Supplement to Original Position

The Argument for the Difference Principle and the Four Stage Sequence

The Argument for the Difference Principle

Rawls’s difference principle says:

Social and economic inequalities are to be arranged so that they are to the greatest benefit of the least advantaged…(TJ 302/266 rev.)

The principle addresses differences or inequalities in the distribution of the primary goods of income and wealth and powers and positions of office and responsibility. It basically requires that a society is to institute the economic system that would make the least advantaged class better off than they would be in any other feasible economic system, compatible with maintaining citizens equal basic liberties and fair equality of opportunity. Rawls defines “least advantaged” as “those belonging to the lowest income class with the least expectations” (JF 59). Initially in Theory these were either people with one-half of the median income, or those with the income and wealth of unskilled workers (TJ 82–83) who as a class presumably have the least share of the primary goods of income and wealth, and powers and positions of office. Subsequently Rawls emphasized that for purposes of the difference principle the least advantaged are “fully cooperating” (JF 179), and “full and active participants in society” whose “physical needs and psychological capacities are within the normal range” (CP, 259) and who do their fair share in contributing to economic activity and the joint social product. Rawls thus regards “distributive shares” under the difference principle as the benefits that accrue to persons for doing their part in socially productive cooperation. The class of unskilled workers receiving minimum income thus satisfies his definition of least advantaged (TJ 98/84 rev.). Those who are able but unwilling to work where there is much work available “must somehow support themselves” (JF 179; see also PL 182n).

Rawls has been widely criticized for defining the least advantaged in terms of their (minimum) share of primary social goods of income and wealth, since this does not account for the special needs and care required for those with serious disabilities. (Kittay 1999; Nussbaum 2006; Sen 2009) In response Rawls agrees that using the same index of primary social goods for people with serious disabilities as for normally functioning people would be unfair. He says “I agree with Sen that basic capabilities are of first importance and that the use of primary goods is always to be assessed in light of assumptions about those capabilities.” (PL 183). This is ambiguous, but it’s notable that the moral powers of practical reason are themselves capabilities which ground the primary social goods, and also define the parties’ fundamental interests and specify the basic liberties and their significance in the two fundamental cases. (PL ch.8) Rawls further maintains that disability care and payments to meet the needs of severely handicapped citizens, especially those permanently unable to work, are not ascertained by the difference principle; they are to be determined by principles of health care required by the fair equality of opportunity principle and other special assistance principles (including perhaps the basic needs principle), which he leaves unspecified (PL 272n). As a principle for structuring and regulating basic economic institutions on grounds of reciprocity and mutual respect among those who contribute to social and economic cooperation, the difference principle itself is not an appropriate or adequate principle for compensation and care for mental and physical handicaps and other serious disabilities.

Rawls contends it is an empirical question which economic system satisfies the difference principle. He claims however that under ideal conditions of a well-ordered society, where the principles of justice are generally accepted, either a “property-owning democracy” or liberal (market) socialism are most likely to satisfy the difference principle, to the exclusion of laissez-faire capitalism, command economy communism, and even the modern capitalist welfare state. Property-owning democracy (POD) differs from the capitalist welfare state mainly in that it is not marked by such broad discrepancies in income and wealth, but instead provides for widespread private ownership of productive wealth and means of production, including workers’ opportunities for greater freedom and control in the workplace. Thus, akin to market socialism, POD is not marked by sharp divisions between capital and labor but manifests broad distribution of economic powers and positions, as well as a more equal distribution of income and wealth (see JF 135–140, 158–162, 178). For these reasons, and since a property-owning democracy also secures the fair value of equal political liberties and fair equality of opportunities, Rawls contends a property-owning democracy provides a more secure basis for citizens’ sense of self-respect than does welfare-state capitalism (see Freeman 2007b, 219–235; Freeman 2013, 2018). Others reply that liberal socialism better realizes Rawls’ principles of justice. (See Edmundson 2017, contending that the fair value of equal political liberties cannot be sustained in a private property economy.)

Rawls relies on the maximin rule of choice to argue against the principle of utility. Since the maximin rule and the difference principle both require maximizing the minimum position, it seems natural to assume that the maximin choice rule leads directly to choice of the difference principle in the original position. Though Rawls might have conveyed this impression in Theory (§26), he later says that in fact the maximin rule alone cannot be used to justify the difference principle (JF, 43n, 94–95). For when the difference principle is compared with those “mixed conceptions” of economic justice that protect basic liberties and provide some form of equal opportunities and guarantee an adequate social minimum on grounds of restricted utility, then the third condition for applying maximin is not satisfied (see the section on The Argument from the Maximin Criterion in the main text). The third condition for the maximin rule implies that there can only be one acceptable alternative for choice. If there is a second alternative the consequences of which rational persons can live with and accept if they end up in the least advantaged position (for example it protects basic liberties and opportunities, and guarantees a social safety net adequate to “the fruitful exercise of basic liberties”), then the maximin rule is not a rational rule of decision. For then there is no likelihood of grave risks to one’s future prospects.

“Mixed conceptions” of justice (see TJ §49) protect the basic liberties, and some conception of fair equal opportunities, and guarantee a decent social minimum of income and wealth sufficient to meet basic needs and adequately exercise basic liberties. But they determine the social minimum in some way other than the difference principle. For example, the social minimum may be determined by balancing citizens’ moral intuitions regarding a decent minimum; or according to the rule that the adequate social minimum is one-third of the median market income in society; or the lowest minimum that meets basic needs essential to a decent human life and which assures that the strains of commitment are not excessive. (Waldron, 1986, discussed by Rawls, JF 127–128) Once the social minimum so defined is satisfied mixed conceptions then rely upon the principle of average utility (or some alternative) to decide economic policies and distributions. Rawls calls this the “principle of restricted utility,” (JF 120, 126) since the pursuit of maximum social utility is restricted by the basic liberties, fair opportunities, and a decent social minimum. This is one of several possible mixed conceptions that combine the first principle of justice with a principle of distributive justice with a social minimum other than the difference principle (TJ, 124/107 rev.). Rawls apparently regards the capitalist welfare state as based in mixed conceptions that incorporate such a principle of restricted utility (JF 120–130, 139–140) but do not otherwise impose restrictions on economic inequalities.

Rawls concedes that “mixed conceptions are much more difficult to argue against than the principle of utility,” since “the strong arguments from liberty cannot be used as before” (TJ, 316/278 rev.). He discusses mixed conceptions in Theory, §49, and devotes more attention to them later in Justice as Fairness: A Restatement (§§34–38). Rawls provides several grounds that should lead the parties in the original position to agree on the difference principle – primarily publicity, stability, and reciprocity – and he adds several more specific arguments that speak against choice of the principle of restricted utility (TJ 49; JF sect.38). Mention has already been made of his argument (TJ §29) that the difference principle affirms the sense of self-respect of the least advantaged since, unlike the principle of utility, it treats them as ends in themselves and not as means to the greater well-being of the more advantaged. The force of this argument from self-respect is perhaps not as strong when the difference principle is compared with a principle of restricted utility that guarantees equal basic liberties, fair opportunities, and a decent minimum meeting basic needs. Still Rawls contends that because a welfare state capitalist economy governed by restricted utility does not put any restrictions on inequalities, “there may develop a discouraged and depressed underclass many of whose members are chronically dependent on welfare. This underclass feels left out and does not participate in the public political culture” (JF §42.3). Their sense of self-respect is likely to be undermined since they feel that though they are in society they are not members of it.

The main argument in favor of the difference principle depends on a strong idea of reciprocity (JF §36). In a society structured by the difference principle gains to those more advantaged are never made at the expense of those less advantaged; instead, any gains to the more advantaged always conform to rules that benefit also the least advantaged, and do so more than any other alternative measure. By contrast restricted utility, even if it provides a social minimum, still permits disadvantages and losses to the worst off so that those better off may prosper. Any degree of inequality is allowed in the name of maximizing utility so long as it does not violate the social minimum. Such a situation, Rawls contends, would be morally unacceptable to free and equal persons in a well-ordered society since it does not evince “reciprocity at the deepest level,” and is hence rationally unacceptable to the parties in the original position.

There are different ways to conceive of an economic system based in reciprocity. Even a laissez-faire entitlement system of free transfer and exchange that satisfies Pareto efficiency satisfies reciprocity in a very weak sense assuming no one is made worse off than some baseline since everyone is presumably made better off by the exchanges and transfers they make. But the Pareto principle and laissez-faire entitlement principles are compatible with enormous gains to the more advantaged while the least advantaged gain only minimally, if at all. This is “trickle-down,” where the poor in effect cannot advance unless the rich substantially benefit, and where benefits to the rich need not benefit the poor at all. The kind of reciprocity provided by the principle of restricted utility is more robust than laissez-faire and the Pareto principle since it guarantees a social minimum meeting basic needs and allowing for the “fruitful exercise” of the basic liberties. Everyone has a stake in the economic system at least to the degree that it meets these conditions. But, beyond this point wealth and income are generated and distributed so as to maximize overall wealth and therewith (presumably) overall utility. Further gains to those better off need not advance the position of the least advantaged, and indeed sometimes may come at their expense so long as the social minimum is maintained.

The “deeper idea of reciprocity” (JF 124) implicit in the difference principle has just the opposite tendencies: the more advantaged may not gain at any point unless their gains benefit the least advantaged and benefit them maximally, better than any alternative arrangement of institutions. The best way to understand the deeper idea of reciprocity Rawls incorporates into the difference principle is by referring to figure 6 in Theory (sect. 13) and figure 1 in Justice as Fairness (p.62). The difference principle requires the distribution of powers, prerogatives, and economic resources that puts the least advantaged on the rising part of the efficient production curve, OP, up to but not beyond the highest point D, (the highest point that is closest to an equal distribution). At D and all prior points on the curve, improvements to the most advantaged are always accompanied by improvements to the least advantaged and vice versa. Hence with all increments to social output, no one gains at any point at the expense of the other. This relationship of reciprocity does not hold at points to the right of D, where further gains to the more advantaged may increase aggregate wealth and utility, but come at the expense of the less advantaged.

What bearing does this have on choice in the original position? Even if the deeper reciprocity achieved by the difference principle seems morally appealing to us, the parties are not similarly motivated by moral intuitions of fairness. They must be moved to agree on the difference principle for rational considerations alone. So why should the parties in the original position care about the deeper reciprocity achieved by the difference principle? Why wouldn’t it be rational for them to agree to a more superficial form of reciprocity, as allowed by restricted utility, thereby taking a chance that they might be among the affluent in the capitalist welfare state? After all, with luck, if they end up among the least advantaged, they may only be moderately worse off than they would have been under the difference principle.

The reasons that speak in favor of the parties’ rational choice of the difference principle are their higher-order interest in developing their capacities for justice, their concern for their self-respect as equal citizens, their concern for stability, and the strains of commitment. Compare the difference principle with the principle of restricted utility: Once the social minimum is met, restricted utility does not guarantee that the worse off will benefit in any way from further gains to those better off. Quite the contrary, further gains to more advantaged may even disadvantage the less advantaged—for example, a falling minimal wage rate in the face of an increased supply of labor results in a greater share going to capital, which may benefit owners and middle class consumers but not the less advantaged workers. With restricted utility there is no consistent and continuing tendency toward reciprocity of benefits, for once the social minimum is satisfied the less advantaged are as likely to gain nothing as to benefit from further gains to those better off.

Rawls’s conjecture is that in the capitalist welfare state structured by restricted utility, the less advantaged are likely to become dispirited, resentful, and frustrated with their situation, for they know that their well-being is neglected and often intentionally sacrificed so that the majority of citizens may prosper. While stability is maintained among the less advantaged as a modus vivendi, still they are likely to withdraw from active participation in politics and public life; for they justifiably feel left behind by society and no longer see themselves as having a stake in increasing social prosperity or as enjoying a respected position in public life. This all-too-familiar phenomenon in the modern capitalist welfare-state is evident from the striking lack of political participation by the poorest members of our society. It may be that welfare-state capitalism is stable, but it is the stability of indifference or hopelessness among the less advantaged, not stability for the right reasons, which is grounded in equal citizens’ affirmation of social institutions out of their sense of justice (PL xlii, 391). Due to their lack of self-respect, and the excessive demands the capitalist welfare-state places on their moral sensibilities and capacities for justice, the least advantaged are unable to willingly affirm the organizing principles of society on grounds of their sense of justice. The principle of restricted utility then places excessive strains of commitment on the worse off, and undermines their sense of self-respect, causing them to be resentful of their situation. Moreover, restricted utility invites continuing disagreement over the size of the social minimum, since there is no criterion other than citizens’ differing views regarding what is needed to satisfy the basic needs of the least advantaged. So, as is characteristic of the capitalist welfare state, there will be continual disagreement on a decent minimum and continual efforts by the more advantaged to reduce the social minimum and impose work requirements on the poorest as a condition of receiving their social minimum. The difference principle by contrast provides a definite standard for determining the social minimum. Finally, citizens’ higher-order interest in the full development and effective exercise of their capacities for a sense of justice are not well served by restricted utility, since it fails to achieve economic reciprocity and the social bases of self-respect to a significant degree for all citizens. Because of their interests in fully exercising their moral and rational capacities, their sense of self-respect, and their concern for stability, the parties in the original position cannot in good faith rationally affirm restricted utility and the capitalist welfare state when they have the alternative of choosing the difference principle (cf. JF, 128–129). This seems to be Rawls’s main argument for the difference principle from the original position. (See van Parijs, 2003, for a more general discussion of the difference principle.)

The Four-Stage Sequence (TJ §31)

Rawls’s arguments for the principles of justice from the original position are but the first stage of a “four-stage sequence.” Three further stages expand upon and elaborate the original position to apply these principles to determine the justice of legislation and social policies that affect the relevant basic social institutions. Each stage represents an appropriate point of view from which free and equal citizens consider certain kinds of questions. It must first be decided which constitutional arrangements are just for reconciling citizens’ conflicting judgments about what justice requires in the application of the principles of justice to laws and social policies. The second or “constitutional” stage then is the application of the principles of justice to determine the most appropriate political constitution for a well-ordered society, with the constitutional powers and procedures of government and the constitutional rights of citizens. To make this decision, Rawls says the veil of ignorance must be lifted enough so that the parties to an ideal constitutional convention know relevant general facts about their society, such as its natural circumstances and resources, the level of economic advance, and its political culture. But the parties still do not know any particular information about individuals within society, including themselves. Rawls assumes in Theory that the most just constitution will be some form of constitutional democracy that further specifies the basic liberties of the first principle into more specific constitutional rights and liberties. Later in Political Liberalism he suggests that some form of equal opportunity guaranteeing freedom of occupation and right to travel, and the social minimum necessary for the effective exercise of the basic liberties will also be guaranteed as a “constitutional essential” by a just and politically legitimate constitution (PL VI:§5); moreover, depending upon its political culture, a society may or may not employ separation of powers with judicial review to protect the basic rights, liberties and opportunities (suggesting that a parliamentary democracy without judicial review could also be just and/or politically legitimate).

Rawls says that any feasible political constitution or procedure, no matter how just, may yield unjust legislation and outcomes, because of the burdens of judgment. “The best attainable scheme is one of imperfect procedural justice” (TJ 197). Thus, even though the parties in the OP are to assume strict institutional and individual compliance in comparing alternative conceptions of justice, in any actual well-ordered society where everyone accepts and endorses justice as fairness, there will still be lack of adequate information, misjudgments, and periodic noncompliance with the ideal of a perfectly just society.

The third stage of the four-stage sequence is the legislative stage, where ideal legislators correctly apply and satisfy the principles of justice but also respect the limits laid down by a just constitution. The veil of ignorance is lifted further at this stage, so that ideal legislators have requisite knowledge of local facts that they need to address the particular problems they are trying to resolve by legislation and more general social policies. It is at the legislative stage that Rawls says that the difference principle is to be applied, once all the relevant factual information within a particular society is available that bears on decisions regarding the organization of the economy and the institution or property. (TJ 199). Rawls later in PL insists that the difference principle is not to be made part of the constitution. This implies that, unlike the principle of basic needs, the difference principles does not create a constitutional right or question that is appropriate for the judiciary to enforce in the exercise of judicial review to second-guess legislative determinations od the policies that maximally benefit the least advantaged class.

The fourth and final stage of the four-stage sequence is the application of laws and rules to particular cases, by judges and administrators, and ultimately by citizens generally in making decisions about what laws and rules require of them. At this last stage everyone has complete knowledge of all relevant facts, and no limits on knowledge remain since the full system of rules required by the principles of justice has been determined in the first three stages of the four-stage sequence, and apply to constrain their decisions about the application of laws to the circumstancs they confront.

Rawls concludes that it is important to remember that the 4- stage sequence is a device— a thought experiment—for correctly applying the principles of justice. It is part of ideal theory, not an account of how actual legislators proceed or even should proceed. Instead, its purpose is to provide criteria of correctness for testing and assessing constitutions, laws, judicial and other political decisions. Just laws are, by Rawls’s definition, those that would be enacted at the legislative stage by reasonable and rational legislative representatives who conscientiously follow just procedures and apply the principles of justice subject to the terms of a just constitution, given all relevant true information needed to deliberate and make their decisions. (TJ 200). Notably Rawls says the “test” provided by the Four Stage Sequence is sometimes indeterminate in so far as two or even more constitutions, or economic or social arrangements would be chosen by ideal legislators for particular factual situations. “When this is so justice is to that extent likewise indeterminate,” a matter of “quasi-pure procedural justice” where just laws and policies lie within a certain range, and the legislature has in fact enacted them. Such partial indeterminacy is not a defect, but what we should expect. (TJ 1971, 200)

Copyright © 2023 by
Samuel Freeman <>

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