Notes to Robert Nozick's Political Philosophy

1. All citations just by page number in the text are to Anarchy, State and Utopia.

2. Three book-length and highly critical discussions of the Nozickean doctrine are Wolff 1991, Cohen 1995, and Hailwood 1996. Three equally sophisticated but more sympathetic treatments are Feser 2004, Friedman 2011, and Bader 2013. Three important collections of essays are: Paul 1981, Schmidtz 2002, and Bader and Meadowcroft 2011. Mack 2002a and 2002b is a systematic critique of Cohen.

3. In “Free Enterprise in America” (1976) Nozick offered a nicely integrated statement of the core historical and economic contentions that complement ASU's philosophical claims. Nozick did follow up his ASU discussion of retribution with a proposed vindicating explanation for retribution in Philosophical Explanations (1981).

4. For an important critique of Nozick on symbolic utility, see Gaus 2002.

5. In his 1997 introduction to Socratic Puzzles, Nozick says that in The Examined Life he had “express[ed] reservations about some of the views in Anarchy, State, and Utopia” (2, emphasis added).

6. The rationality of the parties in the original position consists in the fact that “each tries as best he can to advance his interests” (Rawls 1971: 142).

7. Most animals also have separate existences. Do they too have rights? See ASU's sections on “Constraints and Animals” (35–42) and “Underdetermination of Moral Theory” (45–49).

8. The idea that Anarchy, State and Utopia is the logical culmination of Rawls' critique of utilitarianism was at the center of Singer 1975 reprinted in Paul 1981. For Singer, this was a reductio of Rawls' anti-utilitarianism.

9. See, e.g., the discussion of the “paradox of deontology” in Scheffler 1982 (87–91) also see Otsuka 2011.

10. Perhaps one reason for not entering the Experience Machine (see ASU 42–45) is that one's existence within it would be meaningless – although one would not know this.

11. Nozick should have said that, if an action is properly prohibited, it is subject to permissible punishment and subject to permissible defensive suppression.

12. Nozick thinks that it does follow from B having a right against A not to be subjected to T that B may prohibit the joint act of A from subjecting B to T and A not compensating B (59).

13. Personal communication, probably in the early 1980s.

14. The most important source of common view that Nozick explicitly centers his doctrine on a right of self-ownership is Cohen 1995.

15. I follow Nozick in the use of “individualist anarchism” even though this term would best be reserved for anti-statists like Benjamin Tucker and Lysander Spooner (see ASU 335 n4) and not applied to the “anarcho-capitalist” Rothbard. Very roughly, the difference between individualist anarchism and anarcho-capitalism is that the former (but not the latter) is suspicious of income that does not derive from labor and tends to attribute the existence of such income to illicit state interference.

16. Cohen, e.g., mistakenly takes Nozick's minimal state to engage in taxation. See 89 and 235.

17. See Nozick's trenchant critique of the principle of fairness that requires all those who benefit from others' costly cooperation share in those costs (90–5).

18. Rothbard 1977 argues that, if there is a virtual natural monopoly in the business of rights protection, there should be at least some historical examples of states arising through the non-coerced subscription of their clients; and, yet, there are no such examples.

19. But, is there a right against fear? See Steiner 1981 (571–2).

20. Given a liability rule conception of those rights, the permissibility of these suppressions requires that due compensation for the outlaw-ish actions will be impossible or severely difficult.

21. See the discussion of “Productive Exchange” (84–7).

22. Nozick does not seem to notice that, if C has (the equivalent of) a procedure right against D's engaging in certain conduct, then C (or C's agent) may forbid that conduct without any question of compensation to D arising.

23. Nowhere in ASU does Nozick affirm or deny the common claim that forced takings are needed to fund the production of public goods.

24. Probably around 1980, I asked Nozick whether he had envisioned anything like this public goods argument for taxation in connection with the liability rule attenuation of rights. He said that he had not.

25. Hillel Steiner also points out that Nozick's arguments have force only against ongoing applications of patterned doctrines; they do not in themselves challenge a one-time, initial assignment of holdings (of, say, portions of nature) to individuals.

26. But see footnote* on ASU 55.

27. Nozick may have had something like this in mind when he said (in conversion in, I think, the mid to late 1970s) that he would like to have an account of the “half-lives” of historical injustices.

Copyright © 2014 by
Eric Mack <>

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