Supplement to Ontological Commitment

Supplement on the Problem of Inessential Predication

In this supplement, four responses to the problem of inessential predication are considered. (They can all be adapted to the problem of inessential generalization.) The first response is simply to give up truthmaker necessitarianism (see Parsons (1999), who calls it “truthmaker essentialism”). What makes Socrates a truthmaker for ‘Socrates is wise’ has to do, not with his essential properties, but rather his intrinsic nature. On this view, a is a truthmaker for ‘a is F’ if and only if, ‘a is F’ is true and, necessarily, if there exists an intrinsic duplicate of a, a′, then ‘a′ is F’ is true. This allows the subject of an inessential predication to be a truthmaker as long as the predication is intrinsic. The line that matters is the line between intrinsic and extrinsic, not essential and inessential. If a predication is extrinsic, such as ‘Socrates is ten feet from an elephant’, then the subject fails to be a truthmaker; only Socrates together with the elephant is a truthmaker. If one takes this approach to truthmaking, then the truthmakers and ontological commitments of predications are aligned with respect to the subjects of predication, and the problem of inessential predication presents no obstacle to endorsing the truthmaker account of ontological commitment.

A second response holds on to truthmaker necessitarianism but invokes counterpart theory, and inconstant counterpart relations, to analyze the notion of an essential property.[1] On this view, in an appropriate context, wisdom is an essential property of Socrates, and so, relative to this context, Socrates' existence necessitates his being wise. More generally, for any intrinsic property of a thing, there are contexts in which the property is essential to that thing; and thus, relative to any such context, the subject of a predication of that intrinsic property is a truthmaker for the predication. Since the problem of inessential predication involved predications of properties that were intrinsic but not essential, the problem simply doesn't arise if we stick to the right contexts. The cost, if it is one, is that claims about truthmaking and ontological commitment are themselves context dependent; and, at least for serious truthmaker theorists, that may undermine their role in the ontological enterprise.[2]

A third response holds on to truthmaker necessitarianism but denies that inessential predications are ontologically committed to the subjects of those predications, or to ordinary things at all. Any intuition we have to the contrary is simply mistaken. In defense, these truthmaker theorists may hold that the world is the totality of facts (or states of affairs), not of things; it is facts, not things, that ontologically ground the truth of inessential predications. Arguably, this factualist view goes against our ordinary conception of the world; but that would only go to show that our intuitive ontological judgments can't be trusted.

Let us see how this plays out with respect to Armstrong's states-of-affairs ontology (Armstrong 1997 contains the most developed version of this view). A simple (monadic) predication such as ‘the ball is red’ is made true by the (monadic) state of affairs of the ball's being red (assuming for the sake of the example that colors are universals). This state of affairs has two constituents, a “thin” particular and a universal, bound together by instantiation. The thin particular, according to Armstrong, is “the particular in abstraction from its properties” (Armstrong 1997: 123). A “thick” particular, in contrast, is “the particular taken along with all and only the particular's non-relational properties” (Armstrong 1997: 124). Thus, letting N (for nature) be the conjunction of all the universals instantiated by a thin particular a, the thick particular corresponding to a is identified, within a states-of-affairs ontology, with the state of affairs of a's being N. Now, if we take ‘the ball’ to refer to the thin particular, and ‘the ball is red’ to predicate redness of the thin particular, then the ball is not a truthmaker for ‘the ball is red’. For the ball—the thin particular—could exist clothed in different universals; it doesn't essentially instantiate redness. According to the third response, this result is sufficiently motivated and explained within a states-of-affairs ontology, and so can be accepted, intuition notwithstanding.

There is, however, a way that a states-of-affairs theorist can uphold the intuition that ‘the ball is red’ is ontologically committed to the ball. Call this the fourth response. Rather than interpret ‘the ball is red’ as a predication of redness to a thin particular, we can instead take ‘the ball’ to refer to the thick particular—a complex state of affairs—and interpret ‘the ball is red’ as asserting that this thick particular includes redness as a constituent. Since, according to Armstrong, a state of affairs has its constituent universals essentially, it follows that the ball—the thick particular—is a truthmaker for ‘the ball is red’. Thus, on the truthmaker criterion for ontological commitment to particulars, ‘the ball is red’ is ontologically committed to the ball. Intuition needn't be sacrificed.[3]

If a truthmaker theorist holds that tropes, rather than states-of-affairs, are the truthmakers for inessential predications, a version of the fourth response carries over. The ball is now identified with a bundle of co-located tropes: the ball's particular redness, its shape, its mass, and so on. If we interpret ‘the ball is red’ as asserting that the ball-bundle includes a red trope, and we take the ball-bundle to have its constituent tropes essentially, then the ball turns out to be an ontological commitment of ‘the ball is red’. Trope theorists, therefore, have a ready response to the problem of inessential predication.[4]

Copyright © 2014 by
Phillip Bricker <>

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