First published Thu Oct 1, 2009; substantive revision Tue May 28, 2019

The term “Neo-Daoism” (or “Neo-Taoism”) seeks to capture the focal development in early medieval Chinese philosophy, roughly from the third to the sixth century C.E. Chinese sources generally identify this development as Xuanxue, or “Learning (xue) in the Profound (xuan).”

Xuan” literally denotes a shade of black with dark red. By extension, it gains a richer meaning connoting what is hidden from view or far from reach, especially in the sense of a profound truth that escapes ordinary comprehension, and thus appears “dark” or mysterious. In this latter sense, it figures prominently in the Laozi (Daodejing). The Dao or “Way” is “formless” and “nameless,” as the Laozi asserts, and yet it is the “beginning” of “heaven and earth,” and the basis of human flourishing. Indescribably deep and profound, the Dao therefore can only be depicted as dark and hidden, or xuan (see especially Laozi, Chapter 1).

Xuanxue aimed at unlocking the mystery of Dao, and in so doing came to define the early medieval Chinese intellectual scene. However, it was not a partisan “Daoist” school. As such, the label “Neo-Daoism” is ambiguous and should be treated with care, though it may be convenient and widely used. Xuanxue harbored a wide range of views. The concept of Dao provided a focus, but it invited diverse interpretation. Xuanxue arose during a time of political turmoil after the fall of the Han dynasty (206 B.C.E.–220 C.E.), when leading intellectuals of the succeeding Wei (220–265) and Jin (265–420) dynasties interrogated tradition afresh, so as to arrive at a new blueprint for order. This occasioned intense debates and set new directions for the development of Chinese philosophy. The discussion that follows will set out briefly the context in which Neo-Daoism made its mark, and introduce some of its major figures and debates.

1. What is Xuanxue?

As a proper term, Xuanxue gained currency during the fifth century C.E. It named a branch of learning that formed a part of the curriculum of the imperial academy. The subject matter of Xuanxue in this formal sense centered on the Yijing (Classic of Changes), the Laozi, the Zhuangzi, and selected commentaries on them. These three classical texts were seen to hold deep insight into the cosmos and the human condition, and were referred to collectively as the “Three (Great Works on the) Profound” (sanxuan). They articulated their vision of “grand harmony” and “great peace” through the concept of Dao, which demanded explication. It is precisely the goal of Xuanxue, then, to bring to light the nature and function of Dao, which may appear dark or impenetrable.

In a wider sense, Xuanxue came to describe, retrospectively, the main current of early medieval Chinese philosophy as a whole. This is a broad stroke that privileges intellectual unity over diversity. However, as we will see, family resemblances notwithstanding, there are significant differences among individual Xuanxue thinkers in their understanding of Dao. Looking back, later historians typically traced the beginnings of Xuanxue to the early third century C.E. The end of the Han dynasty caused painful disruptions, but it also forced open a space for intellectual renewal. In this context, the educated elite debated on ways to restore order and harmony, based on their interpretation of the teachings of the ancient sages and philosophers. The hermeneutical contest was keen, and new ideas came to the fore through the critical engagement with tradition. Nevertheless, there was a shared assumption that any blueprint for lasting peace and harmony must rest on a clear understanding of Dao, which provided a point of departure for the unfolding of Neo-Daoism.

While Xuanxue was guided by what may be called a keen “Dao-centered” consciousness, it was not a Daoist movement aimed at dismantling the teachings of Confucius. There is also some debate as to whether Neo-Daoism abandoned sociopolitical engagement for a kind of individualistic escapism. These two points warrant further discussion, which should give a thicker description of the context in which Neo-Daoism came into play.

The close connection between Xuanxue and “Pure Conversation” (qingtan) is often cited as evidence pointing to the former’s escapist interests. Pure Conversation was one of the hallmarks of early medieval Chinese literati culture. In its mature form, it found expression in high-minded debates on topical philosophical concerns, such as the relationship between “capacity” and “nature” in a person (to be discussed in Section 5 below). Pure Conversation has been traced to a protest movement against political corruption that erupted toward the end of the Han period. The protests were harshly suppressed. Consequently, some commentators argue, many intellectuals became disillusioned with the political process. Fearing for their safety also, they turned to, as it were, “purer” pursuits, channeling their creative energy to art and philosophy, away from the treacherous waters of politics. Culturally, they indulged in wine, games, including Pure Conversation, and outlandish behavior that seemed to have been designed expressly to upset the status quo. Examples of these will be mentioned below. As Xuanxue informed Pure Conversation philosophically, it is therefore charged with having given rein to a spirit of disengagement that took refuge in unproductive intellectual exchanges and certain counter-culture expressions.

No doubt, many literati in early medieval China found politics to be exceedingly corrupt. During this time, eremitic ideals also became entrenched in mainstream high culture. Nevertheless, these alone do not afford a full view of the vibrant intellectual landscape. While some scholars had lost faith in the political process, many others remained committed to revitalizing the rule of Dao, however it might be defined, and pushed for reforms. While some considered political involvement distasteful and trained their minds on alternative paths of fulfillment such as music and spirituality, others sought to reclaim the true teachings of the sages of old, so as to bring about a new sociopolitical awakening. These are not mutually exclusive positions, and both sides contributed to the formation of Neo-Daoism. Indeed, eremitism in early medieval China seldom translated into abandoning the sociopolitical world; in most cases, it signaled personal “purity” or integrity, a highly valued asset if not a precondition for admission to officialdom. Certainly, philosophical debates need not always be about political reforms; nevertheless, especially for young scholars aspiring to make a name for themselves in public life, successes at Pure Conversation could reap substantial political dividends. As a general intellectual movement, Xuanxue is united in its attempt to illuminate the “dark,” to lay bare the profound mystery of Dao, but it encompasses a range of responses to the brave new world that was post-Han China.

During the heyday of the Han dynasty, the Confucian tradition, as it was interpreted at that time, towered over all the other schools of thought. Confidently, it mapped out the structure of the universe and the ways in which the world under heaven ought to be governed. With the decline of the Han dynasty, critiques of Han Confucianism began to surface. To some scholars then, Han Confucianism was not only powerless in arresting the growing malaise, but also part of the problem that led to the downfall of the Han dynasty. The critique of Han Confucianism, it is important to emphasize, does not necessarily amount to a rejection of the teachings of Confucius. In fact, with few exceptions, Wei-Jin scholars agreed that Confucius was the highest sage. It is thus important to clarify that the term “Neo-Daoism” does not refer to a kind of “anti-Confucius” movement. For the majority of Xuanxue proponents, Confucius had penetrated completely the mystery of Dao; it was the misunderstanding and misappropriation of Confucian teachings by Han scholars that created difficulties and thus required rectification.

One key concern was that scholarship had become an avenue for emolument, as a result of which self-interest came to outweigh the concern for truth. This in part explains the emphasis on purity in early medieval Chinese literati culture. Furthermore, Han Confucianism attempted to forge an “orthodox” front, to explain and put into practice its teachings, and to silence dissent and opposition. The extent of Confucian orthodox control may be open to debate, but there is little question that it sought to exact compliance, which set limits to thought. The classics were restricted to a particular mode of interpretation, and non-canonical literature, including Daoist works, were often viewed with suspicion or dismissed outright. In the interest of unity, orthodoxy prescribed closure; but in an age of disunity and disruption, the quest for order charged through intellectual barriers with emancipatory fervor.

During the Han period, commentaries emerged as the principal medium of philosophic discourse. Methodologically, Han commentaries emphasized detailed explanation of individual words and phrases of the classics. This necessitated heavy specialization, which heightened virtuosity but also opened the door for vain scholastic display and fragmentation of learning. One of the most important debates in Xuanxue confronts directly the question of interpretation, which brought hermeneutics to the forefront of Chinese philosophy. More will be said about this debate later.

In this context, a first wave of Xuanxue philosophers arrived on the scene. They were the brightest of their age, many of whom hailed from distinguished families who had held high office for generations. They were concerned with restoring unity and harmony to the land, not by repudiating the teachings of the sages but by interpreting them anew. They discerned that the great teachers of old such as Confucius and Laozi shared a profound understanding of Dao, and for this reason, the highly partisan approach of Han Confucianism could not but lead to grave misunderstanding of the sage enterprise. In response, they devised new commentarial strategies and fashioned new genres of philosophical discourse, especially the lun, critical discussions, essays or disquisitions that focus on particular topics, which often elicited refutations and in turn, rejoinders. Some examples of this will be discussed in the sections that follow.

On this view, Confucius and Laozi were both “Daoists,” in the non-partisan sense of the term. Neo-Daoist philosophers set forth the truth of Dao as they understood it in a broad synthesis, bringing together ontology, cosmology, ethics, and political philosophy, and breaking down partisan divides along the way. Convinced of the unity of the classics, they attempted to provide an integral account of the one “Daoist” tradition. Crossing swords in debate, competing in offering new readings of the classics, reacting against and influenced by one another—in this crisscrossing of ideas, Xuanxue flourished.

Translating the term Xuanxue remains a challenge. In view of the ambiguity of “Neo-Daoism,” “Dark Learning” has been proposed as an alternative. This is also not entirely satisfactory. Even if it is clear that “dark” does not connote something sinister, it is still problematic because while the subject of the inquiry appears dark or inaccessible to understanding, there is nothing mysterious about the inquiry itself. Innovative and abstract in some respects, Xuanxue is nonetheless committed to analytic rigor and clarity in explicating the meaning of Dao. The culture of disputation has deep roots in Chinese history, and rigorous debates on the classics became prevalent during the Han period, which fueled the development of Neo-Daoist philosophy.

Critics of Xuanxue condemned it as “dark,” because they judged it to be obfuscating and detrimental to the flourishing of the Way. They would use phrases like “dark words” (xuanyan) or “dark talk” (xuantan) in a pejorative sense, indicating that to them Xuanxue was nothing but empty talk, convoluted, mystifying and misguided. In these contexts, “xuan” may be translated as “abstruse,” “obscure,” or words to that effect. What this suggests is that uniform translation without regard to context might be ill advised. Grammatically the word xuan functions as a noun in “Xuanxue.” Perhaps “Learning in the Profound,” “Learning of the Mysterious Dao,” “Inquiry into the Profound” or similar renderings may be considered, though they seem rather bulky.

As Xuanxue philosophy is seen to offer a fresh approach to understanding the nature and function of Dao, it has come to be called xin daojia (literally, new school of Daoist thought) in some modern Chinese studies, or “Neo-Daoism” in English translation. In the pages that follow, the terms Xuanxue and Neo-Daoism will be used interchangeably in a general sense, as a broad, dynamic intellectual front that flourished during early medieval China, as opposed to a homogeneous “school” with set doctrines. In modern Chinese, Xuanxue is also taken to refer to astrology, geomancy and other popular religious arts, which fall outside the scope of this discussion.

2. He Yan and Wang Bi: The “Nothingness” of Dao

Among the first wave of Neo-Daoist philosophers, He Yan (ca. 207–249) and Wang Bi (226–249) are often singled out by later scholars as having laid the foundation of the new Learning in the Profound. According to the Jin shu (History of the Jin Dynasty), He Yan, Wang Bi, and some of their contemporaries set forth the meaning of Laozi and Zhuangzi, and established the view that all beings “have their roots in nothingness (wu),” which not only “originates things” but also “completes affairs.” As the Jin shu goes on to relate, wu is that which the yin and yang qi, vital forces or “energies,” depend on in their creative transformation, that which all beings depend on in acquiring their form, and that which the morally worthy depend on in acquiring their virtuous character (Chapter 43). This furnishes a helpful starting point for a reconstruction of Xuanxue philosophy.

He Yan was one of the leading intellectual figures of the early third century, a trend setter on the cultural front, and one of the most influential in government. Wang Bi was very much a protégé of He Yan. A widely reported story, for example, has He Yan declaring that Wang Bi was one of those rare individuals with whom one could discuss the most profound truths about the cosmos and human affairs (e.g., see Sanguo zhi [Records of the Three States] 28).

Both He Yan and Wang Bi were known for their expertise in the Yijing. Both were deeply interested in the Laozi. Wang Bi’s Laozi and Yijing commentaries occupied an esteemed place in the formal Xuanxue curriculum, and arguably they remain the most important philosophical treatment of the two classics today. However, it should be noted that both He Yan and Wang Bi wrote on the Confucian Lunyu (Analects) as well. Through their extant writings, we gain a good view of the main contours of Xuanxue philosophy.

The Jin shu account cited above identifies the concept of wu as the locus of Xuanxue. The concept plays a critical role in the Laozi and has been translated variously as “nonbeing,” “nothing,” or “nothingness.” In classical Chinese, wu generally conveys the sense of “not having” something—e.g., “not having a name” (wu ming)—and functions as the opposite of “you,” “having” something. In the Laozi, it is used as an abstract noun as well. Specifically, the Laozi states that wu is the source of all beings (Chapter 40) and the basis of all functions (Chapter 11).

To He Yan and many of his contemporaries, there is little doubt that the meaning of Dao is to be sought in the concept of wu; but, it does not follow that they all understood the latter in the same way. The translation of the term wu will need to reflect the particular interpretation in question. In this section, the discussion on He Yan and Wang Bi will focus on their understanding of Dao as wu and its practical implications.

He Yan’s writings exist mainly in fragments today. The most important are (1) his commentary to the Lunyu, which was, however, a collective effort jointly submitted to the throne with several other scholars, and (2) quotations from two of his essays entitled Wuming lun (Critical Discussion on the Nameless) and Dao lun (Critical Discussion on Dao) preserved in later sources. In the former of the two essays, He Yan explicitly defines the Dao as wu. In the latter, the Dao lun, there is a fuller discussion of the meaning of nothingness:

Beings depend on wu in coming into existence, in becoming what they are. Affairs on account of wu come to fruition and become what they are. Now, one tries to speak about wu, but no words could describe it; name it, but it has no name; look at it, but it does not have any form; listen to it, but it does not give any sound. Then, indeed, it is clear that the Dao is complete (quan). Thus, it can bring forth sounds and echoes; generate qi energies and things; establish form and spirit; and illuminate light and shadows. What is dark obtains its blackness from it; what is plain obtains its whiteness from it. The carpenter’s square is able to make a square because of it; the compass is able to make a circle because of it. The round and the square obtain their form, but that which gives them their form itself does not have any form. The white and the black obtain their name, but that which gives them their name itself does not have any name.

Few scholars in early medieval China would question the general assertion that the Dao is the “beginning” and “mother” of all things, as the Laozi puts it (Chapter 1). There was also widespread acknowledgement of the namelessness and formlessness of Dao. After all, as the opening words of the Laozi famously proclaim, “The Dao that can be spoken of is not the constant Dao.” The real issue is how can that which transcends language and perception be said to be the creative source of all beings?

According to He Yan, the solution to the mystery of Dao lies in recognizing its “completeness” or undifferentiated wholeness (quan). Precisely because the Dao is whole and complete, it is able to bring forth heaven and earth and the myriad creatures. For the same reason, in its undifferentiated fullness the Dao does not have any particular form, and as such cannot be pinned down conceptually and named. Even the term “Dao,” as the Laozi makes clear, is but a metaphor, a “forced” effort to reference a reality that is ultimately ineffable (Chapter 25). He Yan stresses the same point in his “Critical Discussion on the Nameless”: “The Dao [i.e., what the word ‘Dao’ seeks to point to] fundamentally has no name. Thus, Laozi said he could only force a name on it.”

Put differently, the Dao can only be described as wu because it does not have any distinguishable feature or property characteristic of things. On this reading, wu does not signify ontological absence, but on the contrary attests to the fullness and fecundity of the Dao. More precisely, through a process of differentiation, the Dao generates the yin and yang qi that constitute all phenomena. The Laozi has also made the point that the Dao is “undifferentiated and complete” (Chapter 25). This is now shown to be the source of the yin and yang qi—vital forces, pneumas, or loosely, “energies”—that engender, shape and sustain life. In this respect, He Yan adhered generally to the yin-yang cosmological theory established since the Han dynasty. Viewed in this light, the nothingness of Dao has important implications for ethics and political philosophy.

Under the qi theory, all things are constituted by a particular measure, both quantitative and qualitative, of the yin and yang qi energies. For example, heaven is constituted by a particularly clear and refined form of qi, whereas the solidity of earth reflects its “heavier” qi composition. For human beings, each person has been endowed with an allotment of qi from birth, which informs his or her inborn “nature” (xing). In traditional Chinese terms, the qi endowment of an individual may be “thick” or “thin.” How this is understood bears directly on the conception of the ideal ethical or spiritual life and political community.

He Yan affirms in his Lunyu commentary that the inborn “xing-nature is that which human beings have been endowed with, and which enables them to live” (5.13). This is to be understood in terms of qi, which also accounts for a person’s “capacity” (cai) (commentary to Lunyu 15.29). In this context, the concept of cai is given a wide remit, encompassing the full range of talent and ability such as physical endowment, intelligence, and emotional and moral capacity. Xuanxue scholars debated hotly on the relationship between a person’s nature and capacity, of which more will be said later.

The height of ethical and spiritual attainment is, of course, represented by the figure of the sage. To He Yan, the sage is precisely someone who is gifted with an exceptionally fine and rich qi endowment, which enables him to “merge with the virtue of heaven and earth” (commentary to Lunyu 14.35 and 16.8). This follows the language of the Yijing and introduces a political dimension, for the virtue of heaven and earth brings about communal flourishing. Nevertheless, the underlying assumption remains that “sagehood” rests on a special inborn sage nature that finds expression in optimal capacity on all fronts. This also means that “sageness” cannot be acquired through learning or effort; in other words, sages are born, not made.

He Yan is noted for his view that the sage “does not experience pleasure and anger, or sorrow and joy” (Sanguo zhi 28, commentary). Later scholars have taken this to mean more generally that the sage “does not have emotions” (wuqing). However, this does not imply that the sage lacks the capacity to generate cognitive and affective responses. In He Yan’s interpretation, the nature of the sage is ultimately modeled on that of the Dao. Given that the Dao embodies the fullness of qi, conceptually it should be evident that the sage cannot be lacking in any way. The exceptional qi constitution of the sage means that his nature, like that of the Dao, is also undifferentiated and complete. As such, the sage is never partial or affected by phenomena; untouched by affective interests, his mind is always clear and tranquil, free from doubt and emotional disturbances. Consequently, on the political level, he is able to govern with impartiality, provide for the people with his profound virtue, establish lasting order and usher in the perfect reign of great peace.

This is an ideal construct. It may be logically coherent or even compelling, a mark of philosophical distinction prized by Pure-conversation connoisseurs, but what real bearing does it have on politics and government? Sages—fantastic individuals born with a sage nature on He Yan’s view—are obviously rare. If sagehood is not a genuine ethical option that can be achieved through learning and effort, a new model needs to be found. Logically, attention should then turn to “worthy” individuals like Yan Hui, the gifted and cherished disciple of Confucius, who is “close to the way of the sage” (commentary to Lunyu 11.19).

However, Yan Hui is also a special case, whose accomplishments are themselves quite extraordinary (e.g., commentary to Lunyu 6.3) and reflect a superior qi endowment. Only a select few, in other words, can hope to match the attainment of Yan Hui. This in effect marks out a separate class of exceptional individuals, the true elite, so to speak, whose inborn capacity far surpasses that of the common people and therefore should be entrusted with the task of government. Fair-minded and intellectually gifted, such individuals are also able to identify the right talent for public office, which would ensure the proper functioning of sociopolitical processes on a sustained basis. Capacity is a function of qi, and just as one grows hot under the collar when angry or turns pale in moments of fear, the idea is that one’s qi constitution can be discerned by the expert, especially by looking into the person’s eyes. Once it is understood that the nothingness of Dao reflects the fullness of qi, a clear view of the cosmos and the human condition emerges, on the basis of which renewed peace and harmony may then be realized.

Together with He Yan, Wang Bi helped set the course of Neo-Daoist philosophy. Although they shared similar philosophical concerns and were close socially and politically, it should not be assumed that they approached the mystery of Dao in the same way.

Wang Bi was a prolific scholar. Before his untimely death at the age of twenty-three, he had already completed a major commentary each on the Yijing and the Laozi, two shorter interpretive essays on them, and a work on the Lunyu. This last, unfortunately, has not survived except for about fifty quotations, cited chiefly in Huang Kan’s (488–545) comprehensive Lunyu commentary.

Like He Yan, Wang Bi focuses on the concept of “nothingness” (wu) in his explication of Dao. For He Yan, the nothingness of Dao bespeaks its undifferentiated fullness. Wang Bi, however, holds a different view. The argument from Dao’s completeness cannot explain fully the mystery of Dao, according to Wang. This is because it fails to resolve the problem of infinite regress. If the chain of beings were to be traced to a specific agent or entity, the origin of the latter must itself be questioned. What gives rise to the category of beings cannot be a being, no matter how powerful or fecund, with or without differentiated features. Taken to its logical conclusion, the argument cannot be that wu marks the incomparable being of the Dao; rather, as Wang Bi states explicitly, “Dao” serves but as “the designation of wu” (commentary to Lunyu 7.6, cf. commentary to Laozi 25).

The genesis of the cosmos certainly cannot be understood apart from Dao, but it is not the work of a primordial being or substance. As a linguistic representation, a metaphor in effect, “Dao” brings up the image of a great thoroughfare of life, from which all beings arise, but it does not entail an objective referent. The formlessness and namelessness of Dao signals a deeper reality. To bring to light the profound mystery of Dao, reflection must venture beyond the conceptual confines of what may be called an ontology of qi to discern the logic of wu.

The Laozi asserts that “Dao gives birth to one,” which produces “two,” and in turn the myriad beings (Chapter 42). Whereas commentators from the Han period onward generally identified the “one” with the original qi that generated the yin and yang vital forces—the “two”—at the beginning of time, Wang Bi may be said to have effected a paradigm shift in redirecting attention to the logical ground of the multiplicity and diversity of beings.

As Wang Bi understands it, “beginning” is not a temporal reference but signifies logical priority. It is true that “two” would be inconceivable without “one,” but this is a conceptual relation not to be reduced to a hierarchy of substances or vital forces (commentary to Laozi 42, drawing from Zhuangzi, Chapter 2). Dao constitutes the absolute beginning in that all beings have causes and conditions which in the end must logically derive from a single source; but, like “Dao,” “one” remains a symbol and does not reference any original substance or agent. Significantly, as Wang Bi makes the point in both his Yijing and Laozi commentaries, in this sense “one” is not a number but that which makes possible all numbers and functions. In the latter (commentary to Laozi 39), Wang defines “one” as “the beginning of numbers and the ultimate of things.” In the former (commentary to Appended Remarks, Part I), he writes, “In the amplification of the numbers of heaven and earth [in Yijing divination] … ‘one’ is not used. Because it is not used, use [of the others] is made possible; because it is not a number, numbers are made complete. This indeed is the great ultimate of change.”

“All things in the world are born of something (you); something is born of nothing (wu),” according to the Laozi (Chapter 40). How this is interpreted defines the approach to Dao by individual Xuanxue scholars. Wang Bi’s view is that Dao is not a nameless and formless something of which nothing can be said. Dao or Way indeed gives the sense that all beings are derived from the same source, but it points ultimately to that which is other than being, wu (“not-being”), a conceptually necessary basis of being. In this way, the mystery of Dao, that it is both nothing and responsible for everything, may be explained.

This does not invalidate the yin-yang cosmological theory, which does yield important insight into the workings of nature and society. Nevertheless, cosmology cannot lay bare the highest Daoist truth, with which the sages of old were principally concerned. In Wang Bi’s reworking, wu emerges as a higher-order concept that accounts for the coming to be of qi and all qi-constituted phenomena. On He Yan’s reading, it would be appropriate to speak of “the Dao,” with the definite article; but in Wang Bi’s interpretation, Dao is entirely symbolic and any attempt at reification must be resisted. This affirms the radical transcendence or otherness of Dao as wu. At the same time, by means of the concept of “one,” Wang maintains also the unity of the Daoist world, without having to resort to the language of time and being. The idea of a single “root” of existence holds important practical implications.

If Dao is by definition what being is not, how is it related to the world? The concept of “one” points in the general direction, but it requires corroboration. The concept of li, deep pattern or principle, plays an important role in helping to bridge the conceptual divide between transcendence and immanence in Wang Bi’s philosophy.

Dao has its “great constancy,” as Wang observes, which finds expression in li (commentary to Laozi 47). What this means is that the Daoist origin and structure of the world is seen to entail an inherent order. The plenitude of nature and the regularity of the seasons, for example, both attest to the presence of Dao in the world, not as primary substance, and still less a supreme deity, but as pristine order or coherence marked by intelligible patterns of change and principles of operation. This is the underlying assumption for the claim that Dao not only originates things but also nurtures and completes them, and that Dao is not only the beginning but also the “mother” of all beings (commentary to Laozi 1, 51 and 52).

The world is characterized by ceaseless change and transformation, which at first glance may appear haphazard; but as the Yijing has shown, change conforms to basic principles—not static metaphysical “forms,” but dynamic modes of operation—that can be described generally in terms of the interplay between the yin and yang vital forces. In this sense, the Laozi remarks that human beings are “modeled” after heaven and earth, and ultimately, after Dao (commentary to Laozi 25).

Of course, Dao properly understood as wu is not a something that can be modeled after, but as li, it points to an intrinsic order that constitutes and regulates all beings and functions. To Wang Bi, in short, both the Yijing and the Laozi realize that things and affairs follow certain li such as the cycle of growth and decay, and more importantly that the manifold patterns and principles governing the universe, like the branches of a tree, all stem from a single, unified “root.” For this reason, in interpreting the Yijing, Wang emphasizes that the meaning of a hexagram is to be sought in one line, as opposed to all the six lines that make up the hexagram. The technical detail of Wang Bi’s Yijing learning cannot be pursued here, but we will come back to the metaphor of “root and branches” shortly.

Li-principle, “one,” and wu thus form a conceptual cluster, which from different angles shed light on the seemingly dark or indecipherable truth of Dao. They inform not only the conception of the order of nature but also that of the self and society.

Human beings are of course formed by qi, which may entail different capacity. Wang Bi, like his contemporaries, recognizes that a person’s qi endowment may be “thick” or “thin” (commentary to Lunyu 17.2). However, what is more important is that beyond the differences in capacity, all are equally endowed with a Dao-centered nature, an internal li of order and harmony that tends toward stillness at its innermost depth.

This follows from the analysis of Dao as wu and “one,” which strips away the many disquieting layers of human artificiality and desire to arrive at a tranquil core. This is a key assumption. “One,” as the logical basis of the “many,” according to Wang, signifies also what is of the barest minimum (commentary to Laozi 22), which in this context translates into a view of human nature that has basic needs but little desire in its original, pristine condition. The language here is novel, though the general idea is already present in the Confucian Liji (Record of Rites): “When human beings are born, they are tranquil; this is the nature of [human beings endowed by] heaven.”

From Wang Bi’s perspective, heaven forms a part of the Daoist world, is itself derivative of the transformation of qi, and therefore cannot be identified as the ultimate source of human nature. Further, because Dao has no objective referent, it cannot be said that human nature is made in the image of a “creator” or derived from any external source. This necessitates an “inward” turn in fathoming the roots of human nature. Consequently, according to Wang Bi, human nature in its original, pristine form can only be understood to be “so of itself” (ziran).

The concept of ziran is critical to Neo-Daoist philosophy and is usually translated as “naturalness” or “spontaneity.” Commenting on the well-known statement in the Laozi that “Dao models after ziran,” Wang Bi is careful not to reify what is properly conceptual: “Ziran is a term [that we use] to speak of that which has no designation; it is an expression that seeks to lay bare [the meaning of] the ultimate” (commentary to Laozi 25).

Human nature so conceived may be described metaphorically as being like a plain block of wood (pu) that has not been carved into a functional or ornamental object, or it may be articulated self-referentially as what is “genuine” or “authentic” (zhen) of the person (e.g., commentary to Laozi 16 and 28). However, these remain expedient markers pointing to the truth of ziran, of what is “self-so,” understood as being rooted in a conceptually necessary ontological foundation that the ancient sages aptly described as Dao.

The analysis of human nature bears directly on ethics and political philosophy. At the ethical level, Wang Bi could not but disagree with He Yan on the issue of the nature of the sage. Rather than seeing the sage as an exceptional individual blessed with an extraordinary qi endowment that effectively renders him a different kind of being, who by nature is unaffected by any differentiated emotions such as pleasure and anger that are inherently partial, as He Yan does, Wang Bi argues that the sage is the same as ordinary men and women in experiencing the full range of emotions.

However, there is one decisive difference between the sage and the common person. While the sage responds to phenomena intellectually and emotionally like everyone else, he is not burdened or enslaved by them because of his “spirit-like perspicacity” (shenming).

If there is a fundamental unity to all beings, it cannot be maintained that a select few are exempted from the rule. Given the premise that all are endowed with a Dao-centered nature, the difference between the sage and the average person cannot be one of kind but only of degree and attainment. Moreover, He Yan’s thesis would rule out the possibility of becoming a sage; indeed, even becoming a “near sage” like Yan Hui would be beyond the reach of most people. As such, how can the sage serve as a source of inspiration and motivation? This may be the main point of contention that sets He Yan and Wang Bi apart.

The sage is not without sorrow and joy; even Confucius, the highest sage, could not but be pleased when he met Yan Hui or be saddened by his untimely passing. Yet, the sage realizes that human emotions are ultimately driven by self-interest. Precisely because of his affective responsiveness, the sage is able to understand and empathize with the needs of the people; but because of his “spirit-like perspicacity”—that is, his heightened spirituality and profound understanding of the nature of things—his mind remains perfectly clear like a polished mirror and unburdened by emotional attachments. It is logically invalid, as Wang astutely observes, to conclude from the absence of attachments to the absence of emotions (Sanguo zhi 28, commentary).

The way to sagehood does not lie in suppressing one’s emotions or in any artificial means, but in abiding by the order of ziran, in staying true to one’s “root,” one’s Dao-centered nature. The “authenticity” of the sage entails that he is naturally simple like “uncarved wood,” which is also to say that he is free from the dictates of desire. In this sense, Wang Bi speaks of the sage as embracing “emptiness and quiescence” (e.g., commentary to Laozi 16), or as having returned to a state of “emptiness and nothingness” (commentary to Laozi 48). In this same sense, Wang asserts in a celebrated dialogue with Pei Hui, another senior intellectual figure at that time, that although Confucius did not speak about wu explicitly, he nonetheless embodied it in his every word and action (Sanguo zhi 28, commentary, and Shishuo xinyu [New Accounts of the Tales of the World] 4.8). The crucial hermeneutical point here is that “it”—“nothingness”—does not refer to any object or substance; once the nature of Dao is understood, the embodiment of wu can only mean the realization of ziran.

This is also how Wang Bi understands the concept of wuwei, often translated as “nonaction,” which figures centrally in the Laozi and appears also in the Lunyu, where it is associated with no less a personage than the sage-king Shun (15.5). Like other central philosophical concepts in the Chinese tradition, the meaning of wuwei is contested and requires careful contextual delineation. In the case of Wang Bi, wuwei serves to bring out the meaning of ziran in practice. Thus, commenting on the claim in Laozi 37 that “Dao is constantly wuwei,” Wang simply states, “This means following ziran.”

As applied to the sage, who is “one” with Dao in the sense that he is always true to his calm and tranquil nature, wuwei manifests itself in a life of guileless simplicity and a profound understanding of the principles governing the Daoist universe. Naturally, the sage dwells in quietude and does not engage in superfluous activity, for which reason the term “wuwei,” which conveys the sense of “not taking action,” is used. It would be inconceivable, for example, to have a true sage indulging in gossip or slander. Moreover, there is a qualitative dimension to wuwei, in that every action of the sage will accord fully with the principles of nature, without any trace of artificiality or arbitrariness. As applied to the common people, wuwei poses an ethical challenge, which demands doing less of the many needless activities that cloud their hearts and minds, corrupt their nature, and in the end only serve to perpetuate the tyranny of desire. To those who aspire to walk in the footsteps of the sages, then, wuwei should be understood as a process of “returning” to one’s “root,” that is to say, a spiritual and ethical journey to recovering one’s pristine Dao-centered nature.

The order of ziran pervades all spheres of life and activity. Ethics and political philosophy, in other words, proceed from the same logical ground. At the sociopolitical level, both the family and the state are seen to have a basis in the natural order of things. Furthermore, just as the mind commands the body, ideally the family and the state should be led by a single sovereign. Given the analysis of Dao as “one” and principle, Wang Bi is thus committed to defending not only the institution of the family and the state, but also the hierarchical structure of sociopolitical relations. In this way, new Daoist insight comes to illuminate concerns typically associated with Confucian philosophy, sweeping aside any partisan obstacles along its path.

In theory, wuwei aims at preserving the order of ziran so that the myriad things and affairs can flourish and attain their proper end. In practice, the politics of wuwei may be contrasted with Legalist policies that emphasize thorough political control through reward and especially punishment. The role of the ruler, like that of the father, entails great responsibility. While wuwei naturally has no room for, say, heavy taxation or excessive conscript labor for war or palace construction, it should not exclude appropriate public works like irrigation or services like caring for the sick. Such action would be deemed in alignment with the perceived order of nature. Obviously, they are not carried out to enhance the ruler’s reputation or interests. The ruler who governs with wuwei may appear to be doing nothing, but in guiding the people to return to their original nature he establishes a firm foundation for great peace. The state would prosper of its own accord, as it were, if only the ruler could remain steadfast in following the way of “emptiness and quiescence.” The logic of nothingness, perhaps unexpectedly, reaches an idealistic end. In sum, as Wang Bi concludes in his shorter essay on the Laozi, the key to the Daoist vision lies in “honoring the root and calming the branches,” which ensures that the people are not alienated from their true nature and thus able to find fulfillment (also see commentary to Laozi 38, 57 and 58).

3. Ji Kang and Ruan Ji: The Ethics of Naturalness

During the second half of the third century, a group of intellectuals, remembered fondly in Chinese sources as the “Seven Worthies of the Bamboo Grove” (zhulin qixian), came to represent the voice of the Learning in the Profound. They are: Ji Kang (223–262, or 224–263), Ruan Ji (210–263), Xiang Xiu (ca. 227–280), Shan Tao (205–283), Liu Ling (ca. 221–300), Wang Rong (234–305), and Ruan Xian (nephew of Ruan Ji, dates unknown but perhaps slightly older than Wang Rong). Although the term “bamboo grove” has a particular Buddhist reference, it probably refers to bamboo fields in or near Ji Kang’s estate in Shanyang (modern Henan province), where the group and their associates gathered in pleasure and friendship. Of the seven, Ji Kang, Ruan Ji, and Xiang Xiu are of particular interest to students of philosophy. The first two will be introduced here.

Ji Kang cuts a striking figure in the history of Chinese philosophy. A brilliant musician and poet, a master of Pure Conversation, an iconoclast and a model of integrity, Ji Kang was the undisputed leader of the Seven Worthies and one of the most influential intellectuals of his age. He was unfortunately caught in the web of power struggles and was sentenced to death. Several thousand students of the imperial academy reportedly petitioned for his release. Before the execution, as traditional sources further relate, Ji remained perfectly composed; as the final hour approached, he asked for a qin (string instrument, commonly translated as zither or lute) and gave a final performance, lamenting only that the tune he played would now die with him (e.g., see Jin shu 49). Later scholars throughout Chinese history who saw themselves as victims of injustice would often draw inspiration from Ji Kang’s courage and integrity.

Ji Kang’s extant writings include a collection of sixty poems, an influential “Rhapsody on the Zither” (Qin fu), and fourteen other essays. The concept of ziran underpins Ji Kang’s version of Neo-Daoism. In agreement with He Yan and Wang Bi, Ji sees an inherent order in the universe. The origin of the Daoist world is to be understood in terms of the transformation of qi. The “original qi,” brimming with creative energy but completely undifferentiated, gave rise to yin and yang, from which heaven and earth, the five dynamic elemental forces (wuxing), and the myriad beings in turn ensued. Boundless but not reducible to any shape or form, the Dao can be described as wu, but in this interpretation, the nothingness of Dao gains meaning from the original oneness of qi. In this respect, Ji Kang seems closer to He Yan than Wang Bi in drawing from the yin-yang cosmological theory, though there is perhaps a stronger religious sensibility that distinguishes Ji’s approach to the profound mystery of Dao.

On the premise that the order of nature issues from the transformation of qi, Ji Kang recognizes that individuals are allotted a qi endowment of varying abundance and purity, which defines their nature and capacity. This explains why some people are blessed with long life or exceptional talents, while others must endure certain natural disadvantages. The fact that one may be gifted in some ways but deficient in others testifies to the presence of different configurations of vital powers informing each person. In an essay titled “Critical Discussion on Intelligence and Courage” (Mingdan lun), Ji Kang thus disputed the assertion that those who possess intelligence or brilliant understanding are sure to have courage. Arising from different determination of qi, Ji says, the two “cannot produce each other.”

While most people are born with a mix of strengths and weaknesses, the logic of ziran allows the possibility of perfect endowment. It follows that sages must be regarded as extraordinary beings animated by the finest qi essence. For the same reason, Ji Kang defended the existence of “immortals,” a popular ideal in religious Daoism, on the understanding that they are similarly informed by the purest form of qi, which precludes any defilement that causes the body and spirit to decay.

So defined, neither sagehood nor immortality can be attained through learning or effort. However, the doctrine of ziran does not necessarily entail a strong determinism or “fatalism” that dismisses all human effort. Immortality may be beyond reach, but as Ji Kang explains in his essay “On Nourishing Life” (Yangsheng lun), self-cultivation can enhance one’s physical and spiritual well-being substantially. Specifically, breathing exercises, special diets and the use of drugs can help maximize the limits of one’s natural endowment, and bring about rejuvenation and long life. Drug use, incidentally, was widespread among the literati in early medieval China. He Yan, for example, is known to have championed a certain drug for its ability to “lift one’s spirit,” and Ji Kang is also reputed to have been a connoisseur in this field. In any case, knowledge of Dao and practice in the art of nourishing life can make a significant difference, even though they may fall short in transforming the person into an “immortal.”

It is important to note, however, that effort directed at nourishing life should always accord with ziran and must not be confused with action that violates the principles of nature. This brings into view Ji Kang’s critique of Confucian norms and rituals, which he considered artificial and restrictive. Ji devoted an essay to refuting the widely held view that people “naturally take to learning.” Learning in the Confucian sense presupposes discipline and does not come naturally to people, whose need to preserve energy predisposes them toward repose.

From this essay, it also becomes clear that the concept of ziran is closely tied to a Daoist philosophy of history, which envisions a process of decline from a pristine beginning of simplicity and wholesome goodness. Echoing the Laozi (Chapter 18), Ji Kang asserts that it is only when the “great Dao” fell into disuse—that is, when selfishness and strife rendered natural, prereflective kindness out of the ordinary—that benevolence and righteousness came to be treasured as acquired, remedial virtues. In this sense, Confucian learning reflects but the loss of naturalness in a world dominated by self-interest.

In another essay, “On Dispelling Self-interest” (Shisi lun), Ji Kang brings out further the ethical implications of ziran. Without self-interest means, at the very least, that one is completely open about one’s feelings and intentions. This does not guarantee moral purity, of course, but it reflects a mind no longer burdened by praise or blame, approval or censure, and other self-regarding concerns. Conversely, veiled motives and hidden feelings invariably involve calculations of cost and benefit that corrupt the mind, even if they are invested in moral ventures. Ideally, in the case of a sage endowed with a perfect nature, complete openness and purity coincide. For the majority, however, self-interest poses an obstacle to realizing ziran. From this perspective, nourishing life thus takes on a deeper ethical meaning. Although breathing exercises and the use of qi-enhancing drugs may be useful, ultimately all such effort must be directed at dispelling self-interest. To dispel self-interest and in this sense attain utmost “emptiness,” it is necessary to confront the root problem of desire.

Desires are harmful to both body and mind, as Ji Kang emphasizes in “On Nourishing Life.” Purity of being, in contrast, entails the absence of desire or any form of emotional disturbance. Are all desires, then, unnatural? The essay drew a sharp response from Xiang Xiu, for whom desire arises naturally from the mind. As such, it cannot be eradicated but only regulated by rules of propriety and ritual action. In reply, Ji Kang points out that although pleasure and anger, and the desire for fame and beauty may stem from the self, like a tumor they only serve to deplete one’s qi. Basic needs are of course not to be denied, but desires are shaped by objects and reflect cognitive distortions that consume the self. To quench one’s thirst, one does not desire to drink the whole river. This is fundamentally different from the desire for power and wealth, which knows no rest. Moreover, the suppression of desire by artificial means may remove certain symptoms, but it does not cure the disease. It is only by recognizing the harmful influences of desire that one begins to seek calmness and emptiness of mind. Ultimately, nourishing life is not just about health and longevity but sets its sight on a higher, and to Ji Kang, more authentic, mode of being characterized by dispassion.

In this connection, Ji Kang’s famous thesis that emotions are foreign to music—or literally, that “sounds do not have [in them] sorrow or joy” (sheng wu ai le)—becomes readily understandable. If desire and the emotions that flow from it are not intrinsic to nature, and since sounds are naturally produced by the vibration of qi energies, it cannot be the case that music embodies sorrow or joy, as classical Confucian musical theory generally assumes. Subjective and cognitive reactions, including the possibility of emotional contagion, in other words, should be distinguished from what is natural and objective; otherwise, Ji argues, one can hardly account for the fact that the same piece of music may evoke different responses in different audiences. On the aesthetic front, this has the effect of opening up the field of aesthetic judgment—for example, music condemned by classical Confucianism as inherently “licentious” could now be reappraised in terms of their musical quality. At the ethical and spiritual level, music can be a powerful aid to nourishing life. This is because music can articulate harmony that would render conditions more favorable for dispelling self-interest. Ji Kang’s work on nourishing life and the nature of music wielded considerable influence among Xuanxue scholars.

Ji Kang is often depicted as a radical iconoclast, who openly challenged the authority of classical models of moral attainment, including Confucius. Compared with He Yan and Wang Bi, he certainly seems less inclined to accommodate Confucian learning and ritual practice in his vision of ziran. It is also true that he was politically frustrated and marginalized. Yet, the emphasis on nourishing life need not imply abandoning the sociopolitical world for a life of reclusive exile. Like Wang Bi, Ji recognizes that the order of ziran encompasses basic social institutions such as the family and the state. In his “Family Admonitions” (Jiajie), he instructed his children to uphold integrity in both private and public life. In an essay devoted to the teachings of government (Taishi zhen), Ji affirmed that rulership has a basis in the principles of nature. Respect for elders and kindness are not contrary to ziran, so long as they do not become deliberate acts with a view to self-gain.

In another essay (Guan Cai lun), Ji Kang attempted to rehabilitate the two nobles of the Zhou dynasty—Lords Guan and Cai—who had been condemned by later historians for their opposition to the Duke of Zhou. Commentators generally agree that the historical discussion serves but as a thin disguise for Ji’s criticism of the regime in power at that time. This is not the work of a man who rejected politics as a matter of principle, but points instead to an engaged intellectual who would stop at nothing to make known the truth as he saw it. In the end, if the order of ziran were allowed to flourish, if desire and self-interest were pacified, and if careful nourishing were applied to remove interference especially of the Confucian and Legalist variety, society would attain peace and harmony of its own accord. Despite the tragic circumstances of his life, Ji Kang proves rather sanguine in his faith in the power of ziran.

Ruan Ji, like Ji Kang, captured the imagination of later generations as a model of authenticity, an intellectual who was completely true to his principles. An outstanding poet and musician, he is also remembered for his daring defiance of the Confucian orthodoxy, at a time when deviation from the norms of tradition could easily be deemed seditious. To his admirers, Ruan Ji was a tragic hero. Well versed in both Confucian and Daoist learning, he was evidently a man of principle who took seriously the calling of an intellectual to bring peace and harmony to the state. Hailing from a distinguished family, he was in a strong position to make a difference in public affairs. The unforgiving realities of third-century Chinese politics, however, soon took its toll on Ruan, who found himself trapped in a world of violence and duplicity. Proud and uncompromising, never a consenting partner in the intercourse of power, Ruan Ji had to endure repeated slander and escaped censure only by finding refuge in an almost constant intoxicated stupor.

Drinking was an important aspect of literati culture. Wine made from a variety of fruits and grains was widely consumed. In Ruan’s case, wine became a means to self-expression as well as a lifeline to preserving his integrity. According to his biography, he avoided a marriage proposal from the de facto ruling house by staying drunk for sixty days (Jin shu 49). Whether this actually happened, or whether he was an alcoholic is not the issue; what emerges from this and other reports is a portrait of a frustrated but sensitive and ardent thinker, whose outrage at an immoral world finds precise expression in “outrageous” opinions and behavior challenging the legitimacy of established practice. Even at his mother’s funeral, Ruan did not stop drinking, an act that patently disregarded the requirement of ritual and resulted in a call for his banishment from the realm. The full significance of the story comes to light when the reader realizes that Ruan was in fact famous for his filial piety. When his mother died, his grief was so intense that he “coughed up blood” and “wasted away” for a long time.

Although Ruan Ji was unable to escape from the world of power, he took every opportunity to assert his free and indomitable spirit. Rituals and convention were not meant for him, as he announced boldly, in response to a charge that he had contravened the rules of propriety in seeing his sister-in-law off on a journey. So disgusted with and disdainful of the shallow men of high society, Ruan would literally “eye” his visitors in different ways—gleaming with adoration and pleasure when they were to his taste, or rolling his eyes superciliously when the company was deemed foul. This did not earn him too many friends at court, but it certainly enhanced his reputation as a leader of the Seven Worthies of the Bamboo Grove.

Ruan Ji left behind a large number of poems and several essays. An early work is entitled “Disquisition on Music” (Yue lun), in which he discusses along Confucian lines the function of music in bringing about harmony. Like most Neo-Daoist intellectuals, Ruan believed that the teaching of Confucius had been distorted by later scholars who under the banner of Confucianism sought merely to further their own gain. Confucius was only concerned with the Dao. The writings of Confucius and other sages sought to bring to light but one Daoist truth. Ruan Ji devoted an essay each to the Yijing, the Laozi, and the Zhuangzi. While the essay on the Yijing dates probably to his youth, and that on the Laozi survives only in fragments, the Da Zhuang lun (Critical Discussion on the Full Meaning of the Zhuangzi) reflects Ruan’s mature thinking. Equally important is his famous poetic essay, the “Biography of Master Great Man” (Daren xiansheng zhuan), in which he takes aim at the corrupt ways of the world and invokes an image of Daoist transcendence, a biting contrast that is rendered all the more powerful in the light of his own predicament.

Like Ji Kang, Ruan Ji focuses on the concept of ziran, naturalness, in his reformulation of Daoist philosophy. Commenting on the Laozi, Ruan makes clear that the concept of Dao should be understood as the “self-so” source of the processes of change and transformation. Whereas the Laozi calls it Dao, the Yijing describes it as the “Great Ultimate” (taiji), and the Spring and Autumn Annals, the “Origin” (yuan). Or, as Ruan writes in his essay on the Zhuangzi, “heaven and earth are born of ziran, and the myriad beings are born of heaven and earth.” There is “nothing outside” (wuwai) the world of ziran, Ruan adds, which is to say that the Dao should not be mistaken for any metaphysical agent or entity. Rather, the theory of naturalness suggests that heaven and earth and everything within it originate from one qi. All phenomena are constituted by qi; as such, according to Ruan, Zhuangzi is surely right in maintaining that “the myriad beings are but one body” (Zhuangzi, Chapter 5).

The plenitude of nature reflects the inexhaustible resourcefulness of the Dao. Moreover, phenomena conform to constant principles and function in harmony. In his Zhuangzi essay, Ruan details in traditional cosmological terms how the original qi differentiates into yin and yang, the two basic forms of vital forces or energies that not only shape but continue to govern the phenomenal world. Male and female, the hot and the cold, light and darkness, and other yin-yang correlates underpin the structural order of the Daoist universe. The movement of the sun and the moon, the regularity of the seasons, the operation of wind and rain, and other natural processes disclose further a dynamic regime of self-regulating change and renewal. In this way, an inherent order is shown to lie at the heart of ziran. As in Ji Kang’s analysis, this forms the basis of an ethics of naturalness.

The ideal sage, of course, embodies naturalness in his entire being. This presupposes a profound understanding of what the Zhuangzi calls the “equality of things,” now explained by Ruan Ji in terms of the oneness of qi. Life and death, fortune and misfortune, and other seemingly unbridgeable divides form but moments in the same continuum of natural transformation. The sage, accordingly, regards them as one. Distinctions, in the sense of value discrimination, can thus no longer be maintained. Whether this entails a mystical union with nature remains a question. Ruan’s poetic eloquence, especially in the “Biography of Master Great Man,” often appears to rise to mystical heights. Nevertheless, the more important point seems to be that the sage recognizes the centrality of emptiness and quiescence in a life of ziran.

Devoid of self-interest, unmoved by riches and power, completely at ease with his own nature and the natural order of things at large, the sage attains freedom and in this sense, “transcendence.” In contrast, as “Master Great Man” denounces, the learned “gentlemen” of polite society are no better than the lice that dwell in one’s pants. Hiding deep in the recesses of tradition, they dare not move against ritual and dread any threat to the status quo. When hungry, they feast parasitically on the people. There is ample evidence that Ruan Ji regarded the teachings of the Confucian tradition at that time to be deficient and detrimental to the project of naturalness.

More precisely, Ruan’s theory of ziran envisages an inner spirituality that must be protected from the corrupting influence of power and desire. There is a wholesome sincerity and innocence to natural affective expressions. When desire for gain is allowed to dominate, however, what is spontaneous mutates into hidden designs and false appearances. For this reason, complete openness ranks high on Ruan’s ethical agenda. In a world dominated by small-minded “gentlemen,” where sincerity of feeling is judged a threat to the establishment, an ethics of naturalness inevitably finds itself engaged in a struggle for freedom.

Later Xuanxue scholars took great pleasure in recounting how despite venomous opposition, Ruan Ji had persisted in his unorthodox ways. For example, we are told that he frequented a neighbor’s place for wine and the company of the latter’s wife. When he got drunk, he would fall asleep next to her. Understandably suspicious at first, the husband nonetheless found Ruan completely innocent, honorable and above reproach in both intention and act. In this, we see how moral character is traced to naturalness. Another neighbor had a talented and beautiful daughter who unfortunately died young. Although Ruan did not know the family, he went all the same to her funeral and cried with total abandon. Whether in these or other accounts, the point is always that whereas rituals and taboos stifle and corrupt the self, naturalness promises liberation and a return to authenticity.

Does not the open display of emotions contradict the emphasis on “emptiness”? He Yan, for example, had argued that sages do not experience pleasure and anger, or sorrow and joy. However, as this view entails that sages must be regarded as ontologically distinct from ordinary human beings and that sagehood is beyond the reach of self-cultivation, not all Xuanxue scholars would be amenable to it. As we have seen, Wang Bi had countered that “emptiness” need not suggest the absence of emotion, but rather an enlightened mode of being not bound by emotional or other attachments. These arguments would have been known to Ruan Ji. Given Ruan’s emphasis on authenticity, he would be concerned to show that genuine affective responses flowing from a pure heart empty of selfish desire belong integrally to the ideal ethical life.

In the Da Zhuang lun, Ruan Ji describes the sage as a “person of ultimate attainment” (zhiren), whose profound understanding of the “equality” of things in the order of ziran naturally expresses itself in a simple yet fulfilled life. On a larger scale, this should translate into a peaceful and harmonious society. If nature had yielded an originally pristine order, how did it come to be infested with an army of “lice”? Ruan Ji provides a startling response in his “Biography of Master Great Man.”

At the “beginning,” when yin and yang naturally took their course, when domination and deceit were yet unknown, all under heaven indeed lived in perfect harmony. There were neither rulers nor ministers, and yet order prevailed of its own accord. When rulership was established, Ruan goes on to say, domination arose; when ministers were appointed, conflict and deceit also came into the world. It is not entirely clear why or how kingship came to be established, but judging from Ruan’s essay on the Zhuangzi, much of the blame lies with subjective discrimination. When natural distinctions (e.g., differences in size) became value markers (e.g., that big is “better” than small), desire and domination already began to cloud the true picture.

In elevating naturalness above all manmade institutions, Ruan Ji thus found a place for anarchism, which is rarely entertained in the whole of Chinese philosophy. During the fourth century, perhaps reflecting the political turbulence of the period, another thinker by the name of Bao Jingyan did take up the same theme in an essay entitled “Disquisition on Not Having Rulers” (Wu jun lun). Although the work has not survived, it was criticized by Ge Hong (ca. 283–363) in his Baopuzi (The Master Who Embraces Simplicity). According to Ge Hong, Bao was an avid reader of the Laozi and the Zhuangzi and was adept in the art of disputation. The main thesis of his work is that rulership is but a form of domination that violates naturalness. Nevertheless, anarchism did not find strong support in Neo-Daoism. In fact, the majority of Xuanxue scholars may be said to have espoused fairly “conservative” political ideals. He Yan and Wang Bi, for example, had little difficulty justifying absolute monarchical rule, provided that it coincides with ziran and “nonaction.”

While the critique of government is clear, Ruan Ji was certainly not plotting to overthrow it. Such scheming would be inimical to the goal of naturalness. Does it entail renunciation, a complete severing from the political world? Ruan Ji is commonly depicted as a frustrated intellectual yearning for a life free of deception and untainted by power relations. Indeed, one suggestion is that whereas Ruan in his early writings had accorded a positive place to ritual and music as the work of the ancient sages to maintain harmony in the world, in his later years he became totally disillusioned and turned to escapism.

This view is unhelpful, because it undermines the possibility of renewal in the philosophy of ziran. The ethics of naturalness is not about renunciation. The sages of old were all concerned with diminishing the power of desire, so as to enable the people to live well and prosper. From this perspective, the Daoist recluse furnishes a powerful symbol because he abides by ziran and not because he refuses to have anything to do with the world. Similarly, the “Great Man” does not aspire to a life of freedom to realize his own ambition, but rather to initiate a process of healing that would revitalize the rule of the Dao, envisioned as a kind of wholesome cooperative community. If naturalness has any restorative power at all, disengagement should have little role to play in Neo-Daoist ethics.

4. Guo Xiang: Nature, Destiny, and Self-Realization

A generation or so after He Yan, Wang Bi and the Seven Worthies of the Bamboo Grove, Guo Xiang (d. 312) arrived on the Xuanxue scene. Accomplished in philosophical debate and other forms of cultured discourse, he was highly regarded by his contemporaries as a new Xuanxue champion “second only to Wang Bi,” whose philosophical prowess had by then acquired legendary proportions. Guo Xiang is by far the most important interpreter of the Zhuangzi in Chinese history. Through his effort, indeed, the Zhuangzi has come down to us in its present form, divided into thirty-three chapters. Yet, Guo Xiang has also been accused of no less an intellectual offense than plagiarism.

As early as the fifth century, the charge was made that Guo had plagiarized the work of Xiang Xiu, a close friend of Ji Kang and fellow member of the Seven Worthies of the Bamboo Grove. Xiang Xiu is primarily noted for his work on the Zhuangzi, though he is also known to have written a commentary to the Yijing. According to the Shishuo xinyu (4.17), “Initially, there were scores of Zhuangzi commentators, but none could grasp its meaning and essential teachings. Xiang Xiu then went beyond the old commentaries to interpret the Zhuangzi [afresh]. His explanation was subtle and penetrating, which greatly advanced the cause of the [Learning in the] Profound.” Xiang Xiu’s commentary was incomplete, as the text goes on to relate, and Guo Xiang later “stole” it as his own.

This is a harsh judgment on Guo Xiang. The biography of Xiang Xiu in the Jin shu (Chapter 49) recounts only that Guo Xiang had “extended” the former’s work. Although Guo was undoubtedly influenced by Xiang Xiu, whose work survives only in the form of quotations preserved in later sources, recent scholarship generally agrees that Guo had drawn his own conclusions. Seeking to reconcile the yearning for freedom and transcendence with sociopolitical engagement, Guo Xiang fuses together in his Zhuangzi commentary ontological and ethical insights. It is worth noting that despite the extremely unstable political conditions that plagued the early Jin dynasty, and the fact that Guo had come from a relatively humble background, he enjoyed a long and distinguished public career. Besides the Zhuangzi, Guo also wrote on the Laozi and the Lunyu, although these are no longer extant except for a few fragments cited in other sources.

Like Wang Bi, Guo Xiang recognizes the ontological import of Daoist philosophy. There is no disagreement that all beings originate from Dao. However, Guo takes issue with the view that the key to unlocking the mystery of Dao lies in the concept of wu, nothingness. This is because nothingness remains an abstraction, a negation signifying what being is not in Wang Bi’s interpretation, and as such cannot bring about creation. So defined, wu and the category of beings (you) are mutually exclusive; as Guo plainly states, “It is not only that wu cannot change into being but also that being cannot change into wu” [in the abstract sense of nonbeing] (commentary to Zhuangzi 22).

The appeal to a divine creator should indeed be rejected, but this does not entail a nihilistic absence. Having disposed of these options, what does Guo Xiang have to offer in their place? He writes, “Because wu [by definition] is not being, it cannot produce being. Prior to the coming to be of being, it cannot produce other beings. In that case, then, who or what brought about the birth of being? [The answer can only be that] beings are spontaneously self-generated” (commentary to Zhuangzi 2).

Xuanxue studies are fond of contrasting Wang Bi’s emphasis on wu with Guo Xiang’s focus on being. However, what is more critical is how Guo Xiang arrives at his conclusion. Certainly, the mystery of creation cannot be resolved by positing an objectified, transcendent Dao. But, this does not warrant a flight to nothingness, which as a conceptual device cannot be an agent of real production and change. To Guo Xiang, then, the only logical alternative would be to recognize the reality of spontaneous “self-production” (zi sheng) and “self-transformation” (zi hua or du hua). These ideas are already present in Xiang Xiu’s commentary to the Zhuangzi, but in the hands of Guo Xiang, there is now fuller disclosure of the perceived deeper philosophical meaning of ziran.

At the most basic ontological level, prior to the birth of the myriad beings, being is “so of itself,” which implies that being exists eternally. In Guo’s own words, “Generally, we may know the causes of certain things and affairs near to us. But tracing their origin to the ultimate end, we find that without any cause, they of themselves come to be what they are. Being so of themselves, we can no longer question the reason or cause of their being, but should accept them as they are” (commentary to Zhuangzi 14). In this sense, “self-production” or “self-transformation” does not quite explain “how” being came into existence; instead, it offers a logical alternative, which bypasses the philosophical problems associated with both a pure negation and the positing of a particular causal agent. At the epistemological level, the further implication is that self-transformation remains a mystery. Far from being a source of perplexities, to Guo Xiang, this frees and reorients the mind to realize the nature of Dao and a life of ziran.

The doctrine of self-transformation, for which Guo is particularly remembered, affirms that the Dao is everywhere and in all things. The logic of immanence takes full effect, once nothingness is removed from view. Even in the most base and lowly, as the Zhuangzi emphasizes, the presence of Dao can be detected (Chapter 22). To Guo Xiang, the Zhuangzi can only be alluding to the pervasiveness of qi.

All beings are endowed with a “share” or allotment (fen) of qi, the inexhaustible power of the Dao, which gives them life and determines their nature and capacity. Moreover, the order of nature depicts not a state of random disorder, but an organized regime in which all parts have a role to play. With respect to human beings, for example, the body functions harmoniously as a unified whole in accordance with specific principles (li). Without undermining the interdependence of the multitude of organs, there is a hierarchical structure to the workings of the body, where the mind assumes sovereign control. In these respects, guided by the concepts of qi and principle, Guo Xiang follows the mainstream Neo-Daoist analysis of ziran.

Given that individuals enjoy a particular “share” of the Dao, differences in natural endowment should be recognized. For example, due to the different allotment of qi, some people are born with a high degree of intelligence or gifted in other ways. Because everything is what it is “so of itself,” Guo Xiang must admit that “what one is born with is not something that is undue or inappropriate” (commentary to Zhuangzi 5). Because one’s nature is determined by exact principles, one may also speak of destiny in this connection. Is Guo, then, committed to a kind of thoroughgoing fatalism? Does this entail a rigid system in which individuals merely conform to prescribed roles?

It is a matter of destiny or “fate” that one is born of sage character, average capacity, or disadvantaged. In all cases, Guo maintains that one ought to accept one’s natural endowment. Extending a naturalistic reading to an old religious concept, this is in Guo’s estimation what is meant by the “mandate of heaven” (tianming). As it cannot be disputed that there are individuals who are blessed with an exceptionally rich qi endowment, there is thus some truth to the view held by He Yan and others that sageness is defined by an inborn sage nature. Yet, is it the case that sagehood is restricted to a select few? Guo is also concerned to distinguish destiny as fact from value, and to make room for change and development in human flourishing.

Differences based on endowment do not constitute any basis for value judgment. This is central to Guo’s overall argument and is reminiscent of Ruan Ji’s view of naturalness in some respects. As the Zhuangzi repeatedly argues, what needs to be recognized is the “equality of things.” Equality is not to be confused with sameness. In this context, equality suggests that all beings are partners in the larger architecture of Dao. Being gifted does not necessarily make one “better”; even a physically or mentally handicapped person is “complete” in his or her own way. Differences among individuals are undeniable, but they do not legitimize prejudice or discrimination.

At the sociopolitical level, human relationships are also governed by constant principles; like different parts of the body, individuals have their proper place in the social and political assembly. From this perspective, as opposed to conventional arrangements that can be changed or discarded at will, both the family and the state should be understood as expressions of ziran.

Furthermore, in view of the hierarchical order of nature, Guo does not hesitate to say that the father should be the head of the family, and that the state should be ruled by the king. This would rule out anarchism. In this regard, while Guo Xiang and Ruan Ji agree on the centrality of naturalness, they come to very different conclusions on the ideal structure of the state. What needs to be made clear is that the necessary gradation of authority for different roles and responsibilities that comes with a hierarchical system does not warrant any form of authoritarian government that oppresses the people. The father may be the authoritative figure in the family, but he would not be in that position if not for his children. As “children” of the Dao, all beings are indispensable and occupy an equally important station in the order of ziran.

Whereas scholars such as Wang Bi emphasize unity over multiplicity, Guo Xiang underscores the richness and diversity of the Daoist world. Individuality is not sacrificed for political interests, or dissolved into a sea of metaphysical oneness. On the contrary, as Guo forcefully argues, there is no greater calamity than the loss of individuality and authenticity, of one’s identity as endowed by nature (commentary to Zhuangzi 10). Conversely, the Daoist goal can be defined as the realization of one’s nature, and particularly the optimization of one’s inborn capacity. As nature blossoms, destiny is fulfilled.

While this may not be able to detract entirely from the charge of fatalism, Guo Xiang does aim to introduce a dynamic view of nature and destiny. It also opens up a deeper dimension to the notion of sagehood. The Daoist world is never static; it changes and renews itself constantly. The mountain or ocean may appear unchanging, but it is perpetually in flux. This is mirrored in human existence, where individuals grow with the passage of time (commentary to Zhuangzi 6). Although constituted by qi and regulated by principles, individuals and societies need not be viewed as fixed assets without possibility of change and development. Indeed, while the order of nature must be respected, the person of Dao recognizes the inevitability of change. The sage nourishes his nature and adapts constantly to changes in the social and natural environment. This, as Guo Xiang sees it, brings out the real meaning of Daoist nonaction (wuwei).

Nonaction “does not mean folding one’s arms and keeping quiet,” as Guo makes explicit what most Xuanxue scholars implicitly acknowledge (commentary to Zhuangzi 11). It is also not a technical skill, requiring special training or discipline. In Guo Xiang’s interpretation, nonaction stems from a profound discernment of the way of naturalness, which entails not so much doing less of certain things, as a mode of being and spirit of action guided by the principles of nature, according to which one performs all functions.

There are two aspects to Guo’s understanding of wuwei. First, as things and affairs are informed by principles, there is a natural way of action and interaction. Like the fabulous Cook Ding (Zhuangzi 3) who could cut up an ox without having to rely on sensory perception or mental calculation, and just as spontaneous affection characterizes the parent-child relation, the sage accomplishes all tasks by simply following the “grain” or nature of phenomena.

Second, in the light of the equality of things, nonaction ideally leads to a sense of freedom and equanimity. Instead of chasing after false ideals, trying to be like someone else, and ending up a prisoner of restless striving and deceit, one should stay true to oneself and develop one’s nature. If self-sufficiency is assumed, there is no point in imitating others, including those blessed with a special qi endowment; to do so, indeed, as Guo Xiang puts it, would be like a fish’s aspiring to become a bird (commentary to Zhuangzi 2).

This is important and marks Guo’s originality. Nonaction cannot be divorced from naturalness or reserved for those with an inborn sage nature alone. What is required of self-fulfillment has already been given; to clamor after what is foreign to one’s genuine “share” of the Dao is not only futile but also self-negating. If this is true, the very idea of sageness needs to be reconsidered.

Again, it should be recognized that there are those who embody a special sage nature—they are like “pines and cypresses,” which are the finest of trees (commentary to Zhuangzi 5)—but more fundamentally, as Guo Xiang explains, the term “sage” designates those who have realized their nature (commentary to Zhuangzi 1). This effectively removes any barrier to attaining sagehood. Thus, while Guo agrees with He Yan in recognizing the decisive difference of qi endowment, he is also able to address Wang Bi’s objection, discussed earlier, and offer an alternative avenue to realizing great peace.

Against helplessness and passive resignation, Guo Xiang calls for a constructive celebration of individuality and the plenitude of the Daoist world. Free from the hold of desire and the ceaseless undulation of discontent, one reaps an inner calm and grows at ease with the external world. Even death loses its fearsome grip, for one realizes that life and death are equally a part of the transformation of nature. The person of Dao does not need to live in reclusion or shun politics. In fact, any deliberate disavowal of communal life would violate the spirit of naturalness. The important point is that “although the sage [in the broad sense of someone who has realized his true nature] finds himself in the halls of ritual and government, his mind is not different from when he is surrounded by mountains and trees” (commentary to Zhuangzi 1). Beyond the sway of the emotions, the sage roams the world without being moved or enslaved by it. This, to Guo Xiang, truly captures the essence of “carefree wandering,” which is now shown to have a place in mundane activities.

Politically, the ruler should also abide by naturalness and nonaction. This means, besides self-cultivation, allowing and encouraging the people to develop their nature and capacity to the fullest. Thus, artificial restrictions and interference should be minimized. Official appointments, moreover, must be made on the basis of capacity and not by family background, as was commonly the case in Guo’s China. In return, as Guo confidently predicts, ministers and subjects would naturally fulfill their duties, and all under heaven would live in peace and contentment. As needs and circumstances change, social and political practice should not be fossilized. Timely adjustments would help ensure renewal and harmony in a dynamic realm.

5. Capacity and Nature, Words and Meaning, and the Debate on Naturalness

From He Yan and Wang Bi to the Seven Worthies of the Bamboo Grove and Guo Xiang, the main contours of Neo-Daoism can be discerned. Sharing the same philosophical vocabulary and reacting to a common heritage, the proponents of the new Learning in the Profound may appear to be speaking with a single voice. On closer examination, it becomes apparent that they seek in their own way to make sense of the mystery of Dao. Friendship and patronage do play an important role in early medieval Chinese literati culture, but they do not diminish the premium placed on intellectual independence, rigor, and originality. This is best reflected in the many debates that populate the world of Neo-Daoist learning.

The view of He Yan that the sage is by nature absolutely impartial, above the fray of the emotions, attracted a great deal of attention at that time. The Sanguo zhi (Chapter 28, commentary), for example, reports that Zhong Hui (225–264), who rivaled Wang Bi as one of the brightest intellectual stars of the age, and others all elaborated on it. Wang Bi, as we have seen, put forward a dissenting view, which on the basis of a particular logic of nothingness grounds the possibility of sagehood in an original nature untainted by cognitive distortions and affective disturbances. Later, Guo Xiang sought a new resolution by aligning sagehood with self-realization. The role of the emotions and the natural differences based on qi endowment may be admitted, but in the being of the sage the burden of value attachment that they bring has been totally “forgotten” or lifted in the light of the equality of things (e.g., see Guo Xiang, commentary to Zhuangzi 2). Bearing directly on the question of sagehood is the larger debate on the relationship between a person’s capacity and nature.

Although it is generally agreed that nature is inborn and formed by qi energies, whether it is solely responsible for a person’s capacity, be it intellectual, physical, psychological or moral, remains an issue. This is important not only because it concerns the nature of sagehood, whether it is an attainable goal or determined by an essential sage nature, but also because the right talent must be identified for public office. A late second-century or early third-century work by Liu Shao, the Renwu zhi (translated into English as The Study of Human Abilities) has already broached the question and attempted to map out the various types of talent and the signs by which they might be identified. This developed into a major debate, on which Zhong Hui composed a treatise called “On the Four Roots of Capacity and Nature” (Caixing siben lun).

Zhong’s work has not survived, but it is widely reported that the debate involved four distinct positions—namely, that capacity and nature are “identical” (tong); that they are “different” (yi); that they “coincide” (he); and that they “diverge” (li) from each other.

The first view is represented by Fu Jia (also pronounced Fu Gu, 209–255), who emerged as a major policy maker during the Wei-Jin transition. On this account, both nature and capacity are determined by one’s qi endowment. Whereas nature is the inner substance, capacity reaches outward in functional ability and conduct. This view finds eloquent support in another third-century work, the “Disquisition on Capacity and Nature” (Caixing lun) by Yuan Zhun, who was on good terms with Ruan Ji. According to Yuan, beings can be either excellent or of a poor quality. Whereas the former are endowed with “pure qi,” the latter are constituted by energies of a more “turbid” composition. It is like a piece of wood, Yuan adds; whether it is crooked or straight is a matter of nature, on the basis of which it has a certain capacity that can be made to serve particular ends.

The second is represented by Li Feng (d. 254), according to whom Fu Jia had misconstrued the relationship between capacity and nature. This is because whereas nature is inborn, capacity is shaped by learning. What nature provides is simply the biological apparatus or faculties that enable a person to grow and to learn; the person one becomes, in contrast, is the result of learning and putting into practice the teaching of the sages. Any accomplishment, including the attainment of sagehood, ultimately depends on effort. Yu Huan, a noted third-century historian, provides a helpful analogy to explain the point—the effect of learning on a person, he says, is like adding color to a piece of plain silk (Sanguo zhi 13, commentary).

Zhong Hui himself held the third view, which attempts to mediate between the first two positions. Although native endowment is necessary for realized capacity, it is not sufficient. What is endowed, in other words, marks a person’s potential, which must be carefully nurtured and brought to fruition. For sages and immortals, who are different in kind because of their exceptional qi constitution, innate capacity naturally manifests itself completely in extraordinary achievements. For ordinary human beings, however, nature does not amount to actual ability but only furnishes certain aptitude, dispositions or directions of development. Of course, if the native endowment is extremely poor, there is not much that can be done. Nevertheless, the real challenge to Fu Jia’s identity thesis is that an excellent endowment may go to waste because the person succumbs to desire and would not learn.

Finally, Wang Guang (d. 251) argued for the last position, which is stronger than Li Feng’s and appears to be directed especially against Zhong Hui’s modified identity thesis. Inborn nature does not provide the necessary fertile ground for cultivation; rather, it needs to be rectified by learning. Human beings are inherently driven by desire and therefore must rely on rituals and instruction to become responsible individuals. In this sense, capacity and nature do not coincide but diverge from each other.

It has been suggested that the debate should be understood in the context of the power struggle between the main rival factions in Wei politics. Specifically, Fu Jia and Zhong Hui both sided with the faction that was to emerge victorious and strike down Li Feng and Wang Guang. Political affiliation, like patronage, is certainly important, but it does not dictate philosophical opinion in Neo-Daoism. He Yan, for example, would favor Fu Jia’s identity thesis, given his understanding of human nature, despite the fact that the latter had criticized him openly. Similarly, Ji Kang would find Zhong Hui’s attempt to accommodate learning and effort agreeable, even though he had rejected Zhong’s overtures to befriend him and in the end was put to death at Zhong’s instigation.

Another key debate in Neo-Daoist philosophy concerns the relationship between “words” (yan) and “meaning” (yi). The debate has its roots in the Yijing, where Confucius is made to ask whether words can fully disclose meaning. This goes beyond the interpretation of any one work, but probes the nature of understanding itself. As common experience seems to suggest, words often fail to express intense emotions or complex ideas. A minority view, represented by the late third-century thinker Ouyang Jian, defended the thesis that meaning is completely “exhausted” or expressed by words (yan jin yi). The majority of Xuanxue scholars, however, regarded words as necessary but insufficient to understanding.

A spokesman for the position that “words cannot fully express meaning” (yan bu jin yi) was Xun Can (ca. 212–240), who gained considerable notoriety for his claim that the classics were but the “chaff” of the sages’ profound learning. The conclusion is inescapable, according to Xun, for meaning transcends the limiting confines of language. Wang Bi supplies a fuller and more nuanced argument. Although meaning is mediated by words and images, the means of interpretation must not be confused with the end itself. Words can in fact become an obstacle to understanding if they are made the focus of interpretation. Citing the Zhuangzi, Wang maintains that the words and images that make up a text must be “forgotten” before its meaning can be comprehended. To understand a poem, for example, it is not enough to assemble an exhaustive list of definitions. The words are “forgotten” or left behind in the sense that understanding reaches into the underlying world of ideas where a deeper meaning resides. Guo Xiang also makes clear that although ideas issue from words, they cannot be reduced to their literal, surface meaning. This is especially important to understanding the Zhuangzi, which employs a large number of parables and metaphors, often involving spiritual figures or supernatural exploits. Taken literally, they verge on the fantastic; understood properly, they intimate the wonder of the Dao and the order of ziran.

This diverges sharply from the Han hermeneutical model, which typically on the basis of a kind of correspondence theory assumes that words have fixed meanings located in external referents. Specifically, under the dominance of yin-yang theories, the classics were seen to refer to particular cosmological phenomena. For example, Han commentators commonly took the word “one” to mean the pole star. In contrast, Neo-Daoist writings show little interest in cosmological speculation. This does not mean that the authors had abandoned the yin-yang cosmology; rather, they took the classics to be concerned with issues more profound than naming the various components of the cosmos. A poem may depict actual objects or events; but sense is not limited to reference, and the meaning of the whole transcends the identity of its parts. From a new hermeneutical perspective, proponents of Xuanxue thus endeavor to reverse an “outward” interpretive course to return to the “roots”; that is to say, to recapture the perceived core teachings of the sages. This may suggest direct illumination or intuition, a sudden apprehension of meaning. However, it should be remembered that all the major Neo-Daoists discussed here excelled in the art of argumentation, which is to say that there is no substitute for careful philosophical analysis. Once the chain of references is broken, once the hermeneutical perspective is altered, interpretation is free to pursue the deeper meaning of the “dark” and profound, which in the final analysis is what Xuanxue is all about.

From a broader perspective, given the dissatisfaction with Han Confucianism, many of the debates in Xuanxue revolve around the relationship between “orthodox teachings” (mingjiao)—the normative “naming” (ming) that determines standards and values—and ziran. Both offer an idealized picture of the world, an imagined state in which order and harmony prevailed and to which the troubled world of the present must seek to return. Does the former, bound by doctrines of propriety, rituals, and government, oppose naturalness and thwart all aspiration toward a life of “carefree wandering”? The debate on “nourishing life,” for example, reflects this concern. Two main approaches may be distinguished, whose impact far exceeds the quiet preserves of the philosophers’ “bamboo grove,” to spark new trends in both politics and culture.

For Wang Bi, it is clear that government and society should ideally conform to the principles of ziran, as they stem from the same “root.” Guo Xiang is even more specific in arguing that the norms and rites that define civilization are not alien to ziran but in principle flow spontaneously from it. The natural bond between mother and child, for example, attests to the inherent harmony between ideal mingjiao and ziran. Although decay and corruption may have set in, the ethics of naturalness does not seek to escape from the roles and responsibilities of sociopolitical life.

To Wang Bi, it is imperative that the ruler and those in power “return” to “emptiness and quiescence,” in which state the right policies would naturally prevail, resulting in peace and abundance, and more importantly, simplicity, genuineness and contentment. To Guo Xiang, the hierarchical structure of society need not be oppressive, for each and every person is “equal” and self-sufficient, which enables an inner transcendence that is the mark of authenticity and the full realization of one’s nature and capacity.

Differences in interpretation notwithstanding, Wang Bi and Guo Xiang converge in recognizing the place of certain basic normative patterns and principles in the order of nature, and the need to ensure that they do not deviate from it. This is the first main approach to the debate between mingjiao and ziran. It is perhaps not incorrect to speak of their having brought together Confucian and Daoist concerns, inasmuch as Confucianism pays special attention to propriety and government, whereas Daoism focuses on naturalness. The same may be said for Xiang Xiu, who wrote an essay entitled “On Confucianism and Daoism” (Ru Dao lun) in his youth. Although he apparently discarded it and we have no knowledge of its content, the famous poet Xie Lingyun (385–433) later spoke of Xiang Xiu as having treated “Confucianism and Daoism as one.” Nevertheless, Xuanxue is not a kind of scholasticism that pitches one school against another. Instead of seeing them as attempting to reconcile Confucianism with Daoism, it may be suggested that they were primarily concerned with the substantive issue of the relationship between mingjiao and ziran.

Ji Kang and Ruan Ji took the stronger view that the then prevalent orthodox teachings impinged on naturalness. The burden of worldly striving, ultimately driven by desire, has become so great that it would not be possible to maintain an inner purity and transcendence while following the norms and rites of society and tradition. Genuine freedom is possible only if one goes beyond the strictures of normative orthodox teachings and aligns oneself completely with ziran, as Ji Kang boldly asserts in “On Dispelling Self-interest.” Going beyond mingjiao does not mean leaving the world behind in this context; again, the point is not renunciation, but radical change, by reorienting one’s sense of propriety and value. This not only invites philosophical debate but also gives impetus to an avant-garde counter-culture development, which adds a tinge of romanticism to the Xuanxue movement.

As the idea of naturalness gained currency, many prominent men of letters came to appreciate strong emotions as a sign of authenticity. Thus, Wang Rong, the youngest member of the Seven Worthies of the Bamboo Grove, did not try to contain his grief in accordance with the requirement of ritual when his son died. The sage may be oblivious to the call of the emotions, he explains, and men of inferior nature are incapable of experiencing true affection; “it is precisely in people like us that the deepest and most intense emotions find their place” (Shishuo xinyu 17.4). Although there is some dispute whether these words should be attributed to Wang Rong or his cousin, Wang Yan, the point remains that naked emotions had come to be cherished as a Neo-Daoist ideal. In the same spirit, Xun Can was devastated by the death of his wife. In response to Fu Jia’s criticism that he was overreacting, Xun simply lamented that it would be difficult to find again a woman of true beauty. His grief was so intense, we are told, that he died shortly after at the age of twenty-eight (Sanguo zhi 10, commentary; cf. Shishuo xinyu 35.2).

The unaffected display of emotion often came into conflict with the code of conduct sanctioned by orthodox teachings. Ruan Ji was criticized on several occasions for his unorthodox behavior. These accounts, more than a record of events, serve to underscore the vast divide that separates an idealized naturalness from the artificial and often hypocritical observance of orthodox customs in early medieval China. Once unconventional behavior is seen to express naturalness and authenticity, it is perhaps inevitable that more radical gestures would come to create a colorful but nonetheless extremely slippery slope. For example, Liu Ling, another member of the Seven Worthies, is well known for his fondness for wine. Never without a bottle in hand, when travelling he would ask an attendant to carry a shovel, so that he could be buried on the spot should he die from a bout of drunkenness (Jin shu 49). Answering his critics, who found him naked, drinking with abandon in his house, Liu said, “I take heaven and earth to be my dwelling, and my rooms are my coat and pants; so what are you gentlemen doing in my pants?” (Shishuo xinyu 23.6)

As Pure Conversation and Xuanxue culture captivated high society, many literati were quick to imitate such behavior. It became fashionable to give free rein to one’s impulses, and many had hoped to acquire a reputation as a high-minded intellectual of pure character and lofty ideals by opposing established norms and rituals. Whether this represents a deterioration of Neo-Daoism need not concern us. The point to note is that serious implications follow from a philosophy of ziran. Of course, there were Neo-Daoists who objected to this trend. For example, Yue Guang (252–304)—whom Wang Rong, Wang Yan, and other leading scholars praised as a rare talent capable of taking Xuanxue to new heights—was obviously unimpressed by the extent to which many of his contemporaries had gone in search of a “carefree” life. “In mingjiao itself there is a blissful abode,” he asks, “so why go to such extremes?” (Jin shu 43)

6. Concluding Remarks

In the early fourth century, the Jin dynasty was forced to flee its capital and to rebuild in south China. As the literati settled in a new land, they looked back to the time of He Yan and Wang Bi as the golden age of Xuanxue. Although Pure Conversation continued with undiminished rigor, it did not introduce many new ideas. In the southern court, the senior statesman Wang Dao (276–339) is reported to have said that he would only talk about “nourishing life,” “words and meaning,” and Ji Kang’s theory of music (Shishuo xinyu 4.21). Throughout the Jin period and beyond, as another early source relates, whether “sounds do not have sorrow or joy” and the “four roots of capacity and nature” remained the stuff of philosophical discussion (Nan Qi shu [History of the Southern Qi Dynasty] 33).

As Neo-Daoism entered its last phase, another Daoist work, the Liezi, came to rival the “Three Great Works on the Profound.” Zhang Zhan (ca. 330–400) wrote an important commentary on the work—indeed, some would argue that Zhang had a hand in the formation of the Liezi itself—in which he recapitulated many of the ideas that spanned the entire spectrum of Neo-Daoist philosophy. What is of particular interest is that Zhang explicitly introduced Buddhist ideas into Xuanxue.

Buddhism had entered China long before the Jin period. Given the similarity between the Daoist concept of wu and the Buddhist emphasis on “emptiness,” it has been suggested that Neo-Daoism was influenced by Buddhist philosophy from the start. Though possible, there is so far no strong evidence linking He Yan, Wang Bi and other early Neo-Daoists to Buddhism. On the contrary, it is clear that Xuanxue had exerted considerable influence on the development of Chinese Buddhism. From the fourth century onward, Buddhist masters frequently engaged in Pure Conversation and challenged Xuanxue scholars at their own game. For example, the Shishuo xinyu (4.32) reports that the monk Zhi Dun (314–366) challenged the “Xiang-Guo”—i.e., Xiang Xiu and Guo Xiang—interpretation of the Zhuangzi, arguing that only the enlightened sage could truly experience transcendental freedom. In another episode, we find Zhi Dun taking part in a debate on the “four roots of capacity and nature” (4.51). During the Northern and Southern Dynasties that followed the Jin, Xuanxue reached the pinnacle of its influence when it was admitted into the official curriculum of the imperial academy. At the same time, however, Neo-Daoism also began to lose its vitality. As the early medieval period drew to a close, it was Buddhism and religious Daoism that commanded the attention of the literati.

Xuanxue or Neo-Daoism occupies a key place in the history of Chinese philosophy. Arriving on the Chinese scene at a point of rupture, it redefined the classical tradition and brought into currency new ideas in metaphysics, ethics, hermeneutics, and other areas of philosophical concern, which facilitated the reception of Buddhist philosophy and laid the foundation for the Neo-Confucian movement later. To recapitulate, mainstream Neo-Daoism is not a partisan Daoist school. Properly understood, Confucius, Laozi, and Zhuangzi converge in their understanding of Dao. Secondly, Xuanxue cannot be divorced from the goal of “great peace.” The philosophy of nothingness and naturalness does not give rise to pessimism or renunciation. Even Ji Kang and Ruan Ji did not abandon the promise of renewal. Although many scholars had found in the figure of the ancient recluse a source of inspiration, and despite the fact that it was common for the literati to refuse office, there was an optimism that naturalness and nonaction would in the end bring about harmony and peace. Finally, it should be emphasized that Neo-Daoism is not monolithic. The concept of nothingness, for example, may have been central to the Xuanxue project, but it is subject to debate and interpretation. Toward the end of the third century, for example, Pei Wei (267–300) composed a treatise provocatively titled “Extoling [the Philosophical Primacy of] Being” (Chongyou lun), which should give an indication of the vibrancy of the Learning in the Profound.


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