Newton’s Philosophy

First published Fri Oct 13, 2006; substantive revision Wed Jul 14, 2021

Isaac Newton (1642–1727) lived in a philosophically tumultuous time. He witnessed the end of the Aristotelian dominance of philosophy in Europe, the rise and fall of Cartesianism, the emergence of “experimental philosophy,” and the development of numerous experimental and mathematical methods for the study of nature. Indeed, he helped to develop many of those methods. Newton’s contributions to mathematics—including the co-discovery with G.W. Leibniz of what we now call the calculus—and to what is now called physics, including both its experimental and theoretical aspects, will forever dominate discussions of his lasting influence. His impact on the development of early modern philosophy was also profound; indeed, it is difficult to grasp the history of philosophy in the late seventeenth and early eighteenth centuries without considering Newton’s role. His engagement with Cartesian ideas and methods early in his life was just as significant to the transformation of philosophy in the seventeenth century as his debates with Leibniz were to the setting of the agenda of philosophy in the eighteenth. Obviously, Newton is not part of the traditional philosophy canon of the period. That fact reflects an anachronistic approach to the history of modern philosophy that we have inherited from French and German scholars of the nineteenth century. During the height of the Enlightenment, Newton was always characterized as a canonical philosopher: for instance, he plays a leading role in the very first “modern” history of modern philosophy, Johann Jacob Brucker’s Historia Critica Philosophiae of 1744. Every major Enlightenment thinker, from Diderot to D’Alembert to Kant, was influenced by Brucker’s account of modern philosophy. In tandem, numerous works on “Newton’s philosophy” and his “philosophical discoveries” were published throughout the eighteenth century in every major European language. By the early nineteenth century, however, a separation between “science” and “philosophy” had been effectuated, which led to Newton’s shunting into the science canon. Recent scholarship has challenged this conception of the canon. Moreover, Newton engaged with, or influenced, many of the standardly canonical philosophers of the early modern era, including Descartes, Locke, Berkeley, Hume, Leibniz and Kant. His influence on early modern philosophy is a rich topic.

1. Placing Newton in the history of natural philosophy

Traditionally, Newton would be characterized as a mathematician for his work on the calculus and as a scientist for his work in physics. His celebrated talent in mathematics is perhaps equaled not only by his profound theorizing concerning the physical world, but also his influential experimental methods. Indeed, Newton is remarkable for the fact that his work as a theoretician is matched by his work as an experimentalist—either aspect of his oeuvre would be sufficient to secure his place in the history of modern science. So in the popular imagination, and in the history books, Newton is seen as one of the greatest scientists of the modern period, on a par with few others (perhaps Darwin or Einstein). This view will continue to dominate our understanding of Newton in the twenty-first century.

If we attempt to understand Newton’s work from an historical point of view, however, a more complex conception emerges. When Newton published his principal works, he was not contributing to a well-established field, he was helping to create modern mathematical physics. This meant that few of his ideas, methods, or approaches, whether in mathematics or in experimental physics, could be taken for granted. From his first papers in the early 1670s, on optics, until his last days working on the third and final edition of his magnum opus the Principia decades later, philosophers, mathematicians and experimenters challenged Newton’s approach. This frequently upset Newton, who had a famous, lifelong aversion to intellectual debate and controversy. But in a sense, it helped to ensure the importance of Newton’s ideas for philosophy. Obviously, Newton never wrote a philosophical text on the order of Descartes’s Meditations, Locke’s Essay, or Spinoza’s Ethics. He never produced what the lumières who studied him would have called a “system” of philosophy. But the intense controversies produced by his mathematical, empirical and philosophical methods and ideas continually prompted him to broach philosophical topics (Janiak 2015). As a result, he was widely considered a leading philosopher throughout the Enlightenment. In the first modern history of philosophy, Brucker’s Historia Critica Philosophiae, Newton plays a central role in discussions of the modern era (Volume 4.2: 639-55). He is also a central figure in D’Alembert’s discussion of the emergence of modern science and philosophy: Newton is listed along with Bacon, Descartes, Locke and Leibniz as a key figure in the Preliminary Discourse (80-83).

The eighteenth-century tendency to discuss Newton’s philosophy, rather than his science, may have an odd ring to modern ears. In this case, however, the evolution of the English language tracks a substantive intellectual development. As a matter of historical fact, the category of the scientist—along with that word in English—is a nineteenth-century invention. Specifically, at a meeting of the British Association for the Advancement of Science in June of 1833, the Cambridge philosopher William Whewell coined the word “scientist”. Whewell said that just as the practitioners of art are called “artists”, the practitioners of science ought to be called “scientists”, indicating that they should no longer be called philosophers.[1] Indeed, before the early nineteenth century, people like Newton were called “philosophers”, or more specifically, “natural philosophers”. During the seventeenth century, and well into the eighteenth (at least until 1750, if not later), figures like Newton worked within the century’s old tradition of natural philosophy.[2] The modern disciplines of physics, chemistry, biology and so on, had not yet been formed. (The words ‘physics’ in English, ’physique’ in French, and ‘physica’ in Latin were often used, but had a very broad meaning, like “natural philosophy.”) Philosophers who studied nature investigated such things as planetary motions, the nature of matter, and the possibility of a vacuum, but they also discussed many aspects of human beings, including the psyche, and how nature reflects its divine creator (Hatfield 1996). As the title of Newton’s magnum opus, Philosophiæ Naturalis Principia Mathematica (Mathematical Principles of Natural Philosophy), suggests, he intended his work to be in dialogue with Descartes’s Principia Philosophiae (Principles of Philosophy, 1644). Descartes’s Principles is a complex text that includes discussions of everything from the laws of nature to the nature of God’s causal influence on the world. Descartes had famously promised that his physics required nothing more than the principles of geometry and pure mathematics (Principles, Part Two, §64). Although Descartes was a great mathematician, the author of a major work in geometry in 1637, Newton thought nonetheless that he had not lived up to this promise, so he would assuredly introduce mathematical principles for natural philosophy. Just as Descartes had sought to replace Aristotelian or “Scholastic” methods and doctrines in natural philosophy, Newton sought to replace Descartes’s. It is therefore more historically accurate and more illuminating to interpret Newton within the historical stream of natural philosophy.[3]

As is well known, natural philosophy in the Aristotelian traditions of the thirteenth through the sixteenth centuries involved an analysis of Aristotle’s ideas about the natural world, especially within the Christianized context of the medieval period. Philosophers studying nature were often actually studying texts—such as commentaries on Aristotle—rather than conducting experiments or engaging in observations, and they often did not employ mathematical techniques. Traditionally, natural philosophy in Aristotelian circles was not conceived of as a mathematical discipline (unlike, say, optics or astronomy); instead, it focused especially on the natures of objects and on causation. In the seventeenth century, natural philosophers like Galileo, Boyle, Descartes, and Newton began to reject not only the doctrines of the Aristotelians, but their techniques as well, developing a number of new mathematical, conceptual and experimental methods. Newton respected Descartes’s rejection of Aristotelian ideas, but argued that Cartesians did not employ enough of the mathematical techniques of Galileo, or the experimental methods of Boyle, in trying to understand nature. Of course, these developments have often been regarded as central to the Scientific Revolution. Despite the centrality of these changes during the seventeenth century, however, the scope of natural philosophy had not dramatically changed. Natural philosophers like Newton expended considerable energy trying to understand, e.g., the nature of space, time and motion, but they regarded that endeavor as a component of an overarching enterprise that also included an analysis of the divine being. Newton was a natural philosopher—unlike Descartes, he was not a founder of modern philosophy, for he never wrote a treatise of the order of the Meditations. Nonetheless, his influence on philosophy in the eighteenth century was profound, extending well beyond the bounds of philosophers studying nature, encompassing numerous figures and traditions in Britain, on the Continent, and even in the New World.[4] Newton’s influence has at least two salient aspects.

First, Newton’s achievement in the Opticks and in the Principia was understood to be of such philosophical import that few philosophers in the eighteenth century ignored it. Most of the canonical philosophers in this period sought to interpret various of Newton’s epistemic claims within the terms of their own systems, and many saw the coherence of their own views with those of Newton as a criterion of philosophical excellence. Early in the century, Berkeley grappled with Newton’s work on the calculus in The Analyst (1734) and with his dynamics in De Motu (1721), and he even mentioned gravity, the paradigmatic Newtonian force, in his popular work Three Dialogues between Hylas and Philonous (1713). When Berkeley lists what philosophers take to be the so-called primary qualities of material bodies in the Dialogues, he remarkably adds “gravity” to the more familiar list of size, shape, motion, and solidity, thereby suggesting that the received view of material bodies had already changed before the second edition of the Principia had circulated widely. Remarkably, in that same year Roger Cotes, the editor of the second edition of Newton’s Principia, had argued in his editor’s preface that gravity should indeed be considered a primary quality along with the more familiar mechanist properties that had been the subject of so much discussion in previous years. (Newton himself approached the topic more cautiously.) For his part, Hume interpreted Newtonian natural philosophy in an empiricist vein and noted some of its broader implications in his Treatise of Human Nature (1739) and Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding (1750). Newton’s work also served as the impetus for the extremely influential correspondence between Leibniz and the Newtonian Samuel Clarke early in the century, a correspondence that proved significant even for thinkers writing toward the century’s end. Unlike the vis viva controversy and other disputes between the Cartesians and the Leibnizians, which died out by the middle of the century, the debate between the Leibnizians and the Newtonians remained philosophically salient for decades, serving as an impetus for Émilie Du Châtelet’s influential work during the French Enlightenment, Foundations of Physics (1740), and also as one of the driving forces behind Kant’s development of the “critical” philosophy during the 1770s, culminating in the Critique of Pure Reason in 1781. In addition, Newton’s work spawned an immense commentarial literature in English, French, and Latin, including John Keill’s Introduction to Natural Philosophy (1726), Francesco Algarotti’s Newtonianism for the Ladies (1738), Henry Pemberton’s A View of Sir Isaac Newton’s Philosophy (1728), Voltaire’s Elements of the Philosophy of Newton (1738), Willem Gravesande’s Mathematical Elements of Natural Philosophy (1747), Colin MacLaurin’s An Account of Sir Isaac Newton’s Philosophical Discoveries (1748), and many more besides. Moreover, two subsequent Continental editions of Newton’s text contained substantial philosophical engagements not only with his own ideas, but with those of his potential rivals like the great mathematician Johan Bernoulli and also Leibniz. The famous “Jesuit” (or “Geneva”) edition of Principia mathematica published by Fathers Le Seur and Jacquier in 1739-1744 in three volumes engaged substantially with Leibnizian ideas (Guicciardini 2015). And Émilie Du Châtelet wrote an extensive “analytical commentary” as part of her complete French translation of the Principia, published posthumously in 1759. Part of the idea was to translate Newton’s old “geometric” approach to physics into the new language of analysis, a project that was intertwined with numerous philosophical issues. Newton’s ideas and methods in mathematics, physics and philosophy therefore continued to be of substantial importance well into the Enlightenment.

A second aspect of Newton’s influence involves thinkers who attempted in one way or another to articulate, follow, or extend, the Newtonian “method” in natural philosophy when treating issues and questions that Newton ignored. Euclidean geometry and its methods were seen as a fundamental epistemic model for much of seventeenth-century philosophy—as is well known, Descartes’ Meditations attempts to achieve a type of certainty he likens to that found in geometry, and Spinoza wrote his Ethics according to the “geometrical method”. Propositions deduced from axioms in Euclidean geometry were seen as paradigm cases of knowledge. We might see Newton’s work as providing eighteenth-century philosophy with one of its primary models, and with a series of epistemic exemplars as well. But part of philosophy’s task was to articulate precisely what the new Newtonian method involved. David Hume is perhaps clearest about this aspect of Newton’s influence: his Treatise of 1739 has the subtitle, “An Attempt to Introduce the Experimental Method of Reasoning Into Moral Subjects”, and there can be little doubt that he meant (at least in part) the method of the Opticks and the Principia (DePierris 2012). Indeed, as Hume’s text makes abundantly clear, various eighteenth-century philosophers, including not only Hume in Scotland but Jean-Jacques Rousseau on the Continent, were taken to be, or attempted to become, “the Newton of the mind”.[5] For Hume, this meant following what he took to be Newton’s empirical method by providing the proper description of the relevant phenomena and then finding the most general principles that account for them. Of course, one aspect of Hume’s work is to provide an analysis of the concept of causation that is far more extensive than anything found in Newton, which has a substantial impact on what counts as an “account” of a phenomenon. This method would allow us to achieve the highest level of knowledge attainable in the realm of what Hume calls “matters of fact”.[6]

Despite the influence of Newton’s “method” on eighteenth-century philosophy, it is obvious that the Principia’s greater impact on the eighteenth century is to have effected a branching within natural philosophy that led to the development of mathematical physics on the one hand, and philosophy on the other (Cohen and Smith, 2002, 1-4). And yet to achieve an understanding of how Newton himself approached natural philosophy, we must carefully bracket such historical developments—they did not solidify until sometime after 1750, a generation after Newton’s death. Indeed, if we resist the temptation to understand Newton as working within a well established discipline called mathematical physics, if we see him instead as a philosopher studying nature, his achievement is far more impressive, for instead of contributing to a well-founded field of physics, he had to begin a process that would eventually lead aspects of natural philosophy to be transformed into a new field of study. This transformation took many decades, involving a series of methodological and foundational debates about the proper means for obtaining knowledge about nature and its processes. Newton himself not only engaged in these debates from his very first publication in optics in 1672, but his work in both optics and in the Principia generated some of the most significant methodological discussions and controversies in the late seventeenth and early eighteenth centuries. These debates concerned such topics as the proper use of hypotheses, the nature of space and time, the best understanding of the forces of nature, and the appropriate rules for conducting research in natural philosophy. Newton’s achievement was in part to have vanquished both Cartesian and Leibnizian approaches to natural philosophy; in the later eighteenth century, and indeed much of the nineteenth, physics was a Newtonian enterprise more than anything. But this achievement, from Newton’s own perspective, involved an extensive, life-long series of philosophical debates. Those debates focused on numerous substantive issues, but also included extensive discussions of the proper methodology in natural philosophy.

2. Methodology I: the optics debates of the 1670s

Philosophers have long known about the aspects of Newton’s work that are salient for understanding debates in the early modern period. For instance, no history of debates about the ontology of space and time would exclude a discussion of Newton’s famous conception of “absolute” space (see below). Similarly, any discussion of the role of hypotheses in philosophical reasoning would mention Newton prominently. These aspects of Newton’s work continue to be significant in contemporary scholarship, but the scope of discussions of Newton has greatly expanded, encompassing the whole of his intellectual life. This is especially evident in discussions of Newton’s earliest published work, which was in the field of optics. In at least three relevant respects, Newton’s early work in optics, which was published in the Philosophical Transactions of the Royal Society beginning in 1672, set the stage for the principal themes of his long career in natural philosophy (he remained active well into his seventies). Firstly, Newton’s letter to the Society’s secretary, Henry Oldenburg, often called the “New theory about light and colors”, generated an immediate, extensive, and protracted debate that eventually involved important philosophers such as Robert Hooke in Britain and Christiaan Huygens, G.W. Leibniz and Ignatius Pardies on the Continent (the beginning of the very long title of the paper is: “A letter of Mr. Isaac Newton, Mathematick Professor in the University of Cambridge, containing his New Theory about Light and Colors”). Newton consistently regarded these figures not merely as disagreeing with his views, but as misinterpreting them. This experience helped to shape Newton’s famous and lifelong aversion to intellectual controversy, a feature of his personality that he often mentioned in letters, and one that he would never outgrow. Secondly, because Newton regarded himself as having been deeply misinterpreted by his critics, he had recourse to meta-level or methodological discussions of the practice of optics and of the kinds of knowledge that philosophers can obtain when engaging in experiments with light. The novelty and power of Newton’s work in the Principia years later would eventually generate similar controversies that led him to analogous kinds of methodological discussions of his experimental practice within natural philosophy and of the kinds of knowledge that one can obtain in that field using either experimental or mathematical techniques. From our point of view, Newton’s science was unusually philosophical for these reasons. Thirdly and finally, in his earliest optical work Newton began to formulate a distinction that would remain salient throughout his long intellectual career, contending that a philosopher must distinguish between a conclusion or claim about some feature of nature that is derived from experimental or observational evidence, and a conclusion or claim that is a mere “hypothesis”, a kind of speculation about nature that is not, or not yet anyway, so derived. Newton’s much later proclamation in the second edition of the Principia (1713), “Hypotheses non fingo”, or “I feign no hypotheses”, would infuriate his critics just as much as it would prod his followers into making the pronouncement a central component of a newly emerging Newtonian method (see below for details).

The field of optics has its origins in the Ancient Greek period, when figures like Euclid and Ptolemy wrote works on the subject, but they often focused primarily on the science of vision, analyzing (e.g.) the visual rays that were sometimes thought to extrude from the eye, enabling it to perceive distant physical objects. In the early modern period, Kepler and Descartes each made fundamental contributions to the field, including the discovery of the inversion of the retinal image (in the former case) and an explanation of refraction (in the latter case). Newton’s work helped to shift the focus of optics from an analysis of vision to an investigation of light. In “New theory about light and colors”, published in the Philosophical Transactions in 1672, Newton presented a number of experiments in which sunlight was allowed to pass through one or two prisms in order to probe some of its basic features. The paper recounts a number of experiments that Newton says he had conducted several years earlier. But what precisely counts as a feature of light? Numerous philosophers during the seventeenth century, including Hooke and Huygens, developed doctrines concerning the fundamental physical nature of light in answer to the question: is light a stream of particles (or “corpuscles”), or a wave? Both Hooke and Huygens were wave theorists. This question obviously continued to have relevance into the twentieth century, when wave-particle duality was discovered. In his experiments with the prism, however, Newton apparently sought to investigate something else, viz. what he calls “the celebrated Phenomena of Colours”. Newton’s various prism experiments, which he describes in considerable depth, suggested what he called a “Doctrine” that he expresses in thirteen consecutive numbered propositions. Included in these propositions are the following claims about features of rays of light: first, the rays of light that emerge when sunlight passes through a prism exhibit various colors; second, these colors differ in their “degrees of Refrangibility”, which means that they exhibit and retain an index of refraction, even when they are passed through a second prism; third, these colors—or colorful rays—are not modifications of sunlight itself, but are “Original and connate properties” of it; and, fourth, these facts mean that although ordinary sunlight appears white, or perhaps colorless, to our perception, it actually contains numerous colors within it, which can be experimentally revealed. This final point suggests, in turn, that from Newton’s point of view, colors are not solely perceived, or even perceptible, aspects of physical objects; they can also be conceived of as hidden features of light which cannot be perceived directly under any ordinary circumstance (the physical influence of the prism is required for them to become perceptible).

From a contemporary point of view, Newton’s 1672 paper exhibits an intriguing blend of experimental evidence and philosophical argumentation. The latter hinges on Newton’s interpretation of the concept of a property or a quality, as the following passage, which follows the “Doctrine” expressed in thirteen propositions, tellingly reveals:

These things being so, it can be no longer disputed, whether there be colours in the dark, nor whether they be the qualities of the objects we see, no nor perhaps, whether Light be a Body. For, since Colours are the qualities of Light, having its Rays for their entire and immediate subject, how can we think those Rays qualities also, unless one quality may be the subject of and sustain another; which in effect is to call it substance. We should not know Bodies for substances, were it not for their sensible qualities, and the Principal of those being now found due to something else, we have as good reason to believe that to be a substance also. (Newton 1959–, vol. 1: 100)

Newton seems here to be arguing as follows: since rays of light have colors as basic features, we should regard these colors as qualities or properties of the rays (despite the fact that these properties are imperceptible under any ordinary circumstance); but doing so requires us to think of the rays as bearers of qualities, which is to say, as substances in their own right. And if rays of light are substances, this means that we cannot also think of them as qualities or properties of anything else. This last point follows from a widely accepted notion of a substance at the time, one easily found in Descartes[7], viz., that substances are those items that can exist independently of other items (whether they can exist independently even of God is a further question that we can ignore here). And if we cannot think of rays of light as properties or qualities, then they are not waves, for waves are features of some medium—think of waves on the surface of a lake. Newton concludes: light is a stream of particles (he does use the word ‘perhaps’ to hedge a bit here). Clearly, philosophical argumentation is a significant aspect of Newton’s reasoning in this paper, as are various philosophical concepts. It is intriguing to ponder the question, what overall conception of “sensible qualities” does Newton presuppose in this piece? If a ray of sunlight passes through my window, the fact that it appears white to me does not undermine Newton’s view (or so he thinks) that the ray actually contains a series of colors as its “qualities”. Are these qualities “sensible” if their presence can be detected only through the use of one or more prisms but never through the inspection of the sunlight through ordinary means (unaided perception, glasses, a magnifying glass, etc.)? These are apt to strike us as canonical philosophical problems.

Newton’s line of argument quoted above became one of the centerpieces of the debate that his paper generated. In some parts of his paper, when Newton wrote of the “rays” of light, he had evidently intended to remain neutral on the question of whether the rays are particles or waves (this is reminiscent of the ancient Greek practice of avoiding physical discussions of visual rays). But then towards the paper’s end, Newton added his new line of argument, which employed some philosophical analysis together with some experimental evidence to support the conclusion that rays of light cannot be waves after all. Newton’s critics pounced. This led to the first problem he encountered in response to his paper: what he calls his “theory” of light and colors was not merely rejected, but rather immediately misunderstood, at least from his own perspective. Just days after Newton’s paper was read at the Royal Society, Robert Hooke responded with a detailed letter to Oldenburg. In the first few sentences, Hooke indicates that from his point of view, Newton’s “Hypothesis of saving the phenomena of colours” essentially involves the contention that rays of light are particulate, rather than wavelike.[8] Hooke argues, in contrast, that light “is nothing but a pulse or motion propagated through an homogeneous, uniform and transparent medium;” that is, he argues that light is indeed wavelike. He makes it perfectly clear, moreover, that his hypothesis—the name did not carry a negative connotation in his work—can save the phenomena of colors just as well as Newton’s, which is to say, his hypothesis is compatible with the experimental evidence Newton had gathered. Evidently, the line of argument in the passage quoted above caught Hooke’s eye. Among philosophers, he was not alone. In a letter to Huygens explaining Newton’s theory of light, Leibniz writes that Newton takes light to be a “body” propelled from the sun to the earth which, according to Leibniz, Newton takes to explain both the differential refrangibility of rays of light and the phenomena of colors.[9] Since Newton had employed the concepts of substance, quality and sensible quality when concluding in his paper that light is (presumably) particulate, we are apt to regard the paper as contributing to important discussions within philosophy. After the extensive correspondence, and controversy, generated in response to Newton’s early optical views and experiments, he often threatened to avoid engaging in mathematical and philosophical disputes altogether. He insisted to friends and colleagues that he found intellectual controversy unbearable. But he never followed through with his threat to disengage from discussions in natural philosophy, sending many important letters throughout his long intellectual career.

3. Newton’s relation to Cartesianism

Like many philosophers who worked in the wake of Galileo and of Descartes, it seems that Newton never extensively analyzed Aristotelian ideas about nature. He would have encountered such ideas in the curriculum at Trinity College, but there is not much evidence that he took them seriously. Instead, he focused on the “modern” thinkers that enterprising young students were told to read outside of the standard curriculum.[10] And in England in Newton’s day, the greatest modern philosopher of nature was thought to be Descartes (Heilbron 1982: 30). There is substantial evidence that Newton took Descartes’s ideas very seriously, and expended considerable energy thinking them through and eventually coming to criticize them. Some of that evidence comes from a manuscript that was first transcribed and published in 1962 by the great historians of science, Marie Boas Hall and A. Rupert Hall. The untitled manuscript, now known as “De Gravitatione” after its first line, has been the subject of extensive discussions over the past fifty years because it indicates the depth of Newton’s interest in Cartesian ideas in metaphysics and natural philosophy. Despite its importance to contemporary understandings of Newton’s relation to Cartesianism, and much else besides, De Gravitatione is not without its problems. First and foremost, the manuscript lacks a date, and there is no scholarly consensus regarding its precise provenance.[11] Second, the manuscript was never finished, so it is difficult to assess its relationship with Newton’s mature thinking in philosophy. Finally, the manuscript was not published during Newton’s lifetime, so there are questions about whether it represents his considered views. Despite these facts, the text contains a treasure trove of arguments concerning Cartesian ideas. For instance, it dispels the easily formed impression that Newton sought, in the Principia, to undermine a Leibnizian conception of space and time, as his defender, Samuel Clarke, would attempt to do years later in the correspondence of 1715–16 (discussed below). Although Leibniz did eventually express what became the canonical early modern formulation of “relationalism” concerning space and time—the view, roughly, that space is nothing but the order of relations among physical objects, and time nothing over and above the succession of events involving those objects—and although Newton and Clarke were highly skeptical of such a view, it is misleading to read the Principia through the lens provided by the later controversy with the Leibnizians. Newton’s extensive attempt in De Gravitatione to refute Descartes’s conception of space and time in particular indicates that the Scholium should be read as providing a replacement for the Cartesian conception.[12] That is, Newton had a Cartesian, and not a Leibnizian, opponent primarily in mind when he wrote his famous articulation of “absolutism” concerning space and time. Unlike questions about Newton’s methods and his apparent deviation from the norms established by mechanist philosophers like Descartes and Boyle, Newton’s conception of space and time, along with his view of the divine being, did not immediately engender a philosophical debate. It was Leibniz more than any other philosopher who eventually succeeded in fomenting a philosophical debate in which the “Newtonian” conception of space, time and the divine would play a central role (see below). But Leibniz’s philosophical views were relatively unknown when Newton first formed his conception--to the young Newton writing the Principia, Leibniz was another mathematician and not yet a contributor to natural philosophy. Instead, it was Descartes’s view of space, the world, and God, which he pondered in his youth and eventually came to reject.

Newton took special interest in the Cartesian view of space and body, and in related views concerning the causal relations between minds and bodies and between God and the bodies that constitute the natural world. Like many of Newton’s contemporaries in Cambridge in those days, he encountered these Cartesian views within the context of Henry More’s then famous discussions of Cartesianism (a term coined by More himself). Beginning with his correspondence with Descartes in 1648 (Lewis 1953), and continuing with a series of publications in later years, many of which Newton owned in his personal library (Harrison 1978), More argued that Descartes made two fundamental mistakes: first, he wrongly contended that extension and matter are identical (and that the world is therefore a plenum); and second, he mistakenly believed that God and the mind were not extended substances, which made their causal interactions with such substances mysterious. Just as Princess Elisabeth of Bohemia had raised fundamental objections to Cartesian dualism (see Shapiro 2007) in the early 1640s, More raised similar objections against the Cartesian view of the divine a few years later (Lewis 1953). Descartes agreed with More’s suggestion that God can act anywhere on nature if he so chooses, and came very close to accepting More’s contention that such a view entails that God must be present within the world wherever he in fact chooses to act. For how could God part the Red Sea, suggested More, unless God were present precisely where the Red Sea is located? Of course, More agreed that God is not made of parts, cannot be imagined, and cannot be affected by the causal activity of material bodies—the causal arrow flows only in one direction. But More concluded that God is extended in his own way. If one fixes Descartes’s two basic mistakes, one obtains what More regarded as a proper philosophical view: space is distinct from matter because it is extended but penetrable, whereas matter is extended but impenetrable; and, in tandem, all substances are extended, but whereas some, such as tables and chairs, are impenetrable, others, such as the mind and God, are penetrable and therefore not material.[13] Newton was deeply influenced both by More’s criticisms of Descartes and by his positive philosophical conception of space and the divine.

In a number of texts, including De Gravitatione, the famous discussion of space and time in the Scholium to the Principia, and the discussion of God in the General Scholium, Newton made his generally Morean attitudes perfectly clear. He rejected the Cartesian identification of extension and matter, arguing that space itself exists independently of material objects (and their relations), and he contended that all entities, including the human mind and even the divine being, are extended in the sense that they have spatial location, even if they are extended in ways that distinguish them from ordinary material bodies.[14] In Newton’s hands, space becomes a fundamental concept of natural philosophy, an attitude that is foreign to Cartesians. As Newton puts it in a famous passage from De Gravitatione:

Space is an affection of a being just as a being. No being exists or can exist which is not related to space in some way. God is every where, created minds are somewhere, and body is in the space that it occupies; and whatever is neither everywhere nor anywhere does not exist. And hence it follows that space is an emanative effect of the first existing being, for if any being whatsoever is posited, space is posited. (Newton 2004: 25)

Space is a fundamental concept in part because Newton not only conceives of it as independent of objects and their relations, but because he argues that every entity must somehow connect with space in some way. For Newton, then, if one follows the Cartesians and thinks of the mind, or of God, as existing without any spatial location—as existing either “beyond” the natural world or somehow outside of it—then that is equivalent to conceiving of them as non-existent. Newton does not shy away from making this conception of the divine explicit in his public writings, despite the fact that it was anathema to his Cartesian and Leibnizian contemporaries. In the General Scholium to the Principia, which was added to the second edition of the text in 1713, for instance, he famously writes of God:

He endures always and is present everywhere, and by existing always and everywhere he constitutes duration and space. Since each and every particle of space is always, and each and every indivisible moment of duration is everywhere, certainly the maker and lord of all things will not be never or nowhere … God is one and the same God always and everywhere. He is omnipresent not only virtually but also substantially; for active power cannot subsist without substance. (Newton 1999: 941)

For Newton, just as bodies are present in some spatial location, God, an infinite being, is present throughout all of space throughout all of time. There could not be a clearer expression of agreement with More in his debate with the Cartesians concerning the substantial presence of the divine within space.

Newton also took issue with Cartesian ideas about motion. His rejection of Cartesian views of space, and his embrace of space as a fundamental concept in philosophy following More’s influence, aligns with his famous discussion of space and time in the Scholium that follows the opening definitions in the Principia. This text influenced nearly every subsequent philosophical discussion of space and time for the next three centuries, so its contours are well known (see DiSalle 2006: ch. 2). In his Principles of Philosophy of 1644, Descartes had distinguished between the “ordinary” and the “proper” view of motion: whereas the ordinary view presents motion as a body’s change of place, the philosopher knows that properly speaking, motion is a body’s change of relations to the bodies that surround it (recall Descartes’s plenum). Newton contends in De Gravitatione that this idea of proper motion, according to which the motion of a body is at least partially a function of its relations to other bodies, is in tension with Descartes’s own laws of nature, also presented in the Principles. For according to the conception of (what we now call) inertia that Descartes presents as his first two laws, a body moving rectilinearly will continue to do so unless caused to deviate from its path—hence a body’s motion is not a function of its spatial relations to other bodies, but rather of its causal relations. That is, according to the first two laws, changing a body’s spatial relations to others bodies will not alter its rectilinear motion unless a causal interaction occurs. This tension runs deep in the Cartesian system. Newton’s Scholium reflects his idea that the concept of motion in the Principia ought to cohere with the laws of motion he endorses. He distinguishes between absolute and relative motion, true and apparent motion, and mathematical and common motion (the same distinctions hold for time, space and place). The former item in each of these three pairings is a concept that coheres with the laws of motion. Newton’s first law reflects Descartes’s laws: it is a new version of the principle of inertia, one incorporating the concept of an impressed force. Since this law indicates that a body’s motion is not a function of its spatial relations to other bodies, but rather of whether forces are impressed on it—which replaces the Cartesian concept of causal interactions that involve only impact (see below)—Newton cannot rely on a body’s motion relative to other bodies if he is to avoid the kind of tension he found in the Cartesian view. Hence he indicates that a body’s true motion—rather than its apparent motion, which depends on our perceptions, or its relative motion, which depends on its spatial relations—is a body’s change of position within space itself. That is, true motion should be understood as absolute motion. This means, in turn, that we must distinguish between the common idea of space, according to which space is conceived of as involving relations among various objects (like the space of our air), and the mathematical idea, one presumably obtained from geometrical reasoning, that space is independent of any objects or their relations. In order to account for the idea that true motion is absolute motion, then, the famous “absolute space” is postulated.

Newton was perfectly well aware that the notion of absolute space is not unproblematic.[15] For instance, if a body’s true motion just is its absolute motion, its motion with respect to space itself, then the imperceptibility of space would appear to render any detection of true motion difficult, if not hopeless. Indeed, how would we detect any body’s true motion on this view? We might be able to detect a body’s changing spatial relations with its neighbors, but not its changing relationship with space itself! Newton’s solution to this problem is ingenious. Under certain circumstances, we can detect a body’s true motion by detecting its acceleration. We can do so when the body is rotating or has a circular motion, for such motions often have detectable effects. This is one way of understanding what has become one of the most famous, if not infamous, experiments of the early modern period, Newton’s bucket. (He grew up in part on a farm in the English countryside, and often used deceptively simple examples.) If one takes an ordinary bucket and fills it with water, and then attaches a rope to the top of the bucket, one can then twist the rope and let it go in order to make the bucket spin. When the bucket full of water spins around, we can detect the water’s acceleration by its changing surface. As Newton puts it, using his laws of motion, the water endeavors to recede from the axis of its motion (hence its changing surface). But even an observer untutored in physics would grasp the importance of the water’s changing surface--that is, perceiving the effect does not depend on understanding the laws. In this way, despite the fact that Newton wishes to conceive of the water’s true motion as its absolute motion within space itself, which cannot be perceived, he shows his readers how they might detect the water’s true motion through its effects. Newton provides another simple experiment to illustrate a similar point. If two balls are joined together by a rope and then spun around, say over one’s head, then the changing tension in the rope will indicate that the balls are accelerated. Since any acceleration is a true motion—although not all true motions are accelerations, since a so-called inertial motion is not—this case indicates that we can detect a body’s true motion even though space itself is imperceptible. In this way, Newton did not merely develop an alternative to the Cartesian view of motion, along with its allied conception of space; he presented a view that could be employed to pick out some of the true motions of objects within nature. Once one has found a true motion, one can then ask what caused that motion (for Newton, as we will see, it is forces that are understood to cause motions). As the last line of the Scholium in the Principia indicates, that is one reason that Newton wrote his magnum opus in the first place.

Newton’s idea of space, then, fulfilled at least two roles. First, it enabled him to avoid the tension between the concept of true motion and the laws of motion of the kind found in Descartes. Second, it also enabled him to articulate what he took to be God’s relation to the natural world. Many regarded his achievements as an important advance over the Cartesian system. However, it would be a mistake to think that Newton vanquished Cartesian ideas within his lifetime: even in England, and certainly on the Continent, Cartesianism remained a powerful philosophical force for several decades after Newton published his primary works.[16] Typically, however, Descartes’s followers emphasized the importance of his ideas about the mechanisms that pervade nature rather than his views of space and time. In that arena, Newton’s views were especially prominent, and came in for significant criticism from Leibniz.

4. Methodology II: the Principia

Many legends concerning momentous events in history are apocryphal, but the legend of Halley’s visit to Newton in 1684 is not: it explains what prompted Newton to write his magnum opus. In August of 1684, Edmond Halley—for whom the comet is named—came to visit Newton in Cambridge in order to discover his opinion about a subject of much dispute in celestial mechanics. At this time, many in the Royal Society and elsewhere were at work on a cluster of problems that might be described as follows: how can one take Kepler’s Laws, which were then considered among the very best descriptions of the planetary orbits, and understand them in the context of dynamical or causal principles? What kind of cause would lead to planetary orbits of the kind described by Kepler? In particular, Halley asked Newton the following question: what kind of curve would a planet describe in its orbit around the Sun if it were acted upon by an attractive force that was inversely proportional to the square of its distance from the Sun? Newton immediately replied that the curve would be an ellipse (rather than, say, a circle).[17] Halley was amazed that Newton had the answer at the ready. But Newton also said that he had mislaid the paper on which the relevant calculations had been made, so Halley left empty handed (whether there was any such paper is a subject of dispute). But he would not be disappointed for long. In November of that year, Newton sent Halley a nine-page paper, entitled De Motu (on motion), that presented the sought-after demonstration, along with several other advances in celestial mechanics. Halley was delighted, and immediately returned to Cambridge for further discussion. It was these events that precipitated the many drafts of De Motu that eventually became Principia mathematica by 1686. Several aspects of the Principia have been central to philosophical discussions since its first publication, including Newton’s novel methodology in the book, his conception of space and time, and his attitude toward the dominant orientation within natural philosophy in his day, the so-called mechanical philosophy, which had important methodological consequences.

When Newton wrote the Principia between 1684 and 1686, he was not contributing to a preexisting field of study called mathematical physics; he was attempting to show how philosophers could employ various mathematical and experimental methods in order to reach conclusions about nature, especially about the motions of material bodies (Janiak 2015, Chapter One). In his lectures presented as the Lucasian Professor at Cambridge, Newton had been arguing since at least 1670 that natural philosophers ought to employ geometrical methods in order to understand various phenomena in nature.[18] The Principia represented his attempt to reorient natural philosophy, taking it in a direction that neither his Aristotelian predecessors, nor his Cartesian contemporaries, had envisioned. He did not immediately convince many of them of the benefits of his approach. Just as his first publication in optics in 1672 sparked an intense debate about the proper methods for investigating the nature of light—and much else besides—his Principia sparked an even longer lasting discussion about the methodology that philosophers should adopt when studying the natural world. This discussion began immediately with the publication of the Principia, despite the fact that its first edition contained few explicit methodological remarks (Smith 2002: 138–39). It intensified considerably with the publication of its second edition in 1713, which contained many more remarks about methodology, including many attempts at defending the Newtonian method. Indeed, many of Newton’s alterations in that edition changed the presentation of his methods. Discussions of methodology would eventually involve nearly all of the leading philosophers in England and on the Continent during Newton’s lifetime.

In Cartesian natural philosophy, all natural change is due to the impacts that material bodies make upon one another’s surfaces (this is reflected in Descartes’s first two laws of nature). The concept of a force plays little if any role. Unlike Descartes, Newton placed the concept of a force at the very center of his thinking about motion and its causes within nature. In that regard, his reactions to the shortcomings of Cartesian natural philosophy parallel Leibniz’s, who coined the term “dynamics”, and who obviously regarded force as a fundamental concept in metaphysics as well (Westfall 1971). But Newton’s attitude toward understanding the forces of nature involved an especially intricate method that generated intense scrutiny and debate amongst many philosophers and mathematicians, including Leibniz (Garber 2012). Newton’s canonical notion of a force, which he calls a vis impressa or “impressed force”, is the notion of an “action exerted on a body” that changes its state of motion. This was a confusing notion at the time. Perhaps it is not difficult to see why that should be so. To take one of Newton’s own examples: suppose I hit a tennis ball with my racquet—according to Newton, I have impressed a force on the tennis ball, for I have changed its state of motion (hopefully!). We have a reasonably good idea of what the tennis ball is, of what the racquet is, and even of what I am, and a Cartesian might wish to stop her analysis there. But what exactly is this “force” that I impressed on the tennis ball? The ball, the racquet and I are physical things of one sort or another, but is the force physical? Is it not physical? It does not seem likely that a force is itself a physical thing in the sense of being a substance, to use a philosophical notion popular in Newton’s day (as we saw above in his first optics paper). The reason is that in Definition Four in the Principia, which defines an impressed force for the first time, Newton remarks: “This force consists solely in the action and does not remain in a body after the action has ceased”. So when I hit the tennis ball over the net, the force I impressed on it was the action of hitting the ball, or an action associated with hitting the ball, and not a property of me or of the ball after the action had ceased. This idea confused many of Newton’s readers. By the mid-eighteenth century, the time of Hume’s analysis of causation in the Treatise and the Enquiry, many philosophers started to think that actions and other kinds of event are important items to have in one’s ontology, and they often contended in particular that causal relations hold between events. But in Newton’s day, philosophers typically regarded objects or substances as the causal relata. Indeed, one actually finds an equivocation between thinking of events and thinking of objects as the relevant causal relata even in Hume: in his Enquiry, he first defines a “cause” so that “objects” are the causal relata, but then gives an example in which one of the relata is the vibration of a string (Enquiry, §VII, 51). So actions were difficult to analyze, left out of analyses, or conflated with objects. As a result, Newton’s conception of force proved confusing, even to his most sympathetic interpreters. Moreover, it was unclear to many of Newton’s mechanist readers how his forces fit into their rather austere ontological view that material bodies consist solely of properties such as size, shape, mobility and solidity.

Newton did try to clarify his method of characterizing forces. If one brackets the question of how to understand forces as ephemeral actions that do not persist after causal interactions have ceased, one can make progress by conceiving of forces as quantities. In particular, since Newton’s eight definitions and three laws indicate that forces are proportional to mass and to acceleration, and since mass—or the quantity of matter, a concept Newton transformed from its Cartesian origins, where it was understood as a measure of a body’s volume—and acceleration are both quantities that can be measured, Newton gives us a means of measuring forces. This is crucial to his method. If one thinks of forces as measurable quantities, moreover, then one can attempt to identify two seemingly disparate forces as in fact the same force through thinking about measuring them. For instance, in Book III of the Principia, Newton famously argues in proposition five and its scholium that the centripetal force maintaining the planetary orbits is in fact the same as the force of gravity, viz., the force that causes the free fall of objects on earth. This was a revolutionary idea at the time, one rendered possible in the first place by Newton’s way of thinking about forces as quantities. This idea then led Newton to the even more revolutionary view in proposition seven of Book III that all bodies gravitate toward one another in proportion to their quantity of matter. That is, it led him to the idea of universal gravity, a view that shocked many of his Continental readers in its boldness. This helped to unify what were once called superlunary and sublunary phenomena, a unification that was obviously crucial for later research in physics. The idea was enabled by Newton’s abstract way of understanding forces—without conceiving of a force as involving any specific mechanism or type of physical interaction, Newton thought of forces as quantities that are proportional to other features of nature.

Despite his evident success in obtaining what we now call the law of universal gravitation, Newton admits that he lacks another kind of knowledge about gravity; this lack of knowledge directly reflects an aspect of his abstract characterization of forces. In the General Scholium, he reminds his readers that gravity is proportional to a body’s quantity of matter (its mass) and reaches across vast distances within our solar system, adding: “I have not as yet been able to deduce from phenomena the reason for these properties of gravity, and I do not feign hypotheses”.[19] With this phrase, one of the most famous in all of Newton’s writings, he returned to a key theme of his very first optical paper from forty years earlier, viz. the proper role of hypotheses and of hypothetical reasoning within natural philosophy.[20] Some of Newton’s interpreters have regarded this phrase as signaling a strong commitment to the broad doctrine that all hypotheses concerning natural phenomena ought to be avoided in principle. This interpretation is sometimes coupled with the view that some British philosophers in the late seventeenth century regarded Cartesianism as overly reliant on hypotheses in reaching conclusions about phenomena. But this interpretation may be hard to square with Newton’s texts. For instance, in the Scholium to Proposition 96 of Book I of the Principia, Newton discusses hypotheses concerning light rays. Similarly, in query 21 of the Opticks, he proposes that there might be an aether whose differential density accounts for the gravitational force acting between bodies. In light of such examples, one can read the General Scholium’s pronouncement in this way: a philosopher concerned with explaining some feature of nature—such as the fact that gravity is inversely proportional to the square of spatial separation, rather than, say, the cube—may legitimately entertain and propose hypotheses for consideration, but she may not “feign” the hypothesis in the sense of taking it as having been established either through experiment, observation, or some form of reasoning (including mathematical reasoning). Hence Newton thinks that he has established the fact that gravity acts on all material bodies in proportion to their quantity of matter, but he has not established the existence of the aether. What, then, does Newton’s slogan hypotheses non fingo actually rule out? By the time of the General Scholium, Newton was increasingly embroiled in philosophical disputes with Leibniz. After reading the copy of the Principia that Newton had sent him, Leibniz wrote an essay (“Tentamen”) on the causes of planetary motion for the famous journal Acta Eruditorum. In order to account for the motions of the planetary bodies in his Tentamen, published in 1689, Leibniz introduces ex hypothesi the premise that some kind of fluid surrounds, and is contiguous to, the various planetary bodies, and then argues that this fluid must be in motion to account for their orbits.[21] Newton may have argued that Leibniz had “feigned” the hypothesis of the vortices. That is, he would have objected to Leibniz’s conclusion that there must be vortices in the solar system (as opposed to the suggestion, for instance, that we try to detect their presence through observations of things like comets). A debate between the two philosophers on this score would bring them to the question of the mechanical philosophy: whereas Newton would object to Leibniz’s reasoning on methodological grounds, Leibniz would reply that Newton’s theory of gravity involves action at a distance, which his vortex hypothesis avoids (see below for more details).

Once the Principia was published, Newton had a vexed relationship with the mechanical philosophy, an orientation within natural philosophy that is associated with nearly every significant early modern philosopher, including Descartes, Boyle, Huygens, Leibniz, and Locke.[22] One of the reasons for this complex relationship can be understood if we consider Newton’s attitude toward forces in an abstract way. His second law indicates that a body moving rectilinearly will continue to do so unless a force is impressed on it. This is not equivalent to claiming that a body moving rectilinearly will continue to do so unless another body impacts upon it. A vis impressa—an impressed force—in Newton’s system is not the same as a body, nor even a quality of a body, as we have seen; but what is more, some impressed forces need not involve contact between bodies at all. For instance, gravity is a kind of centripetal force, and the latter, in turn, is a species of impressed force. Hence a body moving in a straight line will continue to do so until it experiences a gravitational pull, in which case it will deviate from a straight line motion, even if no body impacts upon it. Indeed, the gravitational pull might originate with a mass that is millions of miles away. As we have seen, an impressed force is an action exerted on a body. Hence the gravity exerted on a moving body is an action (the Latin term is actio), which is obviously a causal notion. This is not an empirical claim per se; it is merely a reflection of Newton’s laws, together with his notion of an impressed force, and his further idea that gravity is one kind of impressed force. These elements of the Principia make conceptual room for a causal interaction between two bodies separated by a vast distance, one enabled by Newton’s concept of an impressed force. Aspects of this idea became known in philosophical circles as the problem of action at a distance (Hesse 1961). Many of Newton’s most influential contemporaries objected vigorously to the fact that his philosophy had made room for—if not explicitly defended—the possibility of distant action between material bodies. Leibniz and Huygens in particular rejected this aspect of Newton’s work in the strongest terms, and it remained a point of contention between Newton and Leibniz for the rest of their lives. Both Leibniz and Huygens were convinced that all natural change occurs through contact action, and that any deviation from this basic mechanist principle within natural philosophy would lead to serious difficulties, including the revival of outmoded Aristotelian ideas. By the seventh proposition of Book III of the Principia, as we have seen, Newton reached the following conclusion (1999: 810): “Gravity acts on all bodies universally and is proportional to the quantity of matter in each”. Leibniz eventually accused Newton of regarding gravity as a kind of “occult quality”, that is, as a quality of bodies that is somehow hidden within them and beyond the philosopher’s understanding. They understood Newton to be saying that gravity is a kind of hidden power to attract embedded in material bodies.

Newton was well aware that the Principia’s methodology of discovering the forces present in nature was controversial, and not merely because of questions about action at a distance. So when he revised the text, under the editorship of Roger Cotes, for publication in a second edition in 1713, he added other methodological remarks. These remarks included what Newton called “regulae philosophandi”, or rules of philosophy, which became the focal point of vigorous discussion and debate well into the eighteenth century. The first two rules concern causal reasoning, but it is the third rule that generated the most debate, for it involved both an aspect of Newton’s controversial argument for universal gravity and also a rare public statement by Newton of what he regarded as the “foundation” of natural philosophy. The third rule concerns an induction problem: we have perceptions and experiments that provide us with knowledge of the objects and natural phenomena in our neck of the universe, but on what basis can we reach a conclusion concerning objects and phenomena throughout the rest of the universe? Newton himself reached such a conclusion about gravity in proposition seven of Book III of the Principia. Part of Newton’s answer is presented in rule 3:

Those qualities of bodies that cannot be intended and remitted [i.e., increased and diminished] and that belong to all bodies on which experiments can be made should be taken as qualities of all bodies universally.

We know, say, that a clump of dirt has certain qualities such as extension and mobility, but how do we know that the entire earth has such qualities? It surely lies beyond the reach of our experiments, or at any rate, it did in Newton’s day. Newton says that the sun and the earth interact according to his law of gravity, but how do we know that the sun contains a quantity of matter, that it is a material body with the same basic qualities that characterize the earth or the moon? It wasn’t at all obvious at the time that the sun is a material body at all. Newton thinks that gravity reaches into the very center of the sun, but what did anyone in 1713 know about such things? Newton glosses his third rule in part as follows, connecting it with his laws of motion:

That all bodies are movable and persevere in motion or in rest by means of certain forces (which we call forces of inertia) we infer from finding these properties in the bodies that we have seen. The extension, hardness, impenetrability, mobility, and force of inertia[23] of the whole arise from the extension, hardness, impenetrability, mobility and force of inertia of each of the parts; and thus we conclude that every one of the least parts of all bodies is extended, hard, impenetrable, movable, and endowed with a force of inertia. And this is the foundation of all natural philosophy. (Newton 1999: 795–96)

Many of Newton’s readers in 1713 would have granted him the following inference: although we do not have any perceptions of, say, the interior of the earth, or even of many ordinary objects within our grasp, we can reasonably infer that everything with certain basic properties—something akin to what John Locke, borrowing a term of Robert Boyle’s, called the “primary qualities”—at the macroscopic level is comprised of micro-particles that are characterized by those same basic properties. But at the end of his gloss of Rule 3, Newton applies this same (or analogous) reasoning to the force of gravity, arguing as follows: since we experience the fact that all bodies on or near the earth gravitate toward the earth—in cases such as free fall—and that the moon gravitates toward the earth, etc., we can infer that all bodies everywhere gravitate toward all other bodies. This argument would appear to suggest that gravity—which, as we have seen, is a kind of impressed force, an action—is somehow akin to qualities like extension and impenetrability. So is Newton suggesting that gravity is actually a quality of all bodies? He did not explicitly endorse that claim, but Cotes did in a famous passage in his editor’s preface (Newton 1999, 391-92). Many understood Cotes to be speaking for Newton, just as they interpreted Clarke a few years later. Leibniz and his followers pounced: if Newton regards gravity as a quality, as a power of attraction, then he had indeed revived the occult qualities of the Scholastics, for here we have a quality that is not explicable in mechanical terms. Unlike the usual properties of extension, impenetrability and mobility discussed by Cotes, gravity seemed like a hidden power. This topic became the subject of intense debate throughout the first half of the eighteenth century (see the last section below).

5. The aftermath of the Principia I: relations with John Locke and Richard Bentley

Although the first editions of Newton’s Principia and of Locke’s Essay were published a mere three years apart (in 1687 and 1690, respectively) their authors worked independently and did not influence the first editions of one another’s principal texts. But then in 1688, Locke wrote a sympathetic (anonymous) review of the Principia. And right around the time of the publication of the first edition of the Essay, Newton and Locke became close friends and apparently influenced each other’s thinking about philosophy, religion, and theology in various ways (they first met in London in 1689). For his part, Locke called him the “incomparable Mr. Newton” on several occasions (e.g., in correspondence: Locke 1823: vol. 4: 55; and the next long quotation below). Most historians think that each questioned the standard Anglican interpretation of the Trinity, contending that Jesus of Nazareth was not a divine figure on the same level as God the creator. Interpreting the Bible through historical and philosophical analysis in a fashion that was not constrained by standard Anglican doctrine in the late seventeenth century was fantastically important to Newton, occupying his attention for many years. Given their controversial and politically sensitive nature, his so-called anti-Trinitarian views were largely kept secret among a small circle of friends. However, Newton trusted Locke enough to send him a very long letter—entitled “Two Notable Corruptions of Scripture”—to present him with the evidence for Newton’s view that the original version of Christianity was corrupted beginning in the 4th century by the introduction of the doctrine of the Trinity (Newton 1959–, vol. 3: 83–129). Locke was apparently sympathetic with Newton’s approach. With respect to their public views, Newton and Locke were often taken to represent two aspects of the same experimental-philosophical approach toward the close of the seventeenth century (Stein 1990; Wilson 1999: 196–214; and Domski 2012). It is perhaps not difficult to understand why, for Newton was mentioned in one of the most famous passages in all of Locke’s writings. In the Epistle to the reader of Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding, we read:

The Commonwealth of Learning, is not at this time without Master-Builders, whose mighty designs, in advancing the sciences, will leave lasting monuments to the admiration of posterity; but every one must not hope to be a Boyle, or a Sydenham; and in an age that produces such masters, as the great Huygenius, and the incomparable Mr. Newton, with some other of that strain; ’tis ambition enough to be employed as an under-labourer in clearing ground a little, and removing some of the rubbish, that lies in the way to knowledge; which certainly had been very much more advanced in the world, if the endeavors of ingenious and industrious men had not been much cumbred with the learned but frivolous use of uncouth, affected, or unintelligible terms, introduced into the sciences, and there made an art of, to that degree, that philosophy, which is nothing but the true knowledge of things, was thought unfit, or uncapable to be brought into well-bred company, and polite conversation. (Locke 1975: 10)

Clearly, Locke seeks in this passage, among other things, to align his work in the Essay with the work of figures such as Newton. Here we find, at the opening of Locke’s magnum opus, the suggestion that he is content to be an “under-labourer”, a thinker who helps to clear the way for the advance of knowledge. But his list of four “master builders”—Boyle, Sydenham, Huygens, and Newton—might strike us as an odd pairing: what do these four have in common exactly? It has recently been argued that Locke regarded the four as representing the new “experimental philosophy”, and that Locke himself should be interpreted as strongly supporting that orientation within natural philosophy more generally (Anstey 2011: 220). This would become a popular conception of Newton’s philosophical approach, one that played a substantial role in the Enlightenment.

Locke may have regarded Newton as a fellow enthusiast for the experimental philosophy, but there are reasons to think that his embrace of the mechanical philosophy presented him with a difficulty in interpreting the consequences of Newton’s theory of universal gravity in the Principia. For Newton’s theory seemed to be in tension with a mechanist constraint on views of causation, at least from Locke’s own point of view. In the first edition of the Essay, Locke articulated a central tenet of mechanist thinking about causation when he wrote: “bodies operate by impulse and nothing else” (Essay, II.viii.11). Impulse refers here to contact action. In correspondence with Locke that would prove to be influential, Bishop Edward Stillingfleet questioned this view from the Essay, contending that Locke must jettison the idea of human liberty if he insists that bodies can operate solely by impulse, presumably on the grounds that the human will cannot be understood to cause bodily action in that manner. In a famous exchange, Locke responded in part by reformulating his commitment to the mechanist view that all causation involving material bodies must be by contact (impulse) alone:

It is true, I say, that ‘bodies operate by impulse and nothing else’. And so I thought when I writ it, and can yet conceive no other way of their operation. But I am since convinced by the judicious Mr. Newton’s incomparable book, that it is too bold a presumption to limit God’s power, in this point, by my narrow conceptions. The gravitation of matter toward matter by ways inconceivable to me, is not only a demonstration that God can, if he pleases, put into bodies, powers and ways of operations, above what can be derived from our idea of body, or can be explained by what we know of matter, but also an unquestionable and every where visible instance, that he has done so. And therefore in the next edition of my book, I shall take care to have that passage rectified. (Locke 1823: vol. 4: 467–8).

This was not merely his privately held view. For instance, near the beginning of his Elements of Natural Philosophy, Locke writes:

Two bodies at a distance will put one another into motion by the force of attraction; which is inexplicable by us, though made evident to us by experience, and so to be taken as a principle in natural philosophy. (Locke 1823: vol. 3: 305)

In this way, Locke held the common view that Newton’s theory of universal gravity was incompatible with the mechanical philosophy—and perhaps, unintelligible to us for that very reason—and when forced to choose between these two options, he evidently sided with Newton, thinking that his theory was supported by “experience”. He did so by endorsing the view that God must have added “powers” or “ways of operations” to material bodies that cannot be derived from our idea of body. Such powers or ways of operations would in this case result in gravitational interactions, presumably amongst bodies that are spatially separated from one another by great distances. Yet from Locke’s point of view, the fact that Newton’s theory convinces him that such powers exist does not entail that that theory renders gravity “conceivable”: even if the theory of universal gravity is correct, it does not allow us to understand how matter—what Locke would call “extended solid substance”—can interact gravitationally with other matter when the bits of matter are not in contact with one another (Downing 1997). So Locke has concluded that bodies can operate on one another through some means other than impulse, but he retains his firmly held belief that any such operation is not intelligible to us. Locke accepted the conclusion that spatially separated bodies causally interact with one another in accordance with the law of universal gravitation, but concluded that the law itself did not render that causal interaction intelligible. This is precisely the kind of reaction to Newton’s theory of universal gravity bemoaned by Leibniz, who would argue that any operations or powers attributed to material bodies must meet the basic criterion of intelligibility established by the mechanist approach; he might also be inclined to argue that any laws regarded as governing the interactions of bodies must also meet that criterion by being derivable in some way from our basic concept of matter (see below). Regardless, this is an excellent example of a case in which Newton’s theory in the Principia had a direct impact on the development of philosophical views of causation in the late seventeenth century.

When the great English natural philosopher Robert Boyle died at the end of 1691, he endowed a lecture series designed to promote Christianity against what Boyle took to be the atheism that had infected English culture after the revolutionary period of the mid-century. Famous Newtonians such as Samuel Clarke and William Whiston would eventually give the Boyle lectures. The first “Boyle lecturer” was the theologian Richard Bentley, who would eventually become the Master of Newton’s alma mater, Trinity College, Cambridge, and who also worked under Locke’s correspondent, Bishop Stillingfleet, himself an admirer of Newton’s (Gascoigne 1985: 65). When preparing his lectures for publication—they had been presented to a public audience in London in 1692—Bentley conferred with Newton, hoping to solicit his help in deciphering enough of the Principia to use its results as a bulwark against atheism (Bentley 1976). Newton obliged, and a famous correspondence between the two began (eventually published as Bentley 1756). The exchange is of great philosophical interest, for Bentley elicited a number of important clarifications that have no peer within Newton’s published oeuvre.

Bentley sought Newton’s assistance in particular because he wanted guidance in divining how the theory of the Principia indicates that the solar system must have been designed by an intelligent agent and could not have arisen through the physical interactions of material bodies. In the first edition of the Principia in 1687, Newton had made such a claim in a very brief statement (Newton 1972: vol. 2: 582–3; Cohen 1971: 154–6). In the second edition of the text (published in 1713), he removed that statement, replacing it with a more extensive discussion in the new section of the text, added to its end, called the “General Scholium” (mentioned above). Through their correspondence, Bentley learned that from Newton’s point of view, the positions of the planets relative to one another—and especially to the sun—indicate that mere chance, or the ordinary physical interactions of the planetary bodies, could not have placed each planet in precisely the right orbit to maintain a solar system like ours for an extended period of time. With this argument, Newton seems to be indicating that mere chance would have produced an unstable planetary system, one in which the planets would eventually either be too strongly attracted to the sun, falling into it, or too weakly attracted, flying off into space. In this episode, a theologian appeals to the new authority of Newtonian natural philosophy when attempting to undermine atheism. And that was apparently the very kind of interchange that Boyle had envisioned when endowing the lecture series.

Newton’s correspondence with Bentley is justly famous for another reason. The criticisms of Newton’s theory of gravity by Leibniz and Huygens, outlined briefly above, would prove essential to the Continental reception of Newtonian natural philosophy more generally in the late seventeenth and early eighteenth centuries. Since Newton held both of these mathematicians in high regard—he tells Leibniz in a 1693 letter that “Huygens is a master, and his remarks on my discoveries are brilliant” (Newton 2004: 108)—one might assume that their criticisms would have pressed Newton into articulating an extensive defense of the possibility of action at a distance. However, Newton presented no such defense, at least not explicitly. In fact, there is evidence that Newton himself may have rejected the possibility of action at a distance, despite the fact that the Principia allows it as a conceptual possibility, if not an empirical reality. The evidence lies in Newton’s correspondence with Bentley. In February of 1693, after receiving three letters from Newton, Bentley wrote an extensive reply that attempted to characterize Newton’s theory of gravity, along with his understanding of the nature of matter, in a way that could be used to undermine various kinds of atheism. With the three earlier letters as his guide, Bentley makes the following estimation of Newton’s understanding of the possibility that gravity could somehow be an essential feature of material bodies:

(2) And as for Gravitation, tis impossible that That should either be coæternal & essential to Matter, or ever acquired by it. Not essential and coæternal to Matter; for then even our System would have been eternal (if gravity could form it) against our Atheist’s supposition & what we have proved in our Last. For let them assign any given time, that Matter convened from a Chaos into our System, they must affirm that before the given time matter gravitated eternally without convening, which is absurd. {Sir, I make account, that your courteous suggestion by your Last, that a Chaos is inconsistent with the Hypothesis of innate Gravity, is included in this paragraph of Mine.} and again, tis unconceivable, that inanimate brute matter should (without a divine impression) operate upon & affect other matter without mutual contact: as it must, if gravitation be essential and inherent in it. (Newton 1959–vol. 3: 249)

In reply to this letter, Newton refers back to this second proposition, making one of the most famous of all his pronouncements concerning the possibility of action at a distance:

The last clause of the second position I like very well. It is inconceivable that inanimate brute matter should, without the mediation of something else which is not material, operate upon and affect other matter without mutual contact, as it must be, if gravitation in the sense of Epicurus, be essential and inherent in it. And this is one reason why I desired you would not ascribe innate gravity to me. That gravity should be innate, inherent, and essential to matter, so that one body may act upon another at a distance through a vacuum, without the mediation of anything else, by and through which their action and force may be conveyed from one to another, is to me so great an absurdity that I believe no man who has in philosophical matters a competent faculty of thinking can ever fall into it. Gravity must be caused by an agent acting constantly according to certain laws; but whether this agent be material or immaterial, I have left open to the consideration of my readers. (Newton 2004: 102–3)[24]

It certainly seems that Newton was uncomfortable with the very idea of action at a distance. But of course, things are not always as they seem in interpretations of difficult philosophical texts: some historians and philosophers have argued strongly that there are other readings of the letter.[25] Rather than rejecting distant action between material bodies per se, they argue, Newton may have been rejecting a particular version of that idea, one associated with the “Epicurean” view that gravity is somehow an essential feature of all material bodies, a stronger view than Newton might wish to endorse. The idea might be roughly as follows: Newton wanted to leave open the possibility that God had endowed bodies with a power to act at a distance on one another, a position that is at least reminiscent of Locke’s view in his correspondence with Stillingfleet (see above). The reason is that Newton held the standard view at the time that matter itself is passive, requiring some kind of divine intervention in order to interact causally with other matter. Again, one finds a Lockean echo of this idea (which may be no accident): Locke sometimes suggests that matter itself is passive in the sense that it cannot move itself; instead, motion must be “superadded” to it by God. If the world consisted solely of a bunch of material objects, say rocks floating in interstellar space, then they would not experience any changes in their states of motion unless some external force acted upon them. Left to its own devices, matter is passive and does not move. To argue, as some “Epicurean” philosophers may have done, that matter itself essentially contains gravity as a feature, is to deny that matter is passive; it is to suggest that the rocks in interstellar space would attract one another and begin to move “on their own”, without any external force influencing them. And this, in turn, might lead us on a slippery slope to atheism, for on this view, matter would act on its own, without any divine intervention. Or so Bentley and Newton might be interpreted.

Clearly, one reasonable motive for uncovering a nuanced interpretation of Newton’s letter to Bentley is the obvious fact that Newton apparently regarded action at a distance as perfectly possible when writing the Principia. Indeed, it is difficult to reconcile the Principia with the Bentley correspondence. One can argue that although he left open the possibility of action at a distance in his main work, Newton himself did not accept that possibility because of his more general commitments. The debate on such matters continues unabated. However, regardless of Newton’s personal attitude toward distant action among material bodies, his mechanist interlocutors and readers continued to object to the physical theory outlined in Book III of the Principia on the grounds that, at the very least, it left open the conceptual possibility of a kind of action that cannot in fact exist anywhere in nature. That remained one of Leibniz’s principal objections against Newtonian natural philosophy throughout the last twenty years of his life, animating his correspondence with numerous figures, including most prominently the Newtonian theologian and philosopher Samuel Clarke.

6. The aftermath of the Principia II: debates with Leibniz

In many ways, Leibniz and Newton grew up in the same philosophical environment. Each came of age during the heyday of Cartesianism, and each argued in particular that Cartesian views in natural philosophy failed to include a sufficiently robust conception of the forces of bodies in nature. Force would lie at the center of Newton’s mature physics (Westfall 1971), and would become even more central to Leibniz’s thinking, playing an essential role in his metaphysics as well (Garber 2012). Indeed, in Leibniz’s criticisms of Cartesian physics involving what was later called the vis viva controversy (Smith 2006) and in Newton’s mature physics, each argued that Descartes and his followers had failed to understand the importance of the notion of force. Leibniz and Newton knew one another as mathematicians already in the 1670s, and as we have seen, Leibniz discussed Newton’s first optical work with Huygens. But after the publication of the Principia in 1687, their philosophical relationship, which was marked originally by respectful disagreement, began to develop in earnest. Just two years after the Principia appeared, Leibniz published his Essay on the Causes of Celestial Motions (or Tentamen), and then in 1693, the two corresponded with one another on mathematical and philosophical issues (Newton 2004: 106–9). Leibniz initiated their discussion in March of 1693: after highlighting Newton’s “astonishing discovery” that the elliptical planetary orbits found by Kepler can be the result of gravitational attraction within the solar system, Leibniz contends that these motions must be caused by “the motion of a fluid medium” (Newton 2004: 106). He had described such a fluid medium, or vortex, in detail in his own Essay. The background to Leibniz’s comment is his unwavering commitment—one shared by Huygens, whose theory of gravity’s cause Leibniz mentions in the same letter—to the mechanist requirement that all changes in motion must be the result of material impact. Thus for Leibniz, one can (e.g.) speak of the sun as attracting the earth as a façon de parler, but in fact the cause of the earth’s acceleration, of its true motion around the sun, is its interaction with a fluid medium. (Descartes was also a famous proponent of a vortex theory of planetary motion—Aiton 1972: 30–64; Gaukroger 2002: 150–3.) When he replied in October of 1693, however, Newton did not accept Leibniz’s philosophical olive branch. Leibniz had insisted that the vortex theory of planetary motion “would not at all detract from the value and truth of your discovery” that Kepler’s ellipses result simply from the conception of attraction or gravitation (Newton 2004: 107). This olive branch was important because earlier vortex theorists, especially Descartes, had failed to account for Kepler’s laws, so Leibniz was crediting Newton with advancing astronomy in this respect (and indeed, he attempted to reflect Kepler’s results in his Tentamen). But Newton brushed aside the olive branch, noting that vortices would disturb the motions of planets and comets through the solar system. He writes that some “very fine” matter fills the heavens, adding:

For since celestial motions are more regular than if they arose from vortices and observe other laws, so much so that vortices contribute not to the regulation but the disturbance of the motions of planets and comets; and since all phenomena of the heavens and of the sea follow precisely, so far as I am aware, from nothing but gravity acting in accordance with the laws described by me; and since nature is very simple, I have myself concluded that all other causes are to be rejected and that the heavens are to be stripped as far as may be of all matter, lest the motions of planets and comets be hindered or rendered irregular. But if, meanwhile, someone explains gravity along with all its laws by the action of some subtle matter, and shows that the motion of planets and comets will not be disturbed by this matter, I shall be far from objecting. (Newton 2004: 108–9)

This is a passage rich with meaning. Leibniz clearly insisted that vortices, or some physical object or fluid, must be in contact with the planetary orbits if we are to explain why they deviate from the tangents along the orbital paths when circling the sun. Newton’s reply is that giant swirling fluids in the heavens would actually disturb the regular orbital paths and the paths of comets through the solar system. That reply might be thought of as empirical in character, for it depends on observational data regarding the actual paths of the heavenly bodies. But Leibinz’s perspective is obviously not merely empirical in character: he does not postulate vortices (or anything akin to them) on observational grounds; he infers their existence because he thinks we know (perhaps we can add, we know a priori) that physical bodies such as comets or planets can deviate from a rectilinear path—they can accelerate—only if some other physical item impacts upon them. Newton has a reply to that kind of view as well: he insists that the phenomena of the motion of the heavenly bodies “follows” solely from gravity itself—an impressed force, as we have seen, and therefore an “action”—in accordance with the laws of motion and the law of universal gravitation. Since gravity is an action—clearly, a causal notion—it seems clear that Newton’s answer to Leibniz’s idea that vortices cause the planetary orbits is that gravity itself causes them. It is not much of a leap to conclude, in turn, that this reply commits Newton to the idea that bodies involved in gravitational interactions, such as the sun and the earth, act at a distance on one another through the force of gravity. It is not hard to divine why Leibniz (and Huygens) would have concluded that Newton had relinquished any commitment to the norms of the mechanical philosophy.

Despite Leibniz’s (and Huygens’s) criticisms of his theory of gravity in particular, and his methods in natural philosophy in general, Newton stuck to his guns. Nearly twenty years after their illuminating exchange in 1693, Leibniz and Newton narrowly missed a second opportunity to discuss their philosophical differences directly. In May of 1712, Leibniz published a letter to Nicholas Hartsoeker that was highly critical of the Newtonians; it was published in English translation in the Memoirs of Literature, a journal to which Roger Cotes, the editor of the Principia’s second edition, held a subscription (Newton 2004: 109). After Cotes brought Leibniz’s criticisms to Newton’s attention—especially the claim that the Principia renders gravitation a “perpetual miracle” because it does not specify the physical mechanism underlying it—Newton wrote an intriguing, but only posthumously published, rebuttal. Here is part of Newton’s paraphrase of Leibniz’s original letter:

But he [i.e., Leibniz] goes on and tells us that God could not create planets that should move round of themselves without any cause that should prevent their removing through the tangent. For a miracle at least must keep the planet in. (Newton 2004: 117)

Newton’s response to this Leibnizian charge is illuminating:

But certainly God could create planets that should move round of themselves without any other cause than gravity that should prevent their removing through the tangent. For gravity without a miracle may keep the planets in. (ibid.)

Thus Newton repeats the view he mentions to Leibniz in 1693, viz., that the force of gravity itself causes the planets to follow their orbital paths rather than their inertial trajectories along the tangents to those orbits, independently of any fluid medium in the heavens. But in this posthumously published letter, Newton did not merely repeat his basic understanding of gravity from his 1693 exchange with Leibniz; he also included a wider discussion of mechanist norms within philosophy more generally. Again, Newton begins by quoting Leibniz:

But Mr. Leibniz goes on. “The ancients and the moderns, who own that gravity is an occult quality, are in the right, if they mean by it that there is a certain mechanism unknown to them whereby all bodies tend towards the center of the earth. But if they mean that the thing is performed without any mechanism by a simple primitive quality or by a law of God who produces that effect without using any intelligible means, it is an unreasonable and occult quality, and so very occult that it is impossible that it should ever be done though an angel or God himself should undertake to explain it”. (Newton 2004: 116)

In this passage, Leibniz returns to the kind of criticism that he would present against the “superaddition” view that Locke presented to Stillingfleet, arguing that philosophers must reject the idea that gravity could simply be a feature of bodies that God adds to them, despite the fact that we cannot possibly understand gravitational interactions based on our idea of body (our idea of extended solid substances, or another similar idea). Indeed, Leibniz raises the stakes by contending that God himself could not explicate how such interactions are possible based on the idea of matter. Leibniz would argue, perhaps on metaphysical grounds, that any laws said to govern the interaction of bodies, and any qualities attributed to bodies, must be intelligible in the terms available to philosophers through the mechanist orientation. In particular, laws and qualities must be intelligible in terms of the shape, size, motion and impenetrability (or solidity) of bodies. In this way, one might conclude that Locke and Leibniz actually do not necessarily disagree on whether gravity can be made intelligible in mechanist terms; they simply disagree on the propriety of the contention that God could “superadd” a feature to bodies that cannot be made intelligible in that way.

Newton’s reply to Leibniz’s argument is illuminating. Instead of presenting a narrow defense of his view, perhaps by denying that he has postulated any non-mechanical causation with his theory of gravity, he challenges the mechanical philosophy itself by contending that it should not be understood as holding for all natural phenomena:

The same ought to be said of hardness. So then gravity and hardness must go for unreasonable occult qualities unless they can be explained mechanically. And why may not the same be said of the vis inertiae [force of inertia] and the extension, the duration and mobility of bodies, and yet no man ever attempted to explain these qualities mechanically, or took them for miracles or supernatural things or fictions or occult qualities. They are the natural, real, reasonable, manifest qualities of all bodies seated in them by the will of God from the beginning of the creation and perfectly incapable of being explained mechanically, and so may be the hardness of primitive particles of bodies. And therefore if any man should say that bodies attract one another by a power whose cause is unknown to us, or by a power seated in the frame of nature by the will of God, or by a power seated in a substance in which bodies move and float without resistance and which has therefore no vis inertiae but acts by other laws than those that are mechanical: I know not why he should be said to introduce miracles and occult qualities and fictions into the world. For Mr. Leibniz himself will scarce say that thinking is mechanical as it must be if to explain it otherwise be to make a miracle, an occult quality, and a fiction. (Newton 2004: 116)

The first aspect of Newton’s argument is to indicate that mechanical explanations are predicated on referencing certain kinds of qualities when investigating natural phenomena, and that these qualities themselves are therefore not subject to mechanical explanation. For instance, since mechanist explanations—say, of the way in which magnets attract iron filings across a table—must refer to qualities such as the extension of the bodies subject to the explanations, then we cannot give a mechanist explanation of extension itself. Of course, Leibniz might reply that we need not provide any explanation of the basic qualities of bodies that figure in mechanical explanations, for those properties have been chosen by the “moderns” precisely because they are perfectly intelligible on their own, perhaps unlike various qualities attributed to “Scholastic” accounts of natural phenomena. The second aspect of Newton’s argument is more intriguing—it also harkens back to Locke’s discussion with Stillingfleet, for Locke had contended that God may have superadded not only gravity to material bodies, but also the power of thought, linking them because he believed that neither could be rendered intelligible using any philosophical means at his disposal. That is, from Locke’s point of view, we know that human beings—which are, or at least contain, material bodies with size, shape, motion and solidity, along with parts characterized by those qualities—are capable of thought, but since we cannot discern how any material thing could possibly have that capacity, we conclude that God may have superadded that feature to us, or to our bodies. Thought and gravity are dis-analogous in the sense that we did not require anything like Newton’s theory to convince us that human beings can think, but they are otherwise analogous. Newton then attempts to make the following argument: since Leibniz would have to agree that thinking is not a mechanical process, and not mechanically explicable, he must agree that there is at least one aspect of the world that has the following two features, (1) it is not mechanical; and, (2) it is clearly not to be rejected on that ground alone. He attempts to liken gravity (as he understands it) to thinking (as he believes Leibniz is required to understand it), arguing that despite the fact that it is not mechanical—it cannot be explained mechanically—it should not be rejected on that ground. This argument may be predicated on the view that human beings, material things, or at least partially material things, do the thinking, rather than immaterial things, such as minds or souls, for if one attributes all thought to an immaterial mind or soul, then there is no pressure to say that anything in nature, or perhaps even any aspect of anything in nature, has a feature that cannot be mechanically explicated. If one accepts Locke’s view (apparently also endorsed by Newton) that we should attribute thinking to material things, or to aspects of material things, then perhaps Newton has successfully followed Locke in likening gravity to thought, thereby making room for aspects of nature that are not mechanical after all. This vexing issue would continue to generate debates amongst Newton’s and Leibniz’s various followers in England, and on the Continent, respectively.

Leibniz’s most extensive debate with the Newtonians would not occur until the very end of his life. His celebrated correspondence with Samuel Clarke, Newton’s friend and supporter in London in the early part of the eighteenth century, is his most famous interaction with the Newtonians, occurring right before his death in 1716 (Clarke and Leibniz 1717). Leibniz fomented the correspondence in November of 1715 by sending a brief, provocative letter to Princess Caroline of Wales, one designed to provoke a response from Newton’s circle in London. Leibniz knew well that Princess Caroline was a leading intellectual and political figure in England at the time, one who would surely be concerned by Leibniz’s shocking claims about the religious consequences of Newtonian thinking. He opens his initial letter by mentioning both Locke and Newton, along with the issues about materiality and thinking that arose in his near exchange with Newton in 1712:

Natural religion itself seems to decay [in England] very much. Many will have human souls to be material; others make God himself a corporeal being. Mr. Locke and his followers are uncertain at least whether the soul is not material and naturally perishable. Sir Isaac Newton says that space is an organ which God makes use of to perceive things by. But if God stands in need of any organ to perceive things by, it will follow that they do not depend altogether on him, nor were produced by him. (Clarke and Leibniz 1717: L 1: 1–3)

Thus Leibniz charges both Lockeans and Newtonians with presenting philosophical views of the human and of the divine that lead to theologically unsavory consequences, such as the idea that the human soul might be material and the view that God must employ something akin to an organ in order to perceive happenings in the world. These were fighting words. Although Locke had died in 1704, he had various followers in England at the time (Gascoigne 1985: 172–3), and Newton himself was at the height of his influence: he had by then been knighted, as Leibniz acknowledges by calling him “Sir” in his letter, and was at that time President of the Royal Society. Moreover, Samuel Clarke had given the Boyle lectures in 1704 and again in 1705, so he was a public figure associated with the state of Christianity in England. Once Clarke took the bait, replying that same month to Leibniz’s charges, Locke’s views quickly dropped from view and the two focused specifically on Leibniz’s numerous objections to Newtonian ideas and methods. But why did Clarke respond on Newton’s behalf, and what was Newton’s actual role in the correspondence? These questions continue to puzzle scholars (see Cohen and Koyré 1962; Bertoloni Meli 1999 and 2002; Vailati 1997). There is no documentary evidence, such as letters, between Clarke and Newton indicating the contours of his role; then again, at this time, both men lived in London and Clarke was Newton’s parish priest, so the lack of letters or other papers is perhaps unsurprising. That fact alone is intriguing, for the theological differences between the two are salient: since Newton was a committed anti-Trinitarian—a fact known to figures like Locke and to others such as William Whiston—he may have decided that Leibniz’s contentions about “natural religion” in England would best be answered by what we might now call a more mainstream theological figure like Clarke. In any event, there is no doubt that Clarke was taken by Leibniz and his followers to be speaking for Newton and his circle. Nonetheless, there are certainly aspects of Clarke’s views that may deviate from Newton’s own opinions, so it would be unwise to (as it were) remove Clarke from our conception of the correspondence by regarding it effectively as Newton’s work.

Leibniz’s side of the correspondence with Clarke is methodologically characteristic: he leaves much of his own systematic and complex metaphysical theorizing—including the monadology—in the background, bringing to the fore only those elements that are both necessary for his criticisms of the Newtonians and also likely to garner support from Clarke. Thus the key to many of Leibniz’s criticisms is the principle of sufficient reason (PSR), which he knows Clarke will endorse (although with a distinct conception of its scope: Leibniz asserts, while Clarke denies, that the principle demands that each act of divine willing requires a reason; for Clarke, divine willing itself is reason enough for some physical state of affairs to obtain, or event to occur). Leibniz argues in particular that several key aspects of the Newtonian worldview are simply incompatible with the PSR, including the idea of absolute space. If space were in fact completely independent of all physical objects and all relations among them, as the Newtonians seem to assert, then a problem arises:

I have many demonstrations to confute the fancy of those who take space to be a substance or at least an absolute being. But I shall only use, at present, one demonstration, which the author here gives me occasion to insist upon. I say, then, that if space were an absolute being, something would happen for which it would be impossible that there should be a sufficient reason—which is against my axiom. And I prove it thus: space is something absolutely uniform, and without the things placed in it, one point of space absolutely does not differ in any respect whatsoever from another point of space. Now from this it follows (supposing space to be something in itself, besides the order of bodies among themselves) that it is impossible there should be a reason why God, preserving the same situations of bodies among themselves, should have placed them in space after one certain particular manner and not otherwise—why everything was not placed the quite contrary way, for instance, by changing east into west. But if space is nothing else but this order or relation, and is nothing at all without bodies but the possibility of placing them, then those two states, the one such as it is now, the other supposed to be the quite contrary way, would not at all differ from one another. Their difference therefore is only to be found in our chimerical supposition of the reality of space. (Clarke and Leibniz 1717: L 3: 5)

Leibniz’s argument is clever at the outset: he bypasses the thorny problem of determining whether Newton’s idea of absolute space commits him to thinking of space as a substance—a view, incidentally, which Newton explicitly considers and rejects in De Gravitatione (Newton 2004: 21–2)—by presupposing only that Newton thinks of space as existing independently of objects and their relations. If space is indeed independent in this way, then it would seem that God faces a choice: when creating the world, or matter, why place (e.g.) the earth in one particular part of space rather than any other? The parts of space, independently of all objects and all relations, obviously do not differ from one another in any respect at all, so it would seem that one could not even theoretically devise a reason for placing the earth anywhere in particular, as opposed to anywhere else . (This argument, incidentally, does not depend on our having the capacity to refer to places within empty space.) But since space exists, with all its places, independently of the earth and everything else, then God must indeed have some reason to place the earth in one place rather than another—for Leibniz, even the divine will is inert independent of any reason for (as it were) moving in one direction rather than another. Finally, Leibniz argues that he himself avoids this problem by asserting that space is nothing above and beyond the objects in the world and all possible relations amongst them (hence he holds a kind of modal relationalist view, in more modern terminology). God faces no problematic choice on this view, since space does not exist prior to the creation of the world, or of material objects: to create objects with spatial relations is ipso facto to create space itself, for it is nothing over and above objects and their relations. If you like, space for Leibniz just is a way of conceptually grasping all objects and all possible relations amongst them, all at once. Time, similarly, is a way of grasping the whole series of events that have characterized history. Clarke’s reply is somewhat disappointing: he blocks Leibniz’s inference by simply denying that the divine will must have a reason to place (say) the earth in one place rather than another (Clarke and Leibniz 1717: C 3: 5). The PSR is not violated in this case, according to Clarke’s interpretation of it, because it requires only this: if the earth appears in one place rather than another, there must be a reason that it appears there, and the reason in this case is simply the divine will; there is no further question about why the divine being made a particular choice rather than another. In the quotation above, Leibniz speaks of the Newtonians as endorsing “the reality of space”, which Leibniz regards as “chimerical”. This remark highlights another important aspect of Leibniz’s conception of space and time, one that is often ignored in contemporary discussions, which tend to emphasize Leibnizian “relationalism” in opposition to Newtonian “absolutism”. Leibniz’s view of space and time connects intimately with broader aspects of his metaphysical positions: unlike ordinary physical objects, which are constituted by their parts (they are discrete), and which exhibit features that involve internal distinctions amongst those parts, he thinks of space and time as continuous and homogeneous. Leaving aside the monadology, as he does in his correspondence with Clarke, this means that for Leibniz, it is physical objects that are real things; space and time are merely “ideal” or abstract entities whose continuity and homogeneity signal this special status. It is not merely that space and time are nothing over and above the events and relations of objects that exist in our world; it is also the case that they are ideal: they depend in some way on the human mind for their existence. Or so Leibniz seems to suggest. This aspect of his view would become of central importance to later (e.g. Kant’s) conceptions of the Leibniz-Newton debate on the nature of space.

Obviously, Leibniz’s arguments against the Newtonians highlighted a fundamental difference between his interpretation of the PSR and Clarke’s: where Leibniz held what we might call the “rationalist” view that all willing, all choice, must occur for a reason—a requirement from which even the divine being is not exempt—Clarke held what we might call the “voluntarist” view that willing, or choice, itself need not occur for any reason, for it is itself a sufficient reason for some states of affairs to obtain or event to occur. From Leibniz’s point of view, this renders the will, including the divine will, opaque or unintelligible: if an agent can act or make a choice without having any reason for it, then surely the agent is not rational, and if the PSR demands anything of the world, it is that the world be rationally intelligible to us. This requirement must hold of agents and their wills as well. But from Clarke’s point of view, this requirement is too stringent, especially in the divine case: if we hold that even God must have a reason for choosing to create one state of affairs rather than another—for choosing, say, to part the Red Sea rather than the Mississippi River—then we are ipso facto restricting God’s freedom. Surely God has the freedom to choose to do anything at all, or at least, anything that does not contain or instantiate a contradiction, and for his part, Leibniz agrees that the principle of contradiction does not entail the PSR—the latter is a separate and independent principle which is necessary for metaphysics and natural philosophy to extend beyond mathematics, which requires only the principle of contradiction (Clarke and Leibniz 1717: L 2: 1). But he thinks that Clarke’s view leaves us with a God, and indeed with ordinary agents, who can act arbitrarily, with no reason at all. That is not the kind of freedom that philosophy seeks; it wishes to see agents as engaged in rational action. In their differing interpretations of the PSR, and their correspondingly distinct conceptions of freedom and reason, the debate between Leibniz and Clarke hits rock bottom.

Leibniz’s criticisms of the Newtonians were not restricted to questions about the nature of space and time; he also revived his old complaint—one shared by Huygens, as we have seen above—that Newton’s physical theory commits him to the possibility, if not to the reality, of action at a distance among the planetary bodies. In one passage in his fourth letter, for instance, Leibniz writes (Clarke and Leibniz 1717: L 4: 45):

It is also a supernatural thing that bodies should attract one another at a distance without any intermediate means and that a body should move around without receding in the tangent, though nothing hinders it from so receding. For these effects cannot be explained by the nature of things.

As a defender of the mechanical philosophy, Leibniz insists here, as he had before, that a material body like the Earth would recede along the tangent to its orbit if it were not impacted upon by some physical body or bodies, such as a vortex or another kind of fluid filling the solar system. Clarke’s reply to this charge is especially illuminating (Clarke and Leibniz 1717: C 4: 45):

That one body should attract another without any intermediate means, is indeed not a miracle, but a contradiction: for ‘tis supposing something to act where it is not. But the means by which two bodies attract each other may be invisible and intangible, and of a different nature from mechanism, and yet, acting regularly and constantly, may well be called natural, being much less wonderful than animal motion, which yet is never called a miracle’.

This passage is bound to confuse readers. On the one hand, Clarke is clearly arguing that the Newtonians refuse to restrict their understanding of causal interactions in nature to mechanical cases; on the other, however, he does not accept what many at that time would have regarded as the obvious implication of this denial of mechanism, namely that action at a distance is perfectly possible (a move embraced by some later in the eighteenth century, such as Kant). Instead, Clarke not only rejects action at a distance, as Newton possibly had before him; he contends that it isn’t even logically possible! In his various pronouncements to Bentley and others, Newton never contended that action at a distance was simply a contradiction and therefore impossible, presumably even for the divine being, who is typically said to be capable of creating any situation that does not instantiate a contradiction (although Descartes’s views on the eternal truths are obviously more complicated). Clarke’s view raises a serious problem for Newtonians: if action at a distance is simply a contradiction, and therefore not a possible physical situation, even with divine intervention, then how should one interpret the theory of universal gravity, which certainly appears to indicate that distant action is perfectly possible, and perhaps even actual? If we interpret the theory as postulating actual distant action, say between the moon and the earth, then it clearly must be mistaken; but even if we interpret it less strongly, as merely postulating that distant action between the moon and the earth is possible, that would presumably disqualify the theory as well. Perhaps one can save Clarke’s view by contending that since distant action is logically impossible, Newton’s theory must therefore be interpreted as neutral on that issue. This is one issue where Clarke’s views may differ substantially from Newton’s own. Regardless of whether Clarke represented Newton’s own views faithfully, there is no doubt that his correspondence with Leibniz helped to shape the agenda of philosophy in the eighteenth century.

7. Newton’s impact on philosophy

The history of eighteenth-century philosophy cannot be written without extensive discussion of Newton’s own views and of his influence on the views of other figures both in England and on the Continent. As we have seen, when Newton was a young student at Trinity College, Cambridge, Cartesian views in natural philosophy and much else besides had replaced the ideas and methods of Aristotle and his followers as the most important subject for discussion amongst philosophers. In many ways, Newton eventually succeeded in convincing philosophers that his own ideas and methods were superior to those of the Cartesians—especially when it came to thinking about motion and its causes—but this historical fact did not mean that Newtonianism, even broadly construed, became the dominant trend in natural philosophy during Newton’s lifetime. On the contrary, Newton’s views continued to be the subject of intense scrutiny and debate. As we have seen, this was true amongst Leibniz and his followers (such as Christiaan Wolff) and among fellow mechanists (such as Huygens). Indeed, a late-seventeenth-century debate between Cartesian and Newtonian ideas was supplanted by an early eighteenth century debate between Leibnizian and Newtonian views; the latter debate would continue in one form or another for the rest of the century. But even amongst leading Continental mathematicians, some of Newton’s most basic ideas, for instance concerning the forces of nature, remained the subject of dispute until well into the eighteenth century. To give just one prominent example that influenced the development of philosophy, D’Alembert and Euler, two of the greatest mathematicians of the Enlightenment, had opposite reactions to Newton’s idea that the mass of an object could also be referred to by the “very significant name” of the vis inertiae, or force of inertia (Newton 1999, 404—see below for details). These discussions, along with numerous other debates about space, time, motion were a driving force during the French Enlightenment. They remained a powerful stimulant to philosophical theorizing in the 1770s and 1780s, when Kant forged his magisterial “critical” system of philosophy, an approach that almost single-handedly set the philosophical agenda of the early nineteenth century. Hence Newton’s influence on the eighteenth century did not take the form of a single philosophical program or movement; instead, it was the controversial nature of his ideas and methodology that drove much of the philosophical discussion.

Newton’s ideas and methods were certainly most influential in Britain, where there grew to be a strong “Newtonian” movement—also called the “experimental philosophy” program—by roughly 1700. By the fin de siecle, it is probably safe to say that natural philosophy had become heavily Newtonian in England, at least in the sense that it had eclipsed both Cartesianism (Henry 2013: 124 and introduction to Voltaire 1738 [1992, 7]), and other local movements, such as Cambridge Platonism, which had exhibited a strong influence during the previous generation. One might put the point somewhat differently: to the extent that there was a dominant strand in England by 1700, it was the “experimental philosophy”, a view that was associated strongly with figures such as Boyle, Newton and Locke. Figures such as Hobbes had opposed this approach to solving philosophical problems, but had failed to gain nearly as much influence. Perhaps more importantly, Newton’s view of motion, his understanding of space and time, and his approach to achieving knowledge of natural phenomena, helped to shape the agenda of British philosophy for the next fifty years. In addition to Newton’s influence on Locke’s thinking about matter and causation, explored above, both Berkeley and Hume expended considerable energy grappling with the wider consequences and implications of the Newtonian version of the experimental philosophy. For his part, Berkeley famously derided many Newtonians methods and ideas—sometimes exempting Newton himself from his conception of the worst philosophical excesses of his followers—including the rise of the calculus among mathematicians (in The Analyst) and the use of the idea of a force as the basic causal concept in natural philosophy (in De Motu—both reprinted in Berkeley 1992). Berkeley’s theory of ideas, which arose in part from his reflections of what we would now call Locke’s “empiricist” notion of representation, suggested to him that no idea can be abstract: each idea must represent a particular rather than a universal. Hence we can have an idea of a particular car, say a yellow two-door sports car, but not of a car in general, one with no specific characteristics. Similarly, we can have an idea of a particular shade of yellow, perhaps because we’ve just seen a lovely yellow rose at the florist, but not of yellow in general; and so on. Berkeley then argued that modern mathematics, especially the calculus, and modern natural philosophy, especially Newtonian versions of it, were often reliant on abstract ideas, and therefore philosophically suspect. For instance, he contended that the very idea of absolute motion was suspect because we can represent to ourselves only various motions with particular features related to particular bodies in motion, but “absolute” motion cannot be rendered particular in anything like this way; it remains abstract (Downing 2005: 235). Thus although Newtonian views were considered to be essential to the rise of experimental philosophy in Britain, Berkeley derided them as insufficiently experimental, or empirical, as overly reliant on representations of universals and of universal quantities, rather than on the representation of particulars. In a reflection of Malebranche’s influence, Berkeley also argued that some Newtonians wrongly attributed genuine causal powers to ordinary material objects through their use of the concept of impressed force; wrongly, because Berkeley firmly rejected the notion that any body could exert any causal power. All causation in Berkeley’s system is due either to the intervention of the divine in the course of history, or to spirits or minds, which are genuinely causally active. Finally, in an argument that would prefigure Mach’s reactions to Newtonian conceptions of space, time and motion in the late nineteenth century—which were expressive of a broad commitment to “empiricism”—Berkeley contended that absolute space is a metaphysical aberration: philosophers should not posit any entity or thing that is beyond all possible perception. In sum, Berkeley was highly critical of many aspects of the Newtonian program, but for that very reason, it was Newton’s ideas that helped to shape many of his philosophical projects.

For his part, Hume had a more nuanced reaction to the emergence of the Newtonian program (cf. Schliesser 2007 and DePierris 2012). He certainly signaled his endorsement of the experimental philosophy—itself strongly associated with the Newtonians, along with figures like Boyle and Hooke, as we have seen—when he gave his Treatise the following subtitle: “being an attempt to introduce the experimental method of reasoning into moral subjects”. And one might argue that Hume made a kind of Lockean move when he chose to endorse the Newtonian program specifically in preference to the mechanical philosophy, which he regarded with suspicion. A famous comment from his History of England bolsters this interpretation:

While Newton seemed to draw off the veil from some of the mysteries of nature, he showed at the same time the imperfections of the mechanical philosophy; and thereby restored her ultimate secrets to that obscurity, in which they ever did and ever will remain. (Hume 1854 [1754–61]: vol. 5: 374)

The difference between Locke and Hume might be that the former, unlike the latter, nonetheless insisted that mechanism continued to provide philosophers with a canon for the intelligibility of causation within nature (Hume’s critique of earlier conceptions of causation, including Locke’s, is certainly well known). Hume also expended considerable effort in interpreting some of the philosophical aspects or consequences of Newton’s theory of gravity and his corresponding understanding of the nature of matter. In particular, he wished to provide what we would now call an empiricist interpretation of Newton’s three laws of motion, his concept of mass (quantity of matter), and his understanding of gravity; in the process, he does not shy away from interpreting Newton’s sometimes confusing notion of the vis inertiae or force of inertia. When students learn the canonical idea of a Newtonian force, they learn about what Newton called a vis impressa, an impressed force. They also learn that the mass of a body is not a force at all. But in all three editions of the Principia, Newton himself said that although the mass of a body is not an impressed force, it could be called by the “very significant name of force of inertia” because bodies with mass with resist acceleration (Newton 1999, 404). And to resist acceleration seemed to Newton like an action that a body performs, say when some other body collides with it. Now for Hume, this issue was particularly difficult because he had already contended that strictly speaking, we have no idea (no representation) of force or power—these are merely words employed by natural philosophers without any ideas corresponding to them. Thus he must find an interpretation of Newton that is not predicated on our ability to form an idea of forces or powers. In a famous footnote in his Enquiry Concerning Human Understanding, he writes (Hume 1777 [1993: §vii.i note 2, 48–49]):

I need not examine at length the vis inertiae which is so much talked of in the new philosophy, and which is ascribed to matter. We find by experience, that a body at rest or in motion continues for ever in its present state, till put from it by some new cause; and that a body impelled takes as much motion from the impelling body as it acquires itself. These are facts. When we call this a vis inertiae, we only mark these facts, without pretending to have any idea of the inert power; in the same manner as, when we talk of gravity, we mean certain effects, without comprehending that active power. It was never the meaning of Sir ISAAC NEWTON to rob second causes of all force or energy; though some of his followers have endeavoured to establish that theory upon his authority. On the contrary, that great philosopher had recourse to an ethereal active fluid to explain his universal attraction; though he was so cautious and modest as to allow, that it was a mere hypothesis, not to be insisted on, without more experiments.

In mentioning Newton’s speculation that an aether might explain universal gravity in some sense (for instance, in query 21 to the Opticks), Hume does not appear to be concerned about action at a distance; instead, he is concerned to argue that this speculation indicates that Newton himself did not regard his theory as requiring that we attribute a “power” of gravity to material bodies. This is important for Hume to establish, not least because he believes that we can form no representation at all of any such power. Similarly, when Newton indicates in the Principia that we can conceive of a body’s quantity of matter as its vis inertiae, its power of resisting any change to its state of motion (Newton 1999: 404–5), he is not attributing any power to that body, but rather employing a means of characterizing its behavior. Or so Hume contends. In this specific regard, we find an echo of Berkeley’s earlier work: in De Motu, Berkeley argues in particular that although some philosophers misunderstand the Newtonian theory of gravity as attributing a special force or nature to material objects, there is an interpretation of Newton that is consistent with the new theory of ideas. He writes (Berkeley 1992: De Motu, §6):

Again, force, gravity, and terms of that sort are more often used in the concrete (and rightly so) so as to connote the body in motion, the effort of resisting, etc. But when they are used by philosophers to signify certain natures carved out and abstracted from all these things, natures which are not objects of sense, nor can be grasped by any force of intellect, nor pictured by the imagination, then indeed they breed errors and confusion.

There is little doubt, then, that the new British philosophy represented by Locke, Berkeley, and Hume in the early-to-mid eighteenth century was concerned to present interpretations of Newton’s work that were consistent with their overarching philosophical commitments, principles and methods, or to alter those commitments, principles and methods as necessary.

These attempts by canonical philosophers like Berkeley and Hume to find what they regarded as a defensible interpretation of Newtonian forces are mirrored by similar attempts in the writings of leading mathematicians. For instance, the very same issue discussed by Hume had already been debated by two of the leading figures in Continental science, D’Alembert and Euler. For his part, in his famous work, the Traité de dynamique (1743), D’Alembert expressed a view that is very similar to Hume’s (in certain respects). He proclaimed right at the outset that he wished to develop a physics that would dispense with the concept of a force altogether on the grounds that it was an “obscure” idea. He would “reduce all the principles of mechanics to three, the force of inertia, compound motion, and equilibrium” (D’Alembert 1743, 3). He immediately explained the first item: the reason that he could accept Newton’s force of inertia is that it’s characterized as a property of bodies, one in virtue of which they follow the laws of motion, rather than a force or power. So it was not an obscure notion. Ironically, the great Swiss mathematician Euler had precisely the opposite reaction: from his point of view, the “force of inertia” was simply a misnomer, for it was not a force at all and should therefore be expunged from physics altogether. Instead, physics should employ only the idea of an impressed force, a cause of acceleration, which he regarded as a perfectly clear idea. Of course, history was on Euler’s side, indeed so much so that future generations would not even imagine that so many leading philosophers and mathematicians during the Enlightenment debated this topic.

In other respects, in France the intellectual situation was rather different than in England. Cartesian ideas held sway for many decades after Newton first emerged on the scene in the 1670s with his optics papers and in the late 1680s with the Principia; they were especially popular at the Académie Royale des Sciences, unlike the situation in the Royal Society (Henry 2013: 120). Voltaire became famous for challenging the Cartesian French orthodoxy, traveling to England for a celebrated visit and bringing home “enlightened” ideas about philosophy, politics, and much else besides in an attempt to foment the emergence and development of a French Newtonian program. His most important publication in this regard is probably the Elements of the philosophy of Newton (Voltaire 1738/1992), which attempts to signal the “errors” of Descartes and to highlight the advantages of the Newtonian program in “Physique”. Of course, Cartesian ideas and methods retained numerous adherents and defenders in France, and so the debate between Cartesian and Newtonian ideas flourished in that environment (cf. Aiton 1972: ch. 8). But even in France, Cartesianism eventually gave way to a newer version of metaphysics associated with Leibniz and his German follower and expositor, Wolff. In 1740, Émilie du Châtelet, published a key text, Institutions de physique, or Foundations of physics (see especially the analysis in Brading 2019). In her text—which was republished in a second edition in 1742 and swiftly translated into German and Italian—she makes precisely the kind of argument that presses Hume a few years later to articulate a conception of the vis inertiae that is consistent with the experimental philosophy. She argues that the Cartesian view that extension is the essence of body is mistaken; we must conceive of material objects as exhibiting a “force d’inertie” if we are to understand their physical interactions properly (Du Châtelet 1742: ch. 1, §2). Perhaps not surprisingly, D’Alembert cites her text approvingly in his Treatise on Dynamics. From Du Châtelet’s point of view, this Newtonian conception of body is not inherently problematic. Problems arise, however, when some Newtonians interpret the theory of universal gravity as proving that bodies have a property of attraction or attractive power endowed by God (Du Châtelet 1742: ch. 16, §385). She accepts the idea that gravity is proportional to the masses of bodies and inversely proportional to the square of their spatial separation, arguing that this Newtonian idea of attraction “marvelously” explains the fall of bodies on earth, the tides, and various astronomical phenomena, something that the vortex theory of the Cartesians fails to do. But she denies that this acceptance entails that she must also accept the conclusion that bodies have an “essential property” called gravity or attractive force, contending that such a conclusion transcends the knowledge available to philosophers (Du Châtelet 1742: ch. 16, §388). The reason is that no one had yet demonstrated that there is no medium for gravity, such as a vortex or an aether: since gravity may depend on some medium, it may not be essential to matter per se. In this specific way, Châtelet’s work is predicated on the familiar notion that although Cartesianism had been overthrown by Newtonian ideas and methods, philosophers must nonetheless develop a proper interpretation of the Newtonian theory of gravity and of its implications. Yet unlike Voltaire, who not only rejected Cartesianism, but became famous for his ridicule of Leibnizian philosophy in Candide, Châtelet argued that philosophers should continue to work on developing the proper methodology in part by taking seriously the ideas and methods of Leibniz and Wolff. In particular, Châtelet argued that the principle of sufficient reason should be a guiding force in metaphysical theorizing, and as Leibniz had argued, it shows the fundamental error in Newton’s concept of absolute space; she added that Clarke’s method of replying to Leibniz’s argument, viz., that one can develop a non-Leibnizian or voluntarist conception of the PSR to evade the problem with absolute space, is underwhelming (Du Châtelet 1742: ch. 5, §74). She also argued that if we use the PSR to guide our thinking about science, we will be skeptical of Locke’s solution to the problem of understanding the philosophical implications of Newton’s theory of universal gravity. The idea that Newton’s theory supports the conclusion that God must have “superadded” gravity to matter avoids potential problems with asserting that gravity is “essential” to matter, something she also regards skeptically, but simply encounters other problems. First, since no one yet understood whether there was any medium underlying gravitational interactions, such as an aether, it was premature to conclude that gravity is a property of matter, even one “superadded” to it by divine fiat. After all, if there is an aether, then matter may gravitate because of its interactions with the aether, and not because of any superadded property. Second, the PSR demands that we seek rational explanations of natural phenomena in our science, but the superaddition thesis is predicated on the idea that we simply cannot understand how matter gravitates toward other matter. Newton’s science is simply taken to indicate that it does so. She was unwilling to leave the most important conclusion of the Scientific Revolution a mere mystery.

Euler’s rejection of the vis inertiae was not his only major reaction to Newton’s science. The question of whether to accept, and of how to interpret, absolute space, time and motion, and the related question of how to conceive of the relation between Newton’s work in natural philosophy and the flourishing Leibnizian-Wolffian metaphysics on the Continent, continued to drive conversations in the middle of the eighteenth century. Just a few years after Châtelet published her Institutions, Euler presented a novel approach to these two questions in a short paper entitled “Reflexions sur l’Espace et le Temps”, first published in 1748 in the Mémoires de l’Académie des Sciences de Berlin. The Berlin Academy had been witnessing a vociferous debate between Wolffians and Newtonians since 1740 (a debate that would continue until roughly 1759), one in which Euler played a role. Whereas one might regard the British philosophers, especially Berkeley and Hume, as arguing that philosophical principles and commitments take a kind of precedence in driving one’s interpretations of the concepts of force, motion, space and time, Euler argued that natural philosophy—specifically, mechanics—ought to take precedence. The famous first sentence of his essay indicates why: he contends that the principles of mechanics—for instance, the principle of inertia—are so well established that it would be foolish to doubt them (Euler 1748: 324). In particular, if one’s metaphysical commitments stand in tension with the concepts of space and motion found in geometry and mechanics, then one must adjust those commitments accordingly. Euler then presented a clever argument: the law of inertia picks out rectilinear motion as a special kind of motion, so to apply it to bodies in nature, there must be a clear meaning to the idea of a straight line. But if space is merely the order of relations amongst material bodies, then any set of reference bodies we use to determine which motion is straight could itself be in motion. So to employ the idea of rectilinear motion, we require the notion of absolute space (see DiSalle 2006, 36-37).

The most important figure in German-speaking Europe to react in depth to Newton’s ideas was surely Immanuel Kant. As a young man, Kant was influenced by Euler’s argument (Friedman 1992: 16–17) in the 1748 piece.[26] Kant began grappling with Newtonian ideas at the very beginning of his career—he discussed the inverse-square law in his first publication (Kant 1747: § 10)—and they would remain central both to his magnum opus, the Critique of Pure Reason (Kant 1787 [1992]) and to his Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science (1786 [2002]). In the so-called pre-critical period, Kant diverged sharply from the approach toward natural philosophy defended by many Leibnizians in German-speaking Europe by deciding to accept the Newtonian theory of universal gravity, along with corresponding aspects of the Newtonian conception of matter, as a starting point for philosophical theorizing (Friedman 2012: 485–6). He makes this explicit already in 1763, in The Only Possible Argument:

I will attempt to provide an explanation of the origin of the world system according to the general laws of mechanics, not an explanation of the entire natural order, but only of the great masses of matter and their orbits, which constitute the most crudest foundation of nature … I will presuppose the universal gravitation of matter according to Newton or his followers in this project. If there are any who believe that through a definition of metaphysics formulated according to their own taste they can annihilate the conclusions established by men of perspicacity on the basis of observation and by means of mathematical inference—if there are such persons, they can skip the following propositions as something which has only a remote bearing on the main aim of this essay. (Kant 1763: AK 2: 139)

A rare case of Kantian irony, it seems. Already in this early text, Kant has clearly broken with his predecessors both in England and on the Continent, who insisted on disputing Newton’s theory of universal gravity, either on metaphysical or theological grounds. Instead, Kant’s work will be predicated on that theory. But Kant never became an orthodox Newtonian, any more than an orthodox Leibnizian (or Wolffian). This is evident from the radically different fates of two classic Newtonian concepts within the Kantian system: the idea that the theory of universal gravity shows that gravity is a feature of material bodies, along with the related concept of action at a distance, on the one hand; and absolute space, on the other. The quotation from 1763 above indicates that Kant was willing to endorse Newton’s theory of universal gravity, despite the many objections raised against it by his Leibnizian predecessors. Indeed, he was also willing to accept the most radical interpretation of that theory, one according to which every material body in the world should be understood as bearing a feature called gravity, one that involves that body in actions at a distance on all other such bodies. As Kant puts it dramatically in Proposition 7 of the second chapter of Metaphysical Foundations of Natural Science: “The attraction essential to all matter is an immediate action of matter on other matter through empty space” (Kant 1786 [2002: 223]; AK 4: 512). This view is radical in two senses: first, it involves the highly controversial claim that gravity is essential to matter, which indicates that a body lacking gravitational interactions would potentially fail to count as a material entity at all (much as an earlier generation of philosophers would conceive of extension as essential to matter); and second, it also involves the debated idea that material bodies act at a distance on one another. One can conceivably endorse the latter without endorsing the former, contending, e.g., that although material bodies in the actual world act at a distance on one another, perhaps because of a divine plan, it is perfectly possible for material bodies to fail to do so under distinct worldly conditions (i.e., there may be possible worlds in which material bodies lack gravity altogether). That is, the endorsement of action at a distance does not entail the endorsement of the essentiality claim. Both ideas are controversial, and Kant strongly endorses them both. This placed him in a rather select group of radical Newtonians (Friedman 1992: 1 note 2). Kant himself understood that Newton may not have endorsed these controversial views, arguing that he was inconsistent on this score (see Remark 2 to Proposition 7 of chapter 2, AK 4: 514–16; Friedman 2012: 203–21). And yet Kant strongly resisted the other most controversial Newtonian idea, absolute space, along with the related idea of absolute motion (Friedman 2012: 35–42). In the Critique of Pure Reason, for instance, Kant expressed a basically Leibnizian sympathy by arguing that there are fundamental metaphysical (and perhaps epistemic) difficulties with thinking of space and time as existing independently of all objects and all possible relations among them as “actual entities ”(wirkliche Wesen—A23/B37) in their own right. He does so in a passage that (perhaps confusingly) characterizes the Leibnizians as also defending a kind of realism about space, but we can focus solely on his criticism of the Newtonians:

Those, however, who assert the absolute reality of space and time, whether they assume it to be subsisting or only inhering, must themselves come into conflict with the principles of experience. For if they decide in favor of the first (which is generally the position of the mathematical investigators of nature), then they must assume two eternal and infinite self-subsisting non-entities (space and time), which exist (yet without there being anything real) only in order to comprehend everything real within themselves. (A39/B56)

If one regards space (like time) as existing independently of all objects and all possible relations, and yet one admits that space is causally inert and imperceptible, as one presumably must in the late eighteenth century, then one is committed to the idea that there is a kind of infinite and eternal non-entity in the world. Space is a kind of non-entity, Kant suggests, because on the one hand it is said to exist independently of everything else, and yet on the other hand, it is said to be causally inert and imperceptible, which would distinguish it from every other sort of thing that exists. Kant simply cannot stomach this metaphysically preposterous notion. It is therefore incumbent upon him to develop a theory of space (and of motion) that meets at least two distinct criteria: (1) it coheres with his understanding of the theory of universal gravity, and of what he regards as its implication, viz. that gravity is an essential feature of material bodies; and, (2) it avoids the metaphysically problematic aspects of Newtonian absolute space. Kant tackles precisely these tasks in the Metaphysical Foundations, which was published in between the appearance of the first and second edition of the Critique, arguing that we can regard absolute space as a kind of idea of reason, an ideal that we approach asymptotically in our theorizing about motion. Absolute space is therefore nothing more than a kind of ideal within our philosophy, and no longer a harmful aspect of our ontology.

Newton’s influence on the development of philosophy did not end with the close of the eighteenth century. Most obviously, the concepts of absolute space and absolute motion continued to play fundamental roles in philosophical theorizing about space and motion more generally for the next two centuries, and they remain fundamental to discussions today (DiSalle 2006). Newton has also had a deep and lasting influence on numerous other topics in what we now call the philosophy of science, including the status of our knowledge of natural phenomena, the best ideas about scientific methodology, the status of the laws of nature, and much else besides (McMullin 2001 and Smith 2001). It is no exaggeration to say that Newton has a permanent place in the history of modern philosophy.


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