense (Kripke 1980: 59; Burge 1977). This is so even if we take a name to contribute its sense to the truth condition of an attitude report, as Frege also suggested. Remember, we understand meaning as something that (if present) determines or constrains the extension of a word. We have refrained from identifying meaning with a word’s contribution to the truth condition of a declarative sentence (what is usually called its semantic value). If we had, then it would follow, from the fact that names do contribute to truth conditions, that names have meanings; and we had wanted to frame the issue of a name’s meaning so that it didn’t have a trivial answer. Instead, we have left open whether a name’s contribution—sense or referent—is determined by its meaning, or else, in the absence of such a meaning, by extra-semantic factors, such as use.

2.3 Meaning and the a priori

There are propositions we can only confirm or justify by observation and experiment. There are, for example, various ways to establish that the Earth is round, an especially conclusive one being circumnavigation. There are other propositions that no observation can confirm, nor, indeed, disconfirm; for instance, the proposition that bachelors are unmarried. Since “bachelor” is defined as man who has never been married, we derive this proposition prior to any consultation of the external world. It is a priori.

By similar reasoning, if “Socrates” meant the teacher of Plato and Xenophon, it would be a priori that Socrates taught Plato (Kripke 1980: 65). However, unlike the proposition that bachelors are unmarried, this claim does not seem to be a priori. Intuitively speaking, the widely held belief that Socrates taught Plato could turn out to be false. Perhaps one day documents will come to light establishing that the person who served as a model for the character of Socrates in Plato’s dialogues (and other similar traditions) lived out his life prior to Plato’s birth. Such evidence would appear to refute the tradition according to which Plato was Socrates’ pupil.

By contrast, no observation could unseat the belief that bachelors are unmarried. Even irrefutable evidence that each individual we thought a bachelor had in fact been married would not convince us that bachelors were, after all, married men. We would conclude instead that those men weren’t bachelors (compare Putnam 1962 and Unger 1983 on “cat”).

Now an a priori proposition is not automatically known. If one is ignorant of the meaning of the relevant terms, then one presumably won’t know the a priori proposition that follows from the meaning. Someone might be unaware, for example, that all linguistic discourse is either verse or prose, or that all planets have sufficient mass to assume hydrostatic equilibrium; yet both propositions follow from the definitions of the relevant words (“prose” is defined as language without the metrical structure of verse; and the official definition of “planet” includes a clause requiring hydrostatic equilibrium).

The fact that some users of “Socrates” don’t realize that Socrates taught Plato does not immediately show that the proposition is a posteriori. It could be that they are ignorant of the meaning of “Socrates”, and if they had known it, they would also have known (a priori) that Socrates taught Plato. The same goes for the intuition that it could turn out that Socrates did not teach Plato. This intuition could similarly originate in obscuring ignorance of meaning. It should be kept in mind that the argument we are considering in this section (often termed the epistemic argument) takes for granted that if “Socrates” had a meaning, we would know what it was, and be in a position to draw a priori conclusions from it.

With this one caveat, the epistemic argument is an effective challenge to many accounts that provide names with a substantial meaning. Often what would follow from the proposed meaning is something that, according to our intuition, could turn out to be false. An ingenious response to the argument is to identify the meaning of a name with (roughly speaking) whatever claims about its extension could not turn out to be false, according to ordinary speakers’ intuitions (Chalmers & Jackson 2001). Such an account of meaning (call it apriorist) is of course immune to the epistemic argument.

What sorts of claims are we talking about here? Not the claim that Socrates taught Plato: this, intuitively, could turn out to be false. But what about the claim that it could turn out false that Socrates taught Plato. The justification for this claim was not observational evidence, but an intuition about a hypothetical scenario, and what we would say about Socrates in that scenario. We felt that if the true source of Plato’s character had died before Plato was born, then it would follow that Socrates did not teach Plato. But whence this judgment? Perhaps it stems from the conviction that, roughly, “Socrates” will refer to whoever turns out to be the actual source of the eponymous character in Plato’s dialogues (and other similar traditions). This is not quite a priori either. As a claim, it stands or falls on our empirical knowledge of the relevant traditions. Still, one imagines the claim could be winnowed down further, until, as it were, the a posteriori hull is gone. The remaining polished kernel would then serve as the apriorist meaning of “Socrates.”

It would be interesting to see this exercise carried out in full, but what would it show? Not that a certain core of knowledge must constitute the meaning of “Socrates”. There is always the possibility that “Socrates” has no meaning. Even if the account of what determines the reference of a name has an a priori core, we may yet conclude that such reference is determined extra-semantically. Perhaps the a priori core is simply an (a priori) theory of reference in general, applied to the special case of “Socrates”.

Furthermore, the apriorist account, like the epistemic argument that led us to it, relies on the assumption that meanings, and their a priori consequences, are known to speakers, who then lean on this knowledge in forming intuitive judgments about what could turn out to be true of Socrates—or bachelors. But consider the person who finds it intuitive that a planet might not have achieved hydrostatic equilibrium? We would like to say that they don’t fully understand what “planet” means, given that this is one of the conditions in the 2006 definition arrived at by the International Astronomical Union (see Other Internet Resources). However, on the apriorist account, we are forced to say instead that the proposition that all planets have achieved hydrostatic equilibrium does not follow from the meaning of “planet”, as it does not belong to the a priori core (as proven by the one speaker who doesn’t find it intuitive). Indeed, the a priori core, whatever it is, only supports the judgment that all planets have achieved hydrostatic equilibrium in conjunction with the a posteriori knowledge that achieving hydrostatic equilibrium was a clause in the definition of “planet” stipulated by an authority.

The concern is that many uncontroversial examples of word meaning are not known to some speakers (and for any example, including “bachelor,” we could easily contrive a case in which it was not known to someone), and hence must be excluded by the apriorist. Even if one is convinced that whatever (directly) determines the extension of a word constitutes its meaning, there is still no guarantee that a particular (or general) theory of extension determination can be found, however implicit, in native speaker intuitions. Or, supposing it can be, that the process of deriving it from those intuitions is one of a priori demonstrative inference. Like other aspects of linguistic theory, the road from native speaker judgments to theory is presumably the ampliative method of science.

2.4 Meaning and Necessity

The fact that “bachelor” means man who has never been married implies that bachelors are necessarily unmarried. A married bachelor is an impossibility, a contradiction in terms. A man who in fact lived his life as a bachelor could have (instead) married, but if he had, his bachelor status would immediately have ceased. The scenario is thus not one involving a married bachelor, but merely one where a particular person, actually a bachelor, gets married instead.

This is a separate topic from that of the previous section, since necessity and the a priori can come apart. Consider the claim that the nucleus of an atom of gold contains 79 protons. This claim is not a priori. It is the fruit of an empirical inquiry into the nature of gold, and could certainly not have been deduced from the meaning of “gold”. It is, however, a necessary truth (Kripke 1980: 123–125). The nature of gold is, in this respect, immutable. If you added or subtracted protons from the nucleus, you would no longer have an atom of gold, but some other element instead.

Consider once more the view that “Socrates” means the teacher of Plato and Xenophon. Does it similarly predict a necessary connection between being Socrates and being the teacher of Plato and Xenophon? Is it committed to the impossibility of a Socrates who never taught? If so, the view would seem to be in trouble. For it appears a contingent fact—one that could have been otherwise—that Socrates taught Plato (Searle 1958: 172; Kripke 1980: 74). Socrates could, after all, have died in infancy; or else lived, but declined to take on his most famous pupil.

Note that “Socrates” is a referring expression, while “bachelor” is a nominal predicate. In carrying over the analogy from “bachelor”, we had to convert “Socrates” into a predicate (“being Socrates”). This was because the necessity we observed for “bachelor” involved the co-instantiation of properties—one can’t be a bachelor without being unmarried (compare Dummett 1973: 131). But it may be that referring expressions relate to their meanings in a different way to predicates—one that implies no necessary co-instantiation of properties. Indeed, we will find that this is the case, for at least one sort of referring expression, in Section 2.5.

A different test using modal sentences relies on the assumption that synonymous expressions should be substitutable salva veritate in modal contexts. To agree to this, we don’t have to think that the meaning of an expression corresponds to its truth-conditional contribution; only that, in identical linguistic contexts, synonymous expressions will make (or are likely to make) the same contribution. (Keep in mind that synonymous expressions are certainly not substitutable salva veritate in all contexts. Substituting “man who has never been married” for “bachelor” might change the truth-value of an attitude report if the attitude holder is ignorant of the meaning of “bachelor.”)

As it turns out, “Socrates” and “the teacher of Plato and Xenophon” cannot be substituted salva veritate in modal contexts (compare Kripke 1980: 40–42):

  • (3) The teacher of Plato and Xenophon might not have been human.
  • (4) Socrates might not have been human.

If we consider that Plato and Xenophon could have been raised by wolves, (3) sounds true, while (4) remains false. Thus, if we agree that synonyms should substitute in this context, “Socrates” cannot mean the teacher of Plato and Xenophon.

However, observe that (3) also has a (false) reading on which it says roughly the same thing as (4), referring to a particular man, rather than generalizing over teachers of Plato and Xenophon. (A competing explanation is that “Socrates” is lexically univocal, but gives rise to a structural ambiguity, being analyzed as a scope-taking expression—see Russell 1905; Neale 1990. Note, however, that this approach doesn’t lend itself as well to the defense of our descriptivist hypothesis. Such a defense needs to claim that names, perhaps similarly to the quantifier “each”, gravitate towards the widest possible scope in the sentence—see Dummett 1981: Ch.9; Soames 1998; and Sosa 2001 for further discussion of this proposal.)

Following Rothschild (2007) and Nichols (in unpublished work; see other internet resources), we could say that while the name “Socrates” refers to an individual, the definite description “the teacher of Plato and Xenophon” can refer either to that same individual, or else to a particular role—namely, that of teacher to Plato and Xenophon. When understood in the second way, (3) means something like “The role of teacher to Plato and Xenophon might have been filled by a non-human”. This parallels the fact that “tiger” has a taxonomic reading on which it applies to kinds alongside the more standard reading on which it applies to individual animals, so that “the tiger” can refer to either the kind or some particular tiger.

Supposing that definite descriptions can refer to roles would explain their different behavior in modal sentences without threatening the idea that a name could be synonymous with a definite description on its non-role reading. Still, the foregoing reflections offer no further help in interpreting the claim that “Socrates” means the teacher of Plato and Xenophon. The claim can’t simply be that “Socrates” and “the teacher of Plato and Xenophon” corefer. Even one who denies a meaning to “Socrates” admits this. But if there are no detectable modal consequences of a name’s having some meaning, in what other substantial sense should this possession be understood?

2.5 Rule of Use

The Oxford English Dictionary’s entry for the first person pronoun “I” says: “Used by the speaker or writer referring to himself or herself.” This is plausibly a linguistic rule: it is correct English to use “I” this way. The definition also determines the reference of (a particular utterance of) “I”. It seems reasonable, then, to think of this rule as giving the meaning of “I” (Kaplan 1989a: 520–521; Reichenbach 1947, 284).

This is handy: we now have an example of the form the meaning of a referring expression can take. The first benefit is that we can confirm that this kind of meaning doesn’t generate necessities, the way the meaning of “bachelor” did. Suppose “I” means the speaker in the context (Kaplan 1989a: 495). Well, it is possible to be me without being the speaker in the context. Though I am speaking now, I might have remained silent (Kaplan 1989a: 509).

It is evident, too, that the meaning of “I” cannot perform the duties of an interpersonal Fregean sense (discussed in Section 2.2). The rule determining the reference of an utterance of “I” (what Kaplan calls its character) is not the same as the contribution such an utterance makes to the communicated content (the cognitive significance of the utterance) on a particular occasion of use. Indeed, whereas “I” has a fixed character, it contributes different senses when uttered by different people (see Frege 1918–1919 [1956: 296]).

The rule is not irrelevant to the cognitive significance of an utterance of the term, of course; and may be considered the mode by which its interpersonal content is presented (Kaplan 1989a: 530). Moreover, the meaning of “I” supports a priori inferences of a particular sort (Kaplan 1989a: 508–509). For instance, no empirical investigation is required to divine that an utterance of “I” refers to the one uttering it. Hence, “I am the one uttering this sentence” is a priori.

The meaning of “I” provides a model for the meaning of names, but is there a candidate meaning for a name that fits this model? “I” does not refer to the same person every time it is used, so we might reasonably suppose that it provides a better model for a generic name—also used for different people—than a specific one. The rough thinking being that if a name is only ever used to refer to one thing (as a specific name is), there is no real need for a general rule of use.

What would a rule of use for a generic name look like? If “I” constrains reference to the speaker in the context, then generic “Alice”, in most situations (unless the referent is a protected witness, for example), constrains reference to persons called “Alice”. A semantic rule of use for generic “Alice” would thus amount to a metalinguistic account of its meaning. More will be said motivating and criticizing such a stance in the dedicated section (2.10) to come, but I will preview a major criticism of the view that names have a metalinguistic rule of use below.

The rule governing the use of a generic name like “Alice” has been spelled out by various theorists in similar ways (Burks 1951; Lerner & Zimmermann 1984, 1991; Haas-Spohn 1995; Recanati 1997; Pelczar & Rainsbury 1998). On each occasion of use, a referent for the name will be more-or-less available, or obligatory, depending on the familiarity and salience of a convention that tags that referent with that generic name. So a minimal rule of use for “Alice” would require each utterance to refer to one to whom that (generic) name has been conventionally attached. A stronger version would have it that an utterance of “Alice” obligatorily refers to the most salient individual of this sort.

As Kaplan (1989a: 562) points out, there is a competing account of the variable reference of names that does not treat them as generic expressions with a metalinguistic meaning (rule of use). On that account, the variation in reference is due to either ambiguity or homonymy (i.e., there are many different “specific” names with the same form), and what passes for a rule of use on the metalinguistic theory is not properly ascribed to the meaning of names at all, but is rather a more generally applicable procedure of disambiguation (see also Evans 1973, as well as Evans 1982, where name-using practices, rather than specific names, are settled on in the process of disambiguation).

To illustrate the difference, recall that it is a convention of English that a speaker uses “I” to refer to themselves. That convention is available to us, roughly speaking, whenever we are conversing with fellow English speakers, and we must always disambiguate an uttered token of “I” (distinguishing it, say, from homophone “eye”) prior to applying this convention to determine the token’s referent. The availability of the “I” convention in a conversation, and the disambiguation of an individual token of “I”, while crucial to communication, are matters that come before applying its rule of use, and so are distinct from the matters addressed in that rule.

We might go so far as to say that the sort of things a metalinguistic rule of use ranges over—conventions and the like—are just not suitable targets for linguistic meanings (compare Pelczar & Rainsbury 1998: 297–298). However, a rule of use just like the one advanced for generic “Alice” is very plausible for certain other expressions. For instance, “the tall Alice” or even just “the Alice” (see Jeshion 2017 for unexceptionable examples of the latter) is a context-sensitive phrase used to refer to the most salient individual satisfying a metalinguistic predicate (either being tall and being called “Alice”, or just being called “Alice”). For such examples, disambiguation between a number of different senses (of either “the Alice” or “the tall Alice”) is not a plausible account.

It is obvious in hindsight that natural language, in its versatility, would not disbar metalinguistic rules of use. Still, the point remains that ceteris paribus we should prefer pre-semantic disambiguation as an explanation, since it is required anyway, to introducing a metalinguistic rule of use that apes it.

2.6 The Cluster Theory

Suppose we are convinced, perhaps by arguments already given, that the teacher of Plato and Xenophon is not, by itself, a satisfactory specification of the meaning of “Socrates”. We might beat an orderly retreat, maintaining that it is still part of that meaning. Instead of being specifiable as a single succinct condition, the meaning of “Socrates” is constructed from a cluster of similar conditions.

Strawson, though he did not think names were meaningful, proposed that the referent of a specific name was determined by the collection of identifying descriptions associated with the name in the community:

Suppose we take a group of speakers who use, or think they use, the name, “Socrates”, with the same reference. Suppose we then ask each member of the group to write down what he considers to be the salient facts about Socrates, and then form from these lists of facts a composite description incorporating the most frequently mentioned facts. Now it would be too much to say that the success of term-introduction within the group by means of the name requires that there should exist just one person of whom all the propositions in the composite description are true. But it would not be too much to say that it requires that there should exist one and only one person of whom some reasonable proportion of these propositions is true. If, for example, it should be found that there was just one person of whom half the propositions were jointly true, and just one person, a different one, of whom the other half of the propositions were jointly true, then, unless some indication were given of which Socrates was meant, it would become impossible to give a straightforward answer to the question, whether any particular “proposition about Socrates” was true or false. It is true, perhaps, of Socrates\(_1\), and not of Socrates\(_2\). It is neither true nor false of Socrates simpliciter, for, it turns out, there is no such person. (Strawson 1959: 191–192)

Searle (1958) responds to the epistemic argument (see Section 2.3) by proposing a cluster theory. That argument seemed to show that individual components of the cluster, such as taught Plato, could not be necessary conditions on belonging to the name’s extension. For otherwise it would be knowable a priori that Socrates taught Plato. (Note that there is a similar problem with treating it as a sufficient condition; for then it would be a priori that no-one other than Socrates taught Plato.) Instead, Searle suggests that a name’s meaning imposes the weaker requirement that some member of the cluster be true of the referent. On his account, it is only a priori that the referent possesses the disjunction of the conditions of the cluster. (Note that this weak condition is unlikely to single out a referent for the name; hence Searle does not seem to provide a complete picture of reference determination. But strengthening the account would only make the a priori consequences stronger.)

Searle’s escape route is blocked if one can show that, for any finite list of the relevant sort (and for persons fully knowledgeable of the name’s meaning—see Section 2.3), it is conceivable that the true referent satisfies none of the conditions on the list. If clusters are finite lists of conditions, then the theory predicts that there is some such list for which it is a priori that the referent satisfies at least one of its conditions.

One way of so arguing would be to cultivate the intuition that any finite list must be incomplete. Given any list, there is a conceivable scenario in which some further property—one that was left off the list—proves crucial in determining the name’s reference. This kind of argument was used by Friedrich Waismann (1945) to demonstrate the “open texture” of empirical predicates, such as “gold” and “cat”. But it seems that the list of factors that could conceivably be relevant to determining the referent of “Socrates” is similarly open ended. If this hunch is correct, then the best we could hope for from a finite cluster theory is a kind of ceteris paribus determination:

If such-and-such facts obtain and no other facts relevant to the determination of the reference of “Socrates”, then “Socrates” refers to so-and-so.

Kripke (1980: 66–67) argues that, so long as our cluster consists only of properties commonly attributed to the bearer of the name, as on Strawson’s account, it is conceivable that none of its members applies to the referent. His case is buoyed by examples where experts posit or even identify a historical figure behind a popular legend, and treat the historical personage, who might share none of the attributes of the legendary one, as the true referent of the name. We might respond by applying Strawson’s method to the community of experts, rather than the general populace where the legend holds sway, as it would then succeed in picking out the historical figure. However, the general observation is that no group is incorrigible. Even those experts could turn out, it seems, to be wholly wrong in their descriptions of the name’s referent (as revealed, perhaps, by a new wave of experts).

Kripke thus provides a direct challenge to a cluster theory based on identifying descriptions. A complication is that Strawson explicitly countenances identifying descriptions that are parasitic on other speakers’ use (such as the individual Plato referred to as “Socrates”). Kripke attempts to repulse this maneuver, noting that the reference of one’s own utterance of a name is ultimately determined by the reference of the person from whom one in fact learned the name, rather than the person one might mistakenly identify as such (1980: 90–91; see also Geach 1969: 288–289; and Donnellan 1970).

Suppose we could craft a version of the cluster theory that was materially correct (it satisfies all of our intuitions about the reference of the name in different eventualities). We might legitimately ask, as we have done before, whether this theory succeeds in giving the meaning of the name. It seems that many have favored this conclusion chiefly for want of an alternative: if a cluster of commonly attributed features is not the meaning of a name, then what is? Or if, alternatively, names don’t have meanings, then what could it be that determines their extension? We will supply one general answer to the second of these questions in the next section.

2.7 Reference Without Meaning: the Use Theory

The range of application of the noun “bachelor” is determined in two steps. First, something (we haven’t seen what) establishes that “bachelor” means man who has never been married. Second, “bachelor” applies to all and only those things that satisfy the condition specified in its meaning—the men who have never been married. If names have meanings, then their referents or ranges (in the case of generic names) will be determined in the same way. However, many philosophers have found the view that names do not have a meaning intuitively compelling (Mill 1843: 34, 36–37; Strawson 1950; Ziff 1960: 85–89, 93–94; Marcus 1961). They still believe names refer, and so require an alternative metasemantics—an account, in this case, of what determines reference—to the meaning-mediated one.

The now standard alternative to the meaning-mediated model is one on which reference (or range) is directly established by use. The referent is the referent (or the range the range) because it satisfies a particular condition, but that condition amounts to consistency with past use, rather than encapsulating the meaning of the expression. Proponents of the use model tend to emphasize the externalism of this determining use. For example, in the quote below, Evans elaborates the rough idea of the referent being known as NN by citing the “actual pattern of dealings” with the referent—by which he means specifically the occasions where the referent has been identified as NN by certain members of the community (the “producers” of the particular name-using practice)—rather than basing it on the recognitional capacities that enable the identification (which would hew closer to Strawson).

It seems reasonable to suggest that what makes it the case that an ordinary proper-name-using practice involving the name “NN” concerns a particular individual is that that individual should be known to the producers in the practice as NN. It is the actual pattern of dealings the producers have had with an individual—identified from time to time by the exercise of their recognitional capacities in regard to that individual—which ties the name to the individual. (Evans 1982: 382, emphasis in the original)

We will now look, in a general way, at how the reference of a name could be determined by other aspects of its use. Our approach will single out attribution (of a name to someone) as the relevant basis. Other approaches are possible, but the (technical) notion of attribution will be broad enough to cover the use theories of Evans and Kripke.

To refer is to use an expression to identify some individual, usually in order to talk about them. Attribution of a name, by contrast, requires the attributee to be identified (at least partially) independently of the deployment of the name. To attribute a name to someone is just to treat someone—thus extrinsically identified—as belonging to its extension; to assert or presuppose that the name applies to them. A straightforward example, where the attributee is identified by a gesture (or her proximity), would be:

  • (5) This is Miranda.

Others include vocative address (“Hello, Miranda!”), where the name is attributed to the addressee, and stipulation (“Let this one be Zappa”). Constructions with appellative verbs like “call” are tailor-made for name attribution (“Call me Ishmael”), but attribution may also be discerned in the background of a more casual kind of utterance. Even “Homer was a master of narrative” could be seen to presuppose an attribution of “Homer” to the author of certain narrative works (Evans 1982: 394–395).

Attributions can be to individuals identified by description as well as by acquaintance. As we will see, Evans restricts canonical applications by fiat to the by-acquaintance variety, while Kripke seems to allow both sorts (1980: 94).

The main tenet of the use theory, as we will understand it, is that an utterance of a name is constrained in its reference by a set of prior applications. Assuming, for the moment, that the applications in that set were all to one individual (the same one was independently identified in each case), then the utterance is simply constrained to refer to that individual (in order, as we might put it, to be consistent with those past applications). The use theory in outline is almost the same as Strawson’s view that the reference of a name is determined by the identifying descriptions associated with it in the minds of its users, except that it replaces users’ dispositions to identify the referent of a name in a certain way with their public acts of committing to particular identifications.

Another difference exhibited by the use theories of Kripke and Evans is their flight from Strawson’s democratic approach to identification (Kripke 1980: 65). Both philosophers distinguish a proper subset of the applications of a name as canonical for determining its reference (see also Putnam 1975).

Indeed, only one attribution is authoritative on the picture Kripke offers: an inaugurating stipulation that tyrannically governs all subsequent use. The paradigm of this initiating act is the naming ceremony, where a name is officially conferred on a person or thing. Since no subsequent attribution can alter the reference of downstream use, Kripke’s account makes no allowance for reference change (each “change” in fact requires the institution of a new specific name, with a new inaugural event).

Evans loosens Kripke’s restriction to allow for the influence of subsequent attributions, and hence makes it possible to model change in the reference of a name. On his account, the authoritative applications are those of the (current) “producers” of a name-using practice—those in a position to make identifications based on direct acquaintance, as they are capable of recognizing the individual to which they attribute the name (Evans 1982: 376–377). Those who are not producers—the consumers—have a more limited role in the practice. While they can use the name to refer to the relevant individual, their own attributions need not be consistent with its reference.

Standard use theories provide vague guidelines for selecting the set of historical attributions (the “precedent”) that constrains the reference of a particular utterance. For Kripke, selection involves tracing back the (intentionally mediated) historical chain from the utterance to an initial naming ceremony. For Evans it requires resolving the utterance to its proper name-using practice (a process he conceives of on the model of lexical disambiguation), and then sifting out the attributions of the producers in that practice.

It follows that Kripke is committed to the coreference of (appropriately) historically connected name-utterances, while Evans is committed to the coreference of all (simultaneous) utterances belonging to the one practice. It is worth noting that a use theory need not carry either of these commitments. We might instead, following Donnellan (1974: 16), take the relevant applications to be those that contribute to the historically correct explanation of the utterance in question. Since the same speaker, manifestly intending to contribute to the same name-using practice, might utter the same name in pursuit of different goals, and hence with differing overall explanations for each of their utterances, Donnellan’s account does not carry the constraints of the other theories (for some pros and cons, see Donnellan 1970: 349–351 and Evans 1973: 202).

If the precedent consists of more than one attribution, the theory additionally needs some way to resolve conflicts—cases where one attribution is to x, while another is to y. We could say that any conflict in the precedent results in either reference failure (Evans 1982: 389) or referential indeterminacy (Lewis 1984). But we can also imagine a more nuanced rule that prioritized certain properties in the event of a conflict (the way Evans prioritizes the applications of producers over those of consumers).

In sum, the general framework for a use theory has it that a set of attributions P provides a constraint on the reference of an utterance u of a name (the theory may provide a means of determining P from u and its circumstances, or, at the extreme of relativism, will only say that reference is dependent on a choice of precedent P). Each element \(P_i\) of P contributes a general descriptive or situational feature that serves to identify the subject of the application (think of each \(P_i\) as a property, applied at the world of utterance). Additionally, the use theory may specify a priority relation on P (or other means of resolving conflicts). The result is a condition (we can call it \(C(u)\) if we assume that an utterance u determines this condition, by determining its proper precedent) that specifies the constraint on the reference of the utterance required by consistency with its proper precedent of attributions.

2.8 Use Theories as Cluster Theories

The general use theory we have just described has an obvious affinity with the cluster theory discussed just prior to it. The set of canonical attributions in the use theory boils down to a cluster of conditions that jointly determine reference. Theories of both sorts are specified by providing a means of selecting the set, and a means of resolving conflicts among the properties in the set (in the event that it does not turn out to be unitary).

Use theories, like cluster theories, can be seen as open-ended in what counts towards reference (I was careful to allow for this in the general statement at the end of the previous section). Even an open-ended cluster theory can issue in ceteris paribus claims such as: if these are the only considerations operating in the case, then the reference is to so-and-so. In use theories, this open-endedness crops up (at least) in the choice of precedent; so that the best we might say, in some cases, is: if we fix the precedent like this, then the reference is to such-and-such. Though we are certainly not at a loss in deciding the proper precedent for any particular case, it is difficult to say in general and with precision which applications should count. Evans’ invocation of a name-using practice is too vague to guide us in concretely described cases, and Kripke explicitly disclaims that he is providing a prediction-making theory of nominal reference.

If we generalize cluster theories to allow them to include identifying properties extracted from use (instead of restricting them to dispositional identifying descriptions), we can treat use theories as a species of cluster theory. Indeed, a general umbrella is a good idea if it turns out that dispositional identifying descriptions play a part in determining reference alongside “the actual pattern of dealings” (see Lewis 1984: 226–27, for this argument, and Unger 1983 for the cases on which it is based). For example, Evans observes that one’s utterance of “Anir” cannot refer to King Arthur’s son if one believes it to be the name of Arthur’s burial place instead (1973: 198; see Dickie 2011 for a host of similar examples).

We have already noted that a cluster theory need not give the meaning of a name; that adopting one is consistent with thinking that names are meaningless. Our example, recall, was Strawson, who denied the meaningfulness of names (he would not even grant them a rule of use), yet thought their reference was determined by a cluster of identifying descriptions. On the other hand, one might have reasons for thinking the cluster—even one that includes properties derived from use—accurately represents the meaning of a name (this appears, for instance, to be Lewis’s view). Finally, the cluster could comprise influences from meaning alongside influences from use, with the rule for adjudicating conflict, in part, deciding between factors of those different types.

2.9 Empty Names and Negative Existentials

A direct argument for the claim that a name’s meaning is the cluster condition determining its reference comes from a consideration of claims of nonexistence (or “negative existentials”):

Consider this example. If one says “Moses did not exist”, this may mean various things. It may mean: the Israelites did not have a single leader when they withdrew from Egypt—or: their leader was not called Moses—or: there cannot have been anyone who accomplished all that the Bible relates of Moses—or etc., etc. (Wittgenstein 1953: sec. 79)

There is something compelling about Wittgenstein’s observation. The three alternatives he outlines (while being clear they are not exhaustive) describe different kinds of situation in which we might well agree that Moses did not exist. While one could claim that the sentence is ambiguous, with an interpretation analyzed in each of these ways at least, this is not what Wittgenstein has in mind. This is a good thing, since “Moses did not exist” cannot literally mean that the Israelites did not have a single leader, as it is certainly conceivable that Moses existed but did not lead the Israelites (Kripke 1980: 66–67). Instead, we must treat his alternatives in the manner already suggested for the components of a cluster theory: as conditions that are neither strictly necessary nor inevitably sufficient, but which instead count as factors in favor of the nonexistence claim, interacting with an open-ended set of other factors both for and against. Perhaps, indeed, Wittgenstein himself held this view in an inchoate way:

Has the name “Moses” got a fixed and unequivocal use for me in all possible cases?—Is it not the case that I have, so to speak, a whole series of props in readiness, and am ready to lean on one if another should be taken from under me, and vice versa? (Wittgenstein 1953: sec. 79)

Intuitions aside, negative existentials pose a serious challenge to the view that names have no meaning. The difficulty is most acute on the view that names only contribute their referent to the truth condition of an utterance (but see Kripke 2013; Braun 1993; the papers in Everett & Hofweber 2000); there is a way out, sketched below, for one willing to treat nonreferring names as still contributing a sense (which, as you will recall from Section 2.2, is consistent with the claim that names have no linguistic meaning).

Generally speaking, the point of a singular negative existential cannot be to make a (false) claim about a certain individual, referred to by the singular term in the subject position, to the effect that that individual does not exist. In this way, singular negative existentials differ from run-of-the-mill utterances, such as:

  • (6)Socrates drank hemlock.

Let C(“Socrates”) stand for the (putative) cluster condition that determines the referent of “Socrates”. We are able to state the condition under which (6) is true as:

  • (7) \( \exists x. C( \textrm{‘Socrates’})(x) \wedge \textsf{drank.hemlock}(x) \)

While (7) is an accurate statement of the truth condition of (6), it may not be the truth condition we get when we put together the semantic contributions of the parts. (Once again, following Kripke, Burge and others, we must maintain a distinction between the semantic contribution—or semantic value—of an uttered expression, and that expression’s linguistic meaning.) In particular, if we think that “Socrates” contributes its referent (and only its referent) to the compositional truth condition of a sentence, then we will prefer the following statement (where s is an individual constant denoting Socrates):

  • (8) \(\textsf{drank.hemlock}(s)\)

If a name does not refer (take a name such as Urbain Le Verrier’s “Vulcan” or Algernon’s “Bunbury”—from Wilde’s play, The Importance of Being Earnest), then we obviously lack the option of expressing a truth condition that cites its referent. If a claim involving an empty name has a truth condition at all, it would have to be a condition that, like (7), incorporates the condition that determines reference, rather than one that, like (8), incorporates the referent itself.

We might not require a truth condition for statements like “Bunbury drank hemlock” or “This is a fine red one” where nothing is demonstrated (cf. Strawson 1950: 333). Those sentences aren’t true, and perhaps don’t make truth-evaluable claims at all. But Wittgenstein has drawn our attention to negative existentials, and we do have a grip on the sort of situations in which they would turn out to be true. If C(“Moses”) represents the cluster condition that singles out Moses in all those situations in which we would say he did exist, then the truth condition for (9a) could be represented as (9b), but not as (9c).

Moses did not exist.
\(\neg\exists x.C(\textrm{“Moses”})(x) \wedge \textsf{past}(\textsf{alive}(x))\)

Now suppose, for a moment, we agree with Davidson (1967) that (i) when we state the truth condition of a sentence in the right way, we give its semantic value. If the truth condition of (9a) cannot be stated as (9c), then that leaves (9b) as the remaining candidate for the semantic value of the sentence. And (ii) if the semantic value of a sentence is determined by the semantic values of its parts, then C(“Moses”) must be the contribution of “Moses” (or possibly some larger constituent including “Moses”). Since we distinguish meaning and semantic value, it doesn’t follow directly that C(“Moses”) is the meaning of “Moses”. However, we cannot, according to this argument, think of C(“Moses”) as a mere metasemantic condition (perhaps derived from use), because metasemantic conditions determine the semantic values of expressions, rather than vice versa.

Either premise (i)–(ii) in this argument could be challenged. So, one could distinguish the (compositional) semantic value of a sentence from its truth condition. It would then be possible to say that a name that does not refer makes no contribution to the semantic value of a sentence, and even that a sentence containing an empty name does not have a semantic value, while still maintaining that (9b) gives the correct truth condition for “Moses does not exist”. This is the approach of Donnellan (1974: 25), for whom the compositional semantic value of an uttered sentence is the proposition that it expresses—not quite its truth condition. While the utterance is true if that proposition holds and false if it fails to hold, Donnellan also thinks it may be true or false even if no proposition is generated. In particular, he proposes a rule that would make a nonexistence statement true if generation fails in particular way: specifically, if the historical explanation of its singular subject’s use does not serve to identify any appropriate individual.

A different approach would replace C(“Moses”)—which is just shorthand for a cluster condition—with a truly metalinguistic condition, one that includes the reference relation itself. Note that (10) entails (9b), given that C(“Moses”) is the condition that determines the referent of “Moses”.

  • (10) \(\neg\exists x.\textsf{refers}(\textrm{“Moses”})(x) \wedge \textsf{past}(\textsf{alive}(x)) \)

Metalinguistic analyses of nonexistence statements face certain objections. One is that “Moses did not exist” and its translation into French have different semantic values, since they say of different words that they don’t refer to someone who once lived. This particular problem could be addressed if there was a common sense—associated with at most one referent—expressed by English speakers uttering “Moses” and French speakers uttering its translation “Moïse” (see Cumming 2013 for a proposal). The truth condition could then replace parochial reference to language with reference to sense. If we let \(\delta\) denote the sense expressed by “Moses”, then the truth condition would be:

  • (11) \( \neg\exists x.\textsf{refers}(\delta)(x) \wedge \textsf{past}(\textsf{alive}(x)) \)

A further advantage of (11) is that we can give a compositional semantics on which “Moses” contributes its sense, \(\delta\), while the predicate contributes the existential quantification over the variable x as well as the relation connecting the sense of an expression to its referent (glossed simply as refers in (11)). Musan (1997) and others have given empirical arguments that a large class of predicates (those that are not “existence independent” in her terminology) have such an existential component to their meaning. It is eminently reasonable to place “exists” in their company.

A parallel compositional treatment of (10) would have “Moses” contributing itself (as though it occurred in a quotation). It perhaps seems more plausible, should we opt for (10), to carve the truth condition up differently, so that we assign “Moses” the metalinguistic meaning the individual referred to by “Moses”. We will now turn to a consideration of such a metalinguistic account of the meaning of names.

2.10 Metalinguistic Theories

The nominal phrase N in a definite description “the N” contributes a condition that should be sufficient to discriminate the referent of the description from its local distractors. If I felicitously utter “the red one”, then you should be able to successfully identify the referent I have in mind on the basis of its being red. In this case, the condition that serves for identification in context is not specific enough to determine the referent outright—there are of course many red things in existence other than the one I refer to.

As referring expressions, names can be seen to work in a similar way (compare Gray 2014: 216). In a felicitous utterance of “Alice”, some one individual is identified to the audience. In the case of names, the discriminating condition is metalinguistic: the referent of the utterance is distinguished from distractors by her feature of being called “Alice”.

This parallel suggests that a syntactic constituent of the name—the proper nominal phrase—contributes this metalinguistic property; and the (generic) name “Alice”, as a whole, means the individual called “Alice”.

This compositional theory of a name’s import is corroborated by several pieces of circumstantial evidence. First, many names, including certain names of places and things in English and of people in Greek and other languages, actually incorporate a definite determiner (“the” in English). This suggests that names might have a compositional semantics just like that of a definite description, where the determiner meaning combines with a property contributed by the nominal complement to generate the meaning of the overall phrase.

Second, when a proper nominal occurs with other kinds of overt determiner, it often takes on a metalinguistic meaning (Sloat 1969; Burge 1973):

  • (12) There are two Alices in my son’s class.

The (proper) nominal “Alice” in (12) has a meaning one might parse as being called “Alice”; or, even more specifically, since (12) is a written sentence, as having a name spelled A-l-i-c-e (Gray 2015).

On the other hand, the metalinguistic property attributed to the proper nominal appears superfluous in accounting for the way a name identifies its referent to the audience. The fact that the referent of the speaker’s use of “Alice” is called “Alice” is something that can reasonably be inferred from the form of the referring expression alone, and doesn’t require access to its meaning. It is a familiar point that we should think twice before attributing to meaning an inference that requires nothing more than common sense (Grice 1975). Indeed, it is not clear that such an interpretation could belong to a conventional meaning, since a convention requires a possible alternative, and there is no alternative to taking an utterance of “Alice” to narrow the field to those individuals who are called “Alice”.

This brings us to a circularity objection brought against the metalinguistic view (Strawson 1950: 340; Kripke 1980: 68–70). One way of explicating having a name spelled A-l-i-c-e is to say that there is a linguistic item—a specific name with that spelling—referring to one. Thus (12) says in effect that there are two individuals in the class referred to by such a name. This would be consistent with an account on which specific names (unlike proper nominals occupying contexts like (12)) do not have a meaning, their reference being determined by use instead. More generally, this explication treats the reference of specific names as the more basic notion, defining the predicate meaning of the proper nominal in terms of such reference.

To think of names (not nominals) as having a metalinguistic meaning which then (partially) determines their reference, reverses this picture. Instead of the metalinguistic meaning being explicated in terms of the reference of specific names (satisfying a certain property), the reference of names would be explained with the help of the metalinguistic meaning. To avoid a theory in which the explanation goes in a circle, the metalinguistic predicate having a name spelled A-l-i-c-e must be explicated without appeal to the reference of names.

Fortunately, we already have the materials to attempt such an explication. Back in Section 2.7, we distinguished the act of attributing a name to someone (previously identified) from that of referring to someone with a name. It would be quite natural to interpret a metalinguistic predicate as applying to someone on the basis of a pattern of attribution, rather than a pattern of reference. Indeed, the ordinary sense of “calling someone Alice” is a reasonable gloss of the technical notion of attributing the name Alice to them (Evans in fact employs this terminology—see his 1982: 383). So, for instance, I could not have mistakenly called someone Alice without identifying them independently, and people I refer to with a name but can’t identify independently—for instance people whose names I am reading off a roll—have not, intuitively speaking, been called that name by me.

Even if name attribution is not the right way to ground metalinguistic predicates, any use theory, in attempting to explain the reference of a name in terms of (distinct) features of its use, will have to employ something in its stead. Use theories and metalinguistic theories are in the same boat. While what ends up working for one won’t necessarily work for the other, it does not seem that the metalinguistic theory is uniquely afflicted by a circularity objection. Rather, both theories stand in need of a suitable reductive base (for related discussion, see Burge 1973: 428; Geurts 1997: 326–327; Bach 2002: 83; Fara 2011; Gray 2014; Rami 2014: 858; García-Carpintero 2017: 25).

The decision whether to grant a metalinguistic meaning to names appears to come down to what is basic and what is generated in the semantic theory. If the meaning of a name is generated from the metalinguistic meaning of the constituent proper nominal, then names will accordingly have a metalinguistic meaning (most likely in the form of a rule of use). If instead names are treated as basic by the semantics, then there is less motivation to assign them such a meaning (we shouldn’t simply do so by default, as already discussed in Section 2.5).

To treat both names and metalinguistically interpreted nominal predicates as semantically basic is generally thought to be inferior theoretical economy (Gray 2017: 436–437). But this is surely too quick; a nominal predicate, though semantically basic, would still count as a natural expression of the metalinguistic property it denotes (see Johnson 2018), and the naturalness of the choice could explain the prevalence of the convention across languages and its ease of uptake. In any event, a parallel attempt is made on the anti-metalinguistic side to generate the metalinguistic interpretations of proper nominals from existing resources (Boër 1975: 395; Leckie 2013; Jeshion 2015: 381; Gray 2017). However, unless those basic resources include the references of names (and Gray 2017 argues that this is hardly a promising route), the metalinguistic theory can help itself to the same thrift. There’s nothing in the metalinguistic account that says the metalinguistic predicates are themselves basic, just that they are more basic than the meanings of names constructed out of them.

Dialectically speaking, then, the crucial issue appears to be the compositional derivation of the name’s meaning. I will go over a little of the linguistic data that has appeared so far in the debate. Much of this data would appear, out of context, as the sheerest minutia. But the fate of what has recently been regarded as the best prospect for assigning a meaning to a proper name comes down to the interpretation of these details.

Firstly, a problem arises for the metalinguistic account when the name includes an overt determiner (Cumming 2007: 22). “The Bronx” consists of the determiner “the” and the proper nominal “Bronx”. According to a compositional account of its meaning, it should refer to the most salient entity called “Bronx”. However, the northernmost borough of New York City is not called “Bronx”; it is called “the Bronx”. Furthermore, despite the fact that this borough is called the Bronx, we do not refer to it using an expression that combines a phrase that expresses this metalinguistic property with a definite determiner, as the compositional theory would predict. We don’t use “the the Bronx”, which might be seen as such a combination (with “the Bronx” expressing the property of being called the Bronx). Nor is it plausible that “the Bronx” sports a covert definite determiner, as the overt “the” is not fused with “Bronx” into a proper nominal phrase, but is dropped in such expressions as “a Bronx resident”.

This drawback of the metalinguistic theory is concealed when we restrict our consideration to proper names that can occur—optionally or obligatorily—without an article, names such as “Alice” or “(the) George Washington Bridge”. The George Washington Bridge also happens to be called George Washington Bridge—in the sense that people also refer to it this way (and attribute the name sans article to it). But this appears an accident of naming, rather than a vindication of the compositional view. There are many names that fit the formula of “the Bronx” instead. The World Cup is not, properly speaking, called (just) World Cup; the Eiffel Tower is not called Eiffel Tower (the way Sears Tower is); the Mona Lisa is not called Mona Lisa (though its subject, Lisa del Giocondo, was; and interestingly, we would say that the painting is titled Mona Lisa).

The situation is different if we confine our attention to personal names. As mentioned earlier, in many languages outside English, personal names come with a (definite) determiner. Matushansky (2008: 580–581) provides evidence for a cross-linguistic pattern of dropping the determiner on personal names in naming environments like “is called”, just as the compositional account would predict.

A problem remains even for a curtailed version of the metalinguistic view on which it applies only to personal names. It can be brought out with data from English. It was originally claimed that “the Alice” (with neutral stress on “the”) was ungrammatical, and hence that “Alice” accompanied by a null determiner with the same meaning as “the” filled its slot in the paradigm (Sloat 1969). However, “the Alice” is not ungrammatical, merely unusual. It is used when the possession of the relevant metalinguistic property is particularly prominent. For instance, when sorting people into groups based on their names, or collecting examples of people with a particular name (Jeshion 2017: 235; Gray 2017: 452).

Critics of the metalinguistic view have noted subtle differences in interpretation that prevent us from treating “Alice” as equivalent to the more clearly metalinguistic phrase “the Alice”. In each pair below, the (b) member allows the individual who counts as the Alice to vary with the occasion, while the (a) member doesn’t (Hawthorne & Manley 2012: 236–237; Fara 2015c; Schoubye 2016).

In every race, Alice won.
In every race, the Alice won.
Alice always cheats.
The Alice always cheats.

Another difference is that “the Alice” licenses subsequent one-anaphora, while “Alice” does not (King 2006; Jeshion 2017: 238):

You’re too late. The Alice just left …but maybe another one will show up.
You’re too late. Alice just left …but maybe another one will show up.

A natural explanation of these differences is that a compositional semantics on which the proper nominal contribute a metalinguistic property is correct for “the Alice”, but not for “Alice”.


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