Notes to Omnipotence

1. Such an argument is based on two premises. The first premise is a plausible version of the principle of the diffusiveness of power which implies that for any agent, \(A\), and for any states of affairs \(p \amp q\), if \(A\) brings about \(p\), \(q\) obtains, and \(q\) is not within the power of any agent other than \(A\), then \(A\) brings about \((p \amp q)\). The second premise is that possibly [(a non-omnipotent agent brings it about that a snowflake falls) & (no omnipotent agent ever exists) & (it is not within the power of any agent other than \(A\) to bring it about that no omnipotent agent ever exists)]. It is plausible that this conjunction is possible provided that an accidentally omnipotent agent is possible.

2. In (D2), ‘\(n\)’ ranges over all natural numbers, and \(t_1 \ldots t_n\) are nonoverlapping. In addition, it is assumed for the purposes of (D2) that either it is possible for time to have no beginning, or it is possible for time to have no end (or both).

3. It should be noted that in (C), ‘\(n\)’ ranges over real numbers, and \(p\) is not itself equivalent to a state of affairs of the form ‘in \(n\) minutes, \(r\)’, where \(n\) is not equal to zero.

4. A complex state of affairs is one which is either constructible out of other states of affairs by use of the logical apparatus of first-order logic enriched with whatever modalities one chooses to employ, or else analyzable (in the sense of a philosophical analysis) into a state of affairs which is so constructible. Therefore, a part of a complex state of affairs, \(s\), is one of those states of affairs out of which \(s\), or an analysis of \(s\), is constructed. The relevant notion of a part in this context is that of a logical part, as opposed to a spatial part or a temporal part.

5. Note that if \(W\) and \(W^*\) sharing the same history up to \(t\) implies that \(W\) and \(W^*\) share the same natural laws up to \(t\), then in \(W\) there is no sufficient causal condition for Oscar becoming omnipotent at \(t\). However, the libertarianism of Flint and Freddoso presupposes that some events, i.e., all free decisions, lack a sufficient causal condition, and there seems to be no good reason to deny the possibility of events that have no sufficient causal condition, especially in the light of current understandings of quantum mechanics.

6. There are variations on (e) that may provide additional counter-examples to Flint and Freddoso’s account of omnipotence. For instance, consider the following possible state of affairs:

  • (e*) A snowflake falls & \({\sim}\)(Oscar brings about something at some time during his life).

Suppose that Oscar is a contingently existing omnipotent agent. It can be argued that although it is impossible for Oscar to bring about (e*), it is possible that a non-omnipotent agent other than Oscar brings about (e*) by bringing about both of its conjuncts, even when Oscar is omnipotent. Arguably, a non-omnipotent agent of this sort could accomplish this by causing a snowflake to fall and destroying Oscar before he brings about something. It can be argued that such a case provides a counter-example to Flint and Freddoso’s account of omnipotence similar to the one based on (e).

7. Pike argues that divine omnipotence and perfect goodness are incompatible. For a discussion of the compatibility of divine omnipotence and perfect goodness, see Hoffman 1979.

8. Whether divine moral perfection should be understood as perfect goodness, perfect virtue, or an optimal combination of goodness and virtue, depends upon whether the correct theory of morality is consequentialist, deontological, or mixed (that is, a mixture of core elements of consequentialist and deontological moral theories). To preserve our neutrality on this controversial question in this context, in the main text we use expressions such as ‘best possible world’ and ‘maximally good possible world’ to refer to either a possible world of unsurpassable goodness, a possible world governed by a being of unsurpassable virtue, or a possible world with an optimal balance of goodness and virtuous governance.

9. Although from what we have said about the restrictions that any coherent account of God’s power must place on this power, a better term for God’s power than ‘omnipotence’ would be ‘maxipotence’. Compare Morriston, 2001. Morriston defends the claim that omnipotence and necessary moral perfection are incompatible, and suggests that a maximally great being need not be omnipotent.

10. Plantinga 1974. This work is an influential free will defense of theism against the problem of evil. A number of philosophers have argued against some of the presuppositions of Plantinga’s view, and in particular, against the acceptance of so-called counterfactuals of freedom.

Copyright © 2017 by
Joshua Hoffman <>
Gary Rosenkrantz <>

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