Notes to Negation

1. Some research suggests that apes and even non-primates can be trained to understand the functions of rejection, refusal, and even non-existence, corresponding to stages attested in children’s acquisition of negation, but not those of denial or truth-conditional negation (Heine and Kuteva 2007: 141–2).

2. Useful typologies of sentential negation are provided in Payne 1985, Miestamo 2005; for an annotated bibliography on this and other topics in natural language negation, see Horn’s Oxford Bibliography entry under “Other Internet Resources”.

3. One consequence of the formal markedness asymmetry is that a negative statement embeds its affirmative counterpart within it; when Nixon famously insisted “I am not a crook” or Clinton “I did not have sex with that woman”, the concealed affirmation was more significant than the surface denial. The same asymmetry is exploited in non-denial denials, such as Republican campaign operative Mary Matalin’s disingenuous protest “We’ve never said to the press that Clinton’s a philandering, pot-smoking draft-dodger” (see also Giora 2007 on psycholinguistic evidence for the persistence of negated material).

4. The (a) examples also involve focus on the fronted prepositional phrase (see Rooth 1992 and Beaver and Clark 2008 on association with focus and its relation to negation). In the (b) examples, the fronted phrase is a topic rather than a focus (Haegeman 2000).

5. Within the schools of logic in India, the mutual annihilation of double negatives has a similarly long lineage; see Horn 1989 for references.

6. Negative concord has long been recognized as a central topic not only for the synchronic grammar of negation but also for language change, as exemplified in the system of reanalyses and shifts associated known as Jespersen’s cycle (Kiparsky and Condoravdi 2006, van der Auwera 2010).

7. \(*(X)\) conventionally indicates that \(X\) must occur, \((*X)\) that \(X\) cannot occur.

8. See de Swart 2011 for a comprehensive study of the cross-linguistic semantics of negation within a bidirectional optimality-theoretic framework in which syntactic and semantic constraints act in concert to define the grammar of a language. De Swart investigates the nature of variation giving rise to different systems of double negation and negative concord.

9. This is not to say that logical multiple negation conforming to the duplex negatio affirmat principle does not exist, depending on the goals of speakers and writers. One celebrated example is Richard Montague’s observation to Barbara Partee in June 1970: “Barbara, I think you’re the only linguist who it is not the case that I can’t talk to”.

10. Medieval logicians like Ockham developed a notion of upward and downward inference that in many ways anticipates the Fauconnier-Ladusaw theory (Sánchez 1994, Horn 1996); indeed, they identified expressions allowing downward inferencing from sets to subsets as termini habentes vim negationis. Such terms with the force of negation included comparatives, restrictors of universals, and only, all environments licensing NPIs in English.

11. It is significant that whatever evidence is adduced to support this and other distinctions between negation types noted here, a single negative marker is typically used for the two types (cf. Gazdar 1979), although in some languages, such as Ancient Greek (ou(k) vs. ), two or more negative markers are distinguished on morphosyntactic grounds (Horn 1989: 447–52).

Notes to Supplement

1. It has often been noted that bivalence must be distinguished from the validity of the Law of Excluded Middle. The LEM is valid, for instance, in Priest’s (1979) logic of paradox LP, although LP is a three-valued logic, see entries on many-valued logic and paraconsistent logic. Moreover, it can be shown that every Tarskian consequence relation has a bivalent, although non-compositional semantics, cf. Malinowski 1993, Shramko and Wansing 2011: Chapter 9.

2. The basic systems of Nelson’s constructive logics with strong negation, N4 and N4\(^{\bot}\), have a four-valued possible worlds semantics. The underlying four-valued first-degree entailment logic is closely related to early Buddhist logic, cf. Dunn 2000, Priest 2010, and the entry on contradiction.

3. Avron does not, however, assume that these relations are monotonic, i.e., that \(\Delta \vdash \Gamma\) implies \(\Delta \cup \Delta ' \vdash \Gamma \cup \Gamma '\), with the restriction that \(\Gamma \cup \Gamma '\) contains at most one formula in the case of single-conclusion consequence relations.

Copyright © 2015 by
Laurence R. Horn <>
Heinrich Wansing <>

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