Notes to Négritude

1. “In meeting Senghor, I met Africa”, quoted in Vaillant 1990 (91).

2. “Misère d’une poésie” was published in the journal Légitime Défense which he founded with other young Caribbean intellectuals in 1932. The text was published in that single issue of the journal. Légitime Défense is considered an inspiration for the creation of L’Etudiant noir and for the Négritude movement.

3. Les armes miraculeuses (Césaire 1946) is the title of a collection of poems published in 1946 by Aimé Césaire.

4. In reaction, Frantz Fanon wrote: “When I read that page [of Black Orpheus], I felt that I had been robbed of my last chance. I said to my friends, ‘The generation of the younger black poets has just suffered [an unforgiving blow].’ Help had been sought from a friend of the colored peoples, and that friend had found no better response than to point out the relativity of what they were doing… Jean-Paul Sartre, in this work, has destroyed black zeal.” [Fanon 1991, 133–135]

5. As early as in June 1949, a few months after the publication of the Anthology, Gabriel d’Arbousier, then a prominent African intellectual and politician (he was a member of the Rassemblement Démocratique Africain Party—African Democratic Party—which was then close to the French Communist Party), published a reaction to Senghor’s book. In an article titled “Une dangereuse mystification: la théorie de la Négritude” (“A Dangerous Mystification: the Theory of Négritude”) and published in a Journal sponsored by the French Communist Party, La Nouvelle Critique, he denounced those he called “the fake prophets of reactionary existentialism” which he considered the enemy of “any revolution, black or white” (d’Arboussier 1949, 47).

6. Césaire’s Discours sur la Négritude (“A Lecture on Négritude”) from which this passage is quoted was originally a lecture given on February 26, 1987 at Florida International University in Miami. It is published in a new edition of his Discours sur le colonialisme (Césaire 2004).

7. Is reproduced here the paraphrase of Apostel’s presentation of the ontological principles that is offered in African Art as Philosophy. Senghor, Bergson and the Idea of Negritude, (Diagne 2011, 84–85)

8. Published by Présence africaine. See Aimé Césaire, Discourse on colonialism (2000, 58).

9. I am alluding here to Donna Jones’ enlightening examination of Négritude as life philosophy in her book entitled precisely The Racial Discourses of Life Philosophy, Négritude, Vitalism, and Modernity (Jones, 2010).

10. See Benoist De l’Etoile, Le goût des autres. De l’Exposition coloniale aux arts premiers, (2007, 68). De l’Etoile quotes Marcel Mauss’ remark in 1931 that “young colonized and young French were now able to feel those ‘beauties’”. (2007, 69)

11. (Senghor 1964, 214). Senghor’s “L’esthétique négro-africaine,” (“Negro-African Aesthetics)” from which this passage is cited was first published in the October 1956 issue of the journal Diogène.

12. (Senghor 1964, 211–212). This passage uses the unpublished translation of Senghor’s article by Eliana Vagalau. There exists a translation in the English version of the journal under the title “African-Negro Aesthetics” (published in the 1956, vol 4, issue of Diogenes, available online) but it is just not good.

13. The lecture has been reprinted in (Thébia-Melsan 2000).

14. On September 28, 1944, at a Philosophy Conference organized in Port-au-Prince (Haiti), Césaire gave a lecture on “Poésie et connaissance” (Poetry and Knowledge) the object of which is summarized in the very first line of the address: “Poetic knowledge is born in the great silence of scientific knowledge.” The text of the address is reproduced in ( Kesteloot and Kotchy 1993).

15. Aimé Césaire, Letter to Maurice Thorez (Césaire, 2010, 147).

16. This is quoting the subtitle of Tommie Shelby’s We Who are Dark. The Philosophical Foundations of Black Solidarity (Shelby 2005).

17. Gary Wilder has rightly insisted on the cosmopolitanism of the Negritude authors. Senghor’s politics of ‘Federalism’ as a way out of colonialism, or rather a way beyond it, towards full equality of citizens, manifests that he was a global thinker, a philosopher of the totality (Wilder, 2005 and 2015).

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Souleymane Bachir Diagne <>

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