Notes to Occasionalism

1. Note that some argue that al-Ghazālī was actually not an occasionalist. See Dutton note 1.

2. This description is actually a summary that Ibn Rushd (Averroes) presents in his TT 316. The corresponding passage in al-Ghazali’s Incoherence appears to be TF 170.

3. Gabriel Biel (c. 1425–1495), one of the last of the great Scholastics, has also at times been identified as an occasionalist. For instance, see Freddoso 1998, 81–83. Freddoso cites a very interesting summary of Biel’s view on causation from Molina’s Concordia 159–60 (“De Concursu Dei generali,” Q. 14., A. 13, disp. 25). Here is the passage in question:

He is of the opinion that secondary causes bring about nothing at all, but that God by Himself alone produces all the effects in them and in their presence, so that fire does not produce heat and the sun does not give light, but instead it is God who produces these effects in them and in their presence. Hence … he claims that secondary causes are not properly causes in the sense of having an influence on the effect; for it is only the First Cause which he affirms to be a cause in this sense, whereas secondary causes, he claims, should be called causes sine qua non, insofar as God has decided not to produce the effect except when they are present. … He also asserts with Peter D’Ailly that when God produces an effect in conjunction with fire, He contributes no less than He would contribute were He to produce the same effect by Himself—in fact, He brings about more, since not only does He produce the heat with a concurrence just as great as if the fire were not present, but He also brings it about that the fire too is in its own way a cause of the heat (The translation is Freddoso’s).

Though the beginning of the paragraph strongly suggests that Biel was indeed an occasionalist, it is curious that in the latter half of the paragraph he is identified with Peter D’Ailly as asserting that “fire too is in its own way a cause of the heat.” That Biel held with D’Ailly that “God brings it about that fire too is in its own way a cause of the heat” suggests that Biel held that certain natural effects are causally overdetermined by God and the creature. If so, this raises questions about how consistently Biel was committed to occasionalism.

4. For instance, see Garber 1993 and Hatfield 1979.

5. For instance, see Della Rocca 1999 and Schmaltz 2008a.

6. See the pioneering work of Steven Nadler in this regard as specified in the bibliography.

7. Much work on this topic has been done by Steven Nadler. See Nadler 1993b, 1996, 1998, and 1999.

8. See Lisa Downing 2004.

9. See the entry on Berkeley.

10. Also see Pitcher 1981. For a more general discussion on Berkeley’s views on the activity of spirits, see Adams 1973.

11. See Winkler 2011 and Lee 2018a.

12. Occasionalists and “pre-established harmonists” do not deny the causal activity that the infinite substance, God, exerts on finite substances. Thus, they affirm inter-substantial causation insofar as the causal agent is God.

13. Historically speaking, it has not been an easy proposition to come up with a convincing account of how this joint causal activity between God and the creature is supposed to work. On the concurrentist account, God obviously is doing more than merely conserving the being of the creature along with its power. For God is in some sense causally active in bringing about the effect in a direct manner. However, this direct causal activity of God must differ from the way in which God is the sole direct cause of the effect, which is how the occasionalist regards the divine causal activity in question. In what sense God is doing more but not as much as the occasionalist’s account has been the topic of much discussion and disagreement. In fact, Malebranche shrewdly points out in Elucidation 15 that the disagreement is so great that “[w]hen people who have no special interest preventing them from agreeing cannot agree, it is a sure sign that they have no clear idea of what they are saying.” (Search 658)

14. If we employ the scheme introduced earlier—that is, “local”and “global” arguments for occasionalism—then the “passive nature” (PN) and “no knowledge” (NK) arguments fall into the first category, and the “no necessary connection” (NNC) and the “conservation is but continuous creation” (CCC) arguments fall into the latter category.

15. Parts of this section have been incorporated from Lee 2007.

16. Therefore, someone who does not share the Cartesian conception of the nature of bodies as being exhausted by extension would not be in a position to endorse the PN argument.

17. Descartes, Principles of Philosophy II §4, AT VIII 42.

18. In the same section, Malebranche describes the asymmetry between rest and motion in the following manner: “The will of the Author of nature, which creates the power and force that each body has for continuing in the state it is in, concerns only motion and not rest, since bodies have no power whatsoever in themselves” (OCM II 432/Search 517). Note that this seems to be in tension with what Descartes says in the Principles II, §§24–37 (AT VIII, 53–62).

19. We follow Jolley (“Introduction” to the Dialogues) and Nadler 1999 in referring to this argument as the “no knowledge” argument.

20. We follow Nadler 1996 in referring to the argument in this way. Much of the content of this portion of the entry is based on discussion in Lee 2008.

21. For instance, the cotton fibers could, in a miraculous manner, be momentarily turned into steel as it comes into contact with the fire.

22. Are the necessary connections being discussed here logically necessary connections? Malebranche does not deny that the essences of creatures logically entail certain constraints for divine causal activity. For instance, in the Dialogues, Malebranche notes that the nature of bodies—their impenetrability—obliges God, with “a kind of necessity,” to move bodies when they collide. But he also states that “it is clear that impenetrability has no efficacy of its own and that it can merely provide God, who treats things according to their nature, with an occasion to diversify His action” (Dialogues VII, §XII, p.118–9). So, while certain events might logically necessitate some sort of divine action and, hence, be an occasion for God to act, they are not themselves causally efficacious, according to Malebranche. So I take the necessitation in this passage from the Search to be causal in nature, and not simply logical. The interesting and complex issue of how Malebranche understands the relation between causal necessitation and logical necessitation requires further discussion and cannot be done full justice here. Of particular importance is how to understand the connection that obtains between divine volitions and their effects. It is at least a logically necessary connection, since it is a logically necessary truth for Malebranche that if God wills p, p obtains (insofar as p itself is not inconsistent). But there has to be more going on, since, as we have just seen above, the nature of bodies also obliges with this type of necessity—that is, logical necessity—but such obliging falls short of genuine causation, a shortcoming that does not apply to divine volitions. For an interesting discussion about the relation of the NK argument to the NNC argument, in addition to issues concerning the nature of necessity involved, see Ott, 2013.

23. I thank Robert Adams for bringing this point to my attention. For more on this weakness of the NNC argument and its relation to the CCC argument in Malebranche, see Lee 2008.

24. Mere conservationists such as Durandus are the exception.

25. For an excellent discussion of this and related issues, see Freddoso 1988 and Freddoso 1991.

26. Also see Principles, Part 1. art. 62.

27. For this line of argument, see Lee 2018b, 74–82.

28. La Forge, Traité de l’esprit de l’homme in Oeuvres philosophiques, ed. Pierre Clair (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1974; hereafter, Traité), 241. The translation is Nadler’s and is quoted from Nadler 1998, 218–9. This passage also suggests that La Forge might have had the continuous recreation view in mind as well.

29. The concurrentist might think that even in the case of the initial creation of the world ex nihilo, while the being or esse of the creature are brought about ex nihilo by God, the modes the creature possesses at creation are the result of the concurrent activity of the creature and God. Leibniz, interestingly enough, actually seems to be suggesting something close to such a view in his Theodicy section 388.

30. See Garber 1993, 14–5 and Winkler 2011, 298–302. Note also that this view differs from the aforementioned position of al-Ash’ari, who seems to be arguing that only the modes of a given creature are continuously recreated, while the esse of the creature is somehow maintained or sustained. This hybrid view would have an advantage in addressing worries about transtemporal identity, since the sustained being of the creature could be invoked to provide the basis for the numerical identity of the creature through change.

31. Winkler goes on to note that this reading of continuous creation, that is, continuous creation as continuous recreation is what gives the continuous creation thesis its hold over him, if at all:

I am therefore left thinking that what gives continuous creation its hold over me is the threat it presents to the preexistence of substantial causes. Even if God’s causal role (contrary to both the immanent variant and the first transeunt variant) leaves a place for a collaborating finite being, I have trouble seeing how a finite substance that comes into being at the very same moment as the effect can be a productive cause of it. The substance may help to render the effect intelligible, but if it does so only because God adjusts the world to accommodate it, the real productive work seems to be the privilege of God alone. (Winkler 2011, 300)

32. See Lee, S., “Leibniz on What God and Creatures Cause,” Natur und Subjekt: IX. Internationaler Leibniz-Kongress, Vortraege 2. Teil, Hannover (2011), 596–8.

33. This portion of the entry is from Lee 2008.

34. On the difficult and complex topic of Malebranche on free will, see Elmar Kremer 2000, 190–219 and Schmaltz 1996, 192–234.

35. One word of caution about how “occasional causation” is being used in the literature. Steven Nadler uses the term in a different, distinct sense:

what I am calling ‘occasional causation’ does not require any substantial likeness between cause and effect, and does not involve any kind of influx or communication. In the technical sense of the term, then, no real influence occurs between cause and effect. But occasional causation does, however, constitute a real causal relationship and not just accidental, sequential conjunction. Thus, in a somewhat broader (hence, weaker) sense, there is an ‘influence’ of cause upon effect, but not of a transeunt efficient nature.

In simple terms, a relationship of occasional causation exists when one thing or state of affairs brings about an effect by inducing (but not through efficient causation...) another thing to exercise its own efficient causal power. The relationship of occasional causation unites one thing or state of affairs with an effect wrought (through efficient causation, immanent or transeunt) by another thing. Thus, the term denotes the entire process whereby one thing, A, occasions or elicits another thing, B, to cause e.(Nadler 1994, 39)

Thus, for Nadler, “occasional causation” consists in a genuine causal relation, wherein the occasional cause “induces” something else to exercise its own causal power to produce a given effect. In contrast, by “occasional causation,” I take the relation between the occasional cause and effect to not be a genuine causal relation. That is, “occasional causation,” as I will be using it, refers to the quasi-causal relationship that holds between an occasional cause and its effect, standardly characterized by robust regularity but not genuine causation.

36. What happens when a body collides with another body? Is it not the case that such an event must necessarily be followed by either the first body rebounding or the second body giving up its initial location? This fascinating question is the core issue between an exchange between Malebranche and Fontenelle. See Schmaltz 2008b for an excellent discussion of related issue. Also relevant is the discussion in footnote 22 of this entry.

Copyright © 2019 by
Sukjae Lee <>

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