Supplement to Original Position
Further Topics on the Original Position
- Ideal Theory, Strict Compliance and the Well-Ordered Society
- A Liberal Feminist Critique of the Original Position and Justice within the Family
- The Original Position and the Law of Peoples
- Constructivism, Objectivity, Autonomy, and the Original Position
- Is the Original Position Necessary or Relevant?
Ideal Theory, Strict Compliance and the Well-Ordered Society
No actual societies shaped by principles of justice can be perfectly just (because of human limitations and the “burdens of judgment”). Rawls says that, nonetheless, the parties in the OP are to assume that members of these societies and their basic structure strictly comply with these principles of justice. They are to assume then that the well-ordered society for which they choose principles of justice is a “perfectly just society,” (TJ 9) and then determine whether and to what degree such a society would be stable and can endure. This assumption of persons’ and institutions’ “strict compliance” with principles of justice within a well-ordered society is part of what Rawls calls “ideal theory,” which is characteristic of social contract as well as other moral conceptions. (Kant’s ideal society the Kingdom of Ends involves a similar assumption in ideal theory.) To determine the most appropriate principles of justice to govern relations among ourselves, we are discover the principles that would be generally accepted and endorsed among free and equal reasonable and rational persons with a sense of justice in an ideal society where these principles were fully realized and generally complied with. The assumption of strict compliance is made within contract views in part to insure the integrity of the agreement: it means the parties will not renege but can rely on each other to act according to the principles agreed to and that their agreement is not in vain (TJ 145). More generally, Rawls says the same principles chosen for an ideal society are to be applied to assess the justice of institutions and laws in our own non-ideal world where societies and individuals only partially comply with them (if at all). Principles of justice that apply to an ideal well-ordered society lay bare how much our current circumstances depart from ideal justice; injustices are to be “identified by the extent of the deviation from perfect justice” (TJ 216). Moreover, ideal theory provides a goal for non-ideal theory; the principles of justice “define then a perfectly just scheme [and] set up an aim to guide the course of social reform” (TJ 215). Finally, ideal theory provides a way to discover universal principles that apply to all social worlds and circumstances. By determining the principles of justice that would apply in an ideal society, we can claim to have discovered objective universal principles that can be applied to every society to ascertain the degree of injustice and to guide reform.
Rawls’s and other ideal theories’ assumption of strict compliance have been widely criticized as unnecessary and irrelevant to address questions of injustice (Sen 2009, Appiah 2017); or as unrealistic, unduly demanding, and not relevant to the kinds of persons we really are or to our non-ideal circumstances (Gaus 2016, Schmidtz 2018); or ideal theory is said to be distracting, ideological, irrelevant to, or incapable of addressing past and enduring racial and other injustices in our society (Mills 2016). Some of these arguments are motivated by political conservatism or pessimism about human and institutional capacities for change (Gaus 2016, Schmidtz 2018). Others are motivated by an alternative account of the impartial point of view of an ideal spectator that involves consequentialist ranking of the justice of states of affairs instead of social agreement on general principles of justice for the basic structure (Sen 2009). And some arguments against ideal theory are accompanied by claims of Rawls’s purported indifference and refusal to seriously address questions of corrective justice for past and continuing injustices against racial, gender, and other groups (Mills 2016, 2020). These are complex criticisms and the debate over ideal theory warrants more discussion than can be given here. (See Simmons 2010 on Rawls, and Stemplowska & Swift 2012 more generally for helpful discussions of ideal theory.) The following remarks may help to further clarify Rawls’s ideal theory.
A primary reason Rawls imposes the strict compliance condition—the assumption by the parties in the original position that the principles chosen will be perfectly complied with in a well-ordered society—is that it reflects for Rawls the universality condition on objective moral principles mentioned earlier. The point of this condition Rawls says is that moral principles “must hold for everyone in virtue of their being moral persons” (TJ 114 rev.). Universality is violated if everyone cannot act on moral principles without self-contradiction, or self-defeating or undue consequences, Fundamental moral principles are also inadmissible should be they be reasonable to follow only when others observe different principles. This is the reason Rawls gives for claiming that “Principles [in the original position] are to be chosen in view of the consequences of everyone complying with them” (TJ 132/114 rev.).
Charles Mills argues that the fact that Rawls contends the principles of justice are justified by their unanimous acceptance and universal compliance within an ideal society proves their irrelevance and inability to assess injustice in our unjust racist society where these principles are neither widely accepted nor practiced. Rawls’s ideal theory applies only to the ideal circumstances of a perfectly just or at least nearly just well-ordered democracy for which they were designed. To assess our non-ideal circumstances requires a non-ideal theory that incorporates knowledge of our continuing history of racial injustice and that rectifies it and compensates its victims. (Mills, 2020) (See Shelby, 2004, 2013 for a more sympathetic discussion of Rawls and race and reply to Mills).
The purpose of the original position for Rawls is to ascertain the correct principles of justice that universally apply to assess injustice in non-ideal as well as ideal circumstances of injustice. Unanimous acceptance and strict compliance in a well-ordered society is a thought experiment designed for this purpose. These are familiar assumptions in moral philosophy which test whether moral principles universally apply and hold for everyone in virtue of their being free and equal moral persons or in some other capacity. Kant’s categorical imperative assesses the morality of our individual maxims by testing whether they can be universal laws of nature and universally willed within a Kingdom of Ends. (Kant 1785, ch.2) Ideal utilitarians evaluate the morality of actions and rules by universalizing them and assessing their consequences (Hare, 1981); and contractualism decides whether it is unreasonable for anyone to reject moral rules and outcomes. (Scanlon, 1982, 1998) The point of these hypothetical conjectures is to discover objective universal moral principles that apply to our non-ideal, unjust circumstances. As Rawls says of justice as fairness, “Existing injustices are to be judged in the light of this conception and held to be unjust to the extent that they depart from it without sufficient reason” (TJ, 216).
For Rawls then, we do not need a separate non-ideal theory to make these determinations of injustice in our society. That is the role of ideal theory. Rawls’s principles apply directly to assess injustice and its extent, without the mediation of non-ideal theory. (TJ 216 rev., 264 rev.) The role of non-ideal theory for Rawls is to inform us how to repair, reform and compensate for the injustices already determined by applying the universal principles of ideal theory directly to assess unjust practices and societies. So unlike Mills and Sen, for Rawls, “[N]onideal theory presupposes that ideal theory is already on hand” (CP 550). Even if they reject ideal theory, Mills, Sen and other critics, must rely upon universal principles of justice to fully ascertain the nature and degree of racial and other injustices that their non-ideal theories aim to rectify. For to reject the universality of fundamental principles is to endorse some form of relativism of morality, perhaps even moral skepticism. None of the critics mentioned above seem to want to endorse these positions. The fact that they reject ideal theory and Rawls’ original positon does not mean that his assumption of strict compliance is irrelevant to the justification of universal principles of justice that apply to our non-ideal world.
A Liberal Feminist Critique of the Original Position and Justice within the Family
Susan Okin was Rawls’s most notable liberal feminist critic during his lifetime. She argued that because Rawls’ original position presupposed (in the original edition of TJ) that the parties were “heads of families” they must be male and that wives “go completely unrepresented in the original position,” (Okin 1987, 49) As noted above in section 4, the reason for the “heads of families” assumption is to insure that “the interests of all,” including children and other descendants in future generations, are represented in the original position. It’s notable that Rawls used the plural “heads of family” which leaves open the understanding that both male and female parents are representatives in the OP (unlike use of the singular ‘the head of each family,’). In any event, Rawls says the parties do not know their biological sex or gender, just as they do not know whether they are married or unmarried, gay, trans, or ungendered, so they have no grounds for assuming they are either male or female. Finally, Rawls in the revised edition of Theory says that rather than the “heads of families” assumption, the problem of future generations can be addressed by assuming that all preceding generations have followed the same principles that the parties choose to apply to future generations. (Rawls TJ rev., 111 rev.)
Okin further contends that Rawls, in saying the family is part of the basic structure, assumed the monogamous family is just, and that this assumption is unwarranted. Rawls replies that “no particular form of the family (monogamous, hetereosexual, or otherwise) is so far required by a political conception of justice” so long it is arranged to fulfill the role of the family in the basic structure, of raising and caring for children, ensuring their moral development and education into the wider culture. (JF 163)
Okin contends that because the principles of justice do not apply to the family they do not secure equal justice for women and their children. Moreover, she says, Rawls pays no attention to the internal justice of the family and injustice towards women within the traditional monogamous family. (Okin 1989, 90–93) Rawls replies that this is a misconception since even though the principles of justice for the basic structure do not apply directly within the family, they apply within society so that women have the same equal basic rights, liberties and opportunities as men do and are socially and politically their equals. Moreover, the principles of justice impose constraints on families, and neither the equal basic rights and liberties or fair equal opportunities of women or basic rights and protections afforded children can be denied by other family members. (PL, 468–68). Still Rawls says that, because freedom of association allows married couples to decide division of labor within the family and who bears the greater responsibility for childcare, this raises questions of fairness and “local justice” within the family that is left undecided by the principles of justice. (JF 163–68) But “Some conception of justice is indeed viewed as appropriate for the family, and for other associations and cases of local justice.” Rawls JF 165, n.48. The implication however may be that principles of local justice and fairness that apply within associations, including the family, are not legally enforceable unless prearranged by contract among spouses or members of other associations. (cf. Nussbaum, 2003, 499–507)
Regarding this question of responsibility for childcare, Rawls says “Reproductive labor is socially necessary labor” (JF 162). He agrees with J.S. Mill, Okin and others that “a long and historic injustice to women is that they have borne, and continue to bear, a disproportionate share of the task of raising, nurturing, and caring for children,” (JF 166) “[S]teps need to be taken to either equalize their share or compensate them for it.” He continues, “[T]he law should count a wife’s work in raising children … as entitling her to an equal share in the income that her husband earns during their marriage” (PL 473). On its face, this has far-reaching implications, but Rawls does not pursue them—except to say that, should there be a divorce, the wife should have a right to half the increased value of the family’s assets during the time of marriage. It is left unclear whether a wife’s or spouse’s equal share to income for raising children implies any legally enforceable rights during marriage (such as jointly accessible bank accounts or separate bank accounts dividing half the family income) or whether these rights are contractually revisable (e.g. by a prenuptial contract). (See Schouten, 2019, on these issues and a more general sympathetic discussion of Rawls and liberal feminism.)
The Original Position and the Law of Peoples
In The Law of Peoples (1999), his essay on international justice, Rawls appeals to the original position a second time, to argue for principles of justice that hold among different political societies, or “peoples.” Rawls contends that a theory of social and political justice requires principles of justice to regulate the foreign relations of well-ordered societies with one another. He calls these principles “the law of peoples.” Since he conceives of the law of peoples as regulating relationships between political societies, he imagines an agreement, not among all the individuals in the world’s population, but, first, among the representatives of liberal democratic well-ordered societies. In this agreement among (liberal) peoples, each political society is to be regarded as equal, with equal rights of participation in this agreement; they each have the same number of representatives, no matter the size of their population. To represent the equality of peoples and guarantee fairness of the agreement, Rawls once again utilizes the original position as a hypothetical situation from which representatives of well-ordered liberal peoples decide principles of international justice. The parties to this agreement are once again to be regarded as ignorant of particular facts about their societies, including the size of their population, their natural resources and level of produced wealth, their social and ethnic cultures, and other particular facts, knowledge of which might result in unfair bargaining advantages and lead to an unfair agreement. The representatives of each society are motivated by their fundamental interest in maintaining the justice of their own societies, as this is defined by justice as fairness or some other liberal political conception.
Rawls contends that the law of peoples that would be agreed to among representatives of “free and democratic peoples” from the original position consists of (at least) eight principles (LP, 38). These principles, except for the last requiring a duty of assistance owed to “burdened peoples,” are familiar: They require respect for all peoples’ freedom and independence; the obligation to observe treaties and undertakings; the equality of peoples; a duty of non-intervention; a right of self-defense and no right to instigate war except in self-defense; a duty to honor human rights; a duty to observe restrictions on the conduct of wars; and finally the duty to assist “burdened peoples,” those living under unfavorable conditions that prevent their having a just or decent political and social regime (LP, 37). Rawls further maintains that non-liberal but “decent” peoples would also agree to these same principles in an original position. Decent peoples, though normally hierarchical and non-democratic, still respect human rights of everyone, and have a common good conception of justice that benefits all members of society. Rawls’s list of human rights include a right to life with rights to means of subsistence and security; rights to liberty, including freedom from servitude and forced occupation, and a certain degree of freedom of conscience to insure freedom of religion and of thought; a right to hold personal property; and to formal equality, that similar cases be treated similarly (LP, 65). Liberal peoples have a duty to observe the law of peoples in relations with decent peoples, even though decent peoples are not democratic or otherwise wholly just in a liberal sense in their internal organization and towards their members. But the law of peoples, including the duty of non-intervention, does not entirely apply in interactions with “outlaw regimes,” those which do not respect the human rights or good of their own people or of non-members. Liberal and decent societies may intervene in their internal affairs in order to protect the human rights of their members and others.
Rawls’s law of peoples has been widely criticized since it does not allow for an original position agreement among all the world’s members but only among their societies’ representatives. Nor (a related criticism) does Rawls envision agreement upon a global principle of distributive justice, such as a global difference principle, nor even a global tax on more advantaged societies’ wealth or natural resources, to be redistributed to less advantaged societies (see, e.g., Beitz, 1999; Pogge 1989, 2007; Tan, 2000). These are complicated issues that cannot be addressed here. (For a defense of Rawls, see Freeman 2007a, ch. 8–9 and 2007b ch.10.) In general, Rawls’s positions on these issues are grounded on an assumption of the political and institutional bases of distributive justice, and the fundamental role of society and its basic social institutions in the development of our natural and moral capacities and in determining our characters, aims, and future prospects.
Constructivism, Objectivity, Autonomy, and the Original Position
In A Theory of Justice Rawls provides a “Kantian Interpretation” of the original position and the principles of justice (TJ §§ 40, 78). The Kantian interpretation is a precursor to Rawls’s Kantian constructivism (CP, ch. 16), and his later political constructivism (PL, ch.3). Rawls says that for Kant, “a person is acting autonomously when the principles of his action are chosen by him as the most adequate possible expression of his nature as a free and equal rational being” (TJ 252/222 rev.). What is missing from Kant, Rawls says, is an attempt to show how moral principles express our nature. “This defect is made good [by] the original position” (TJ 255 /224 rev.). The original position can be interpreted as a “procedural interpretation” of our nature as free and equal rational beings, and therewith of Kant’s conception of autonomy and the categorical imperative (TJ 256 /226 rev.). For in the original position, because of the veil of ignorance and other moral constraints, the parties’ choice is made “independent of natural contingencies and accidental social circumstances” (TJ 515/451 rev.); thus the principles of justice are not chosen “heteronomously,” on the basis of our social position, natural endowments, particular wants, or the particular kind of society we live in (TJ 252/222 rev.). Instead, the parties are all represented in the same way, as free and equal rational persons with a capacity for a sense of justice who choose principles of justice subject to all relevant moral conditions. Rawls says that the original position might thus be regarded as incorporating “conditions that best express their nature as free and equal rational beings.” On a Kantian view, our moral nature is defined by the moral powers, our capacities for practical reasoning, to be rational and reasonable. The moral powers are the relevant capacities of practical reasoning that relate to justice. “Acting autonomously is acting from principles that we would consent to as free and equal rational beings” (TJ 516/453 rev.). The description of the original position expresses “what it means to be a free and equal rational being,” and even “resembles the point of view of noumenal selves” (TJ 255–256/225 rev.).
In addition to expressing our autonomy, the original position is also said to be objective (TJ 587/514 rev.). For it requires that the parties adopt a common impartial standpoint and make a considered rational choice and agree under conditions that require them to abstract from their particular interests and circumstances. Moreover, all are motivated by higher-order interests in their moral powers, which represent their “nature as free and equal rational beings.” Finally, the OP is designed to incorporate all the relevant reasons and restrictions on arguments for principles of social and political justice for the basic structure (TJ 18/16 rev.). In so far as the OP is an appropriately defined objective point of view incorporating all relevant moral reasons and conditions on rational choice of principles of justice, and the parties therein come to a unanimous agreement, then, Rawls says, the principles agreed to are also objective (TJ 516–517/453 rev.). Together with the universality requirement, we can infer from the objectivity of the principles of justice that they apply to and are binding on persons in all societies. As Rawls says of the original position in concluding TJ, “to see our place in society from the perspective of this position is to see it sub specie aeternitatis: it is to regard the human situation not only from all social but also all temporal points of view” (TJ 587/514).
Rawls affirms the objectivity and “correctness” of the principles of justice, and he says they are the “most reasonable” principles. But he does not say at any point that the principles of justice are “true.” He does however say that judgments based upon the principles of justice are true, and this applies to both particular judgments and to the moral rules of justice that are required by the principles of justice (CP 355). These claims are implicit in Rawls’s Kantian constructivism. (It is noteworthy that Kant himself did not say that the categorical imperative is true; instead he said it is “universally valid.”) In general, constructivism in moral philosophy is a view about the possibility of the correctness of moral principles and judgment. “Realism” says that the correctness of moral judgments resides in their truth, and that truth of most fundamental moral principles consists in their corresponding to a moral order (of moral facts or objects) that is antecedent to reason and to principles of practical reasoning. Objectivity of moral judgment is then defined by realists as judgment made from a perspective of reasoning that is likely to lead to discernment of these antecedent objects of truth. In “Kantian Constructivism in Moral Theory” (Lecture III, CP 340ff.), Rawls discusses a version of realism found in Henry Sidgwick and G.E. Moore, “rational intuitionism,” which he contrasts with moral constructivism.
Kantian constructivism inverts the relationship realists see between objectivity and truth; rather than objective judgments being grounded in the discernment of antecedent objects of truth, objectivity (of judgment) precedes the object (of truth). This means that at the level of fundamental moral principles the correctness of these principles depends, not on their correspondence to a prior moral order, but on their following from (or being among) the fundamental principles of practical reasoning. The objectivity of judgment that is involved in reasoning from an objective perspective according to relevant principles of practical reasoning results in objective moral principles that are the bases for judgments of moral truth, or “correctness” as Rawls says. The moral facts that are the objects of these moral truths are not then prior to, but are the facts that are singled out as relevant by moral principles and principles of practical reasoning (CP 516).
Among other advantages, moral constructivism relieves moral theory of the burden of having to account for the correctness of moral judgments in terms of their correspondence to a mysterious domain of moral facts (natural or non-natural) that must exist prior to practical reasoning. Constructivism also enables Rawls to provide an account of the objectivity of moral judgment and correctness of moral principles that is consistent with a Kantian idea of autonomy, In setting forth in detail the manner in which the principles of justice are justified on the basis of certain conceptions and principles that originate in practical reasoning itself, Rawls sees himself as having carried through with the Kantian aspiration of showing how moral principles of justice are the result of “reason giving principles to itself, out of its own resources.”
The original position plays a crucial role in Kantian constructivism. Rawls says the original position is a “procedure of construction” that specifies an objective point of view from which to derive objective principles of justice. Principles of justice are “constructed” on the basis of ideal conceptions of the person and of society (‘ideas of reason’, in Kant’s sense). In “Kantian Constructivism in Moral Theory” (CP ch.16), Rawls alters the Kantian interpretation’s idea of “our nature as free and equal rational beings,” into an ideal “conception of the person,” regarded as a “free and equal moral person,” with the two moral powers of practical reasoning. It is this conception of the person, along with the ideal of social cooperation represented by a well-ordered society, that is “modeled” or “mirrored” by the original position. In “Kantian Constructivism,” Lecture II, Rawls explains how each of the relevant features of the original position (including the veil of ignorance and the description of the parties as “rational agents of construction”) “represent” in some fashion the ideal conception of the person and of society that underwrite Kantian constructivism. Since the original position presumably represents all the relevant ideas and principles of practical reason, Rawls contends that whatever principles chosen therein are objectively correct, as a matter of “pure procedural justice at the highest level” of practical reasoning. (See below on the role of the original position in reflective equilibrium.)
Political Constructivism: Subsequently, in Political Liberalism, Rawls “brackets” (he neither affirms nor denies) claims about the nature and possibility of moral truth and universal objectivity of moral judgments. Still, Rawls affirms “for political purposes” the objectivity of the original position and therewith of the principles of justice. Once again, the original position is set up to represent and model an ideal of persons and society. But Rawls detaches the ideal of free and equal moral persons from the Kantian Interpretation, and now regards it as a purely “political ideal” of citizens that is implicit in the political culture of a democratic society. The political ideals of free and equal citizens and of society as well-ordered provide the basis for “political constructivism” where the original position again plays its role as a procedure of construction for political principles of justice. Rawls contends that the original position bestows “political objectivity” on principles of justice. Political objectivity is a kind of objectivity that presumably even moral relativists and skeptics can accept, so long as they are “reasonable” and have an effective sense of justice. It does not imply that the principles of justice apply universally across all social and temporal conditions. Instead, principles of justice are objective in so far as they apply to all reasonable and rational persons who conceive of themselves as free and equal citizens, have a sense of justice, and want to cooperate with others on terms that reasonable persons call all accept.
If we see the original position as a procedure of construction, then perhaps we can gain a clearer idea of the role of the idea of a social contract in Rawls’s and other arguments for principles of justice. A frequent criticism of social contract doctrines, dating back to David Hume, is that the idea of agreement (hypothetical or actual) does no real work in justifying principles of justice. The justification of principles is said rather to reside in the reasons for the parties’ agreement; the social contract itself does not add to but only obscures the force of these reasons. Thus Hume argued that Locke’s social contract argument is an unnecessary shuffle, and that political obligations and the duty of allegiance cannot be based simply on a promise or agreement. For why should we honor our promises and agreements? It can only be because of their public utility, Hume says. But political obligation is also grounded in the public utility of people respecting political authority and obeying its laws. Hence there is no need to refer to any social contract to ground political obligations, since all have their justification in public utility (Hume 1748 ; Rawls, LHPP, 169–173).
To respond: It is certainly true that the reasons motivating the parties in the original position (their freedom to pursue their good, their higher-order interests in developing the moral powers, acquiring an adequate share of primary goods, etc.) as well as the reasons and ideals modeled by the original position itself (the freedom and equality of moral persons, fairness, publicity, the ideal of a well-ordered society, and so on) are fundamental to the justification of the principles of justice agreed to. But this does not mean that the agreement from the original position plays no essential role in the justification of these principles. For the original position itself is designed to be a representation and summary of all the moral reasons and rational interests relevant to justifying principles of justice. Even if it be conceded that rational choice and agreement in the original position, or reasonable agreement in a well-ordered society, do not provide independent reasons for principles of justice, still they serve the crucial, if not necessary role of organizing the reasons that the original position incorporates and authorizing inference to the principles of justice.
Consider a parallel argument to the contention that agreement in the original position provides no reasons for and plays no role in justifying principles of justice. We would surely think it peculiar if someone said of a formal proof: “The reasons for the proven theorem are provided by the axioms it presupposes and not by the rules of inference enabling proof.” For rules of inference are indispensable for proof of any deductive conclusion. Agreement in the original position plays a somewhat similar role in the justification of the principles of justice. Agreement in the original position is not itself a proof from prior premises according to rules of deductive inference. But like rules of deductive inference, agreement in the original position establishes the justifying connection between relevant moral and practical reasons (incorporated into the original position itself) and principles of justice.
Rawls conjectures in Theory that the argument in the OP “aims eventually to be strictly deductive….a kind of moral geometry” (TJ 121/104–5; see also JF 17, 83). This is not a concession to Hume’s argument, since Rawls envisions the parties’ selection of the principles of justice as part of this conjectured deduction (JF 133). Moreover, even assuming there is a very complicated deductive proof (not what Hume envisioned) of the principles of justice that does not rely on a hypothetical contract—Rawls’s attitude would be that the original position argument still serves as a useful heuristic for public reason that enables citizens to understand the enormous complexities of this conjectured proof. Finally, Rawls later qualifies his claim of deductive proof and says that in fact the argument from the original position cannot “fully attain” an ideal of rigorous deductive reasoning; for there are indefinitely many considerations to be appealed to in the original position, and deciding the balance of reasons in favor of the principles of justice depends, not on deduction, but “on judgment informed and guided by reasoning” (JF 133–4).
Finally, what is the relationship between the original position and Rawls’s non-foundationalist method of justification, “reflective equilibrium”? Rawls distinguishes three points of view; that of the artificial parties in the original position; of the idealized members of a well-ordered society; and “that of you and me” (PL 28), which is the position from which any conception of justice is to be assessed in reflective equilibrium. Reflective equilibrium begins with our shared “considered convictions” of justice at all levels of generality, from particular to our most general judgments. It then seeks to discover the principles of justice that best “fit” with these considered convictions in a “wide reflective equilibrium,” after considering all the reasonable alternative conceptions of justice (see TJ § 9; JF § 10).
Rawls said at one point that “reflective equilibrium works through the original position.” The suggestion is that the original position itself supplies, in large part, the relevant sense of “best fit” of considered moral convictions with principles of justice. The principles of justice that best fit with our considered convictions of justice are those that would be chosen by rational persons within this hypothetical-choice “procedure of construction,” which itself “represents” our considered convictions regarding all the relevant reasons for arguments about principles of social justice. Rawls says in concluding A Theory of Justice, “Each aspect of the original position can be given a supporting explanation. Thus what we are doing is to combine into one conception the totality of conditions which we are ready upon due reflection to recognize as reasonable in our conduct towards one another” (TJ 587/514). (See Scanlon 2003, 2014 on Rawls on justification and constructivism, and Raz, 1990, for critical assessment of Rawls on these topics.)
Is the Original Position Necessary or Relevant?
In conclusion, consider the objection that the original position is not necessary or even morally relevant. There are at least two notable versions of this argument; the more common one, initially set forth by Hume, has been discussed in the previous section. See also Sen, 2009. Here I outline a more sympathetic version of the objection by a fellow contractualist, T.M. Scanlon, and affirmed by Jürgen Habermas (Habermas, 1995)
As discussed earlier, Rawls depicts two social contracts: rational agreement among interested parties in the original position corresponds to reasonable agreement among members of a well-ordered society motivated by their sense of justice. This correspondence suggests, T.M. Scanlon says, that, rather than the original position, “the point of view which the theory takes as fundamental is actually that of a person in society” (Scanlon 1973 [1975, 177]). Scanlon contends that since the arguments in the original position except maximin depend upon general acceptance of the principles of justice among reasonable persons in a well-ordered society, the original position is not necessary. Moreover, the idea of self-interested agreement behind the veil of ignorance distracts from the real justification for the principles of justice—that they are reasonably acceptable and could be justified to persons with a sense of justice in a well-ordered society (Scanlon, 1982, 127). Scanlon’s own contractualism relies upon a similar idea of morally motivated persons’ agreement on a system of rules for the regulation of behavior that no one could reasonably reject (1982, 110). He abjures the idea of rational choice and agreement by interested parties from an original position or other impartial perspective.
Rawls says that one reason for denying the parties information about themselves and imposing the veil of ignorance is that for a contract theory to rely only on an informal idea of reasonable acceptability and agreement among persons situated in society is less precise and its results less definite. If full information of particular facts were allowed the parties, “only a few rather obvious cases could be decided. A conception of justice based on unanimity in these circumstances would indeed be weak and trivial” (TJ 141). Here one might reply that Rawls is shortchanging the force of his own arguments, from the strains of commitment, publicity, self-respect, and reciprocity, all of which depend on the point of view of reasonable persons in a well-ordered society. Perhaps Rawls thought the maximin argument was needed to complement these arguments. In any case the main objection Scanlon raises seems to be that purely rational choice and agreement based in individuals’ interests is not representative of or relevant to moral justification of principles. The (self-) interested choice of rational individuals, even if behind the impartial veil of ignorance, bears little resemblance or relationship to moral judgment and justification among reasonable persons in society. Joshua Cohen has raised similar objections (J. Cohen 2015).
The answer to this objection is too complex to fully address here. It begins with Rawls’s assumption of the circumstances of justice, that questions of social justice arise due to pluralism and the conflict of individuals’ legitimate pursuit of their individual interests. Since justice for Rawls concerns the fair terms of social cooperation among persons with different interests and conceptions of their good, he evidently thinks their “essential interests,” – those essential to the rational pursuit of their good, including the moral powers and primary social goods – should be represented in the agreement on principles of justice that structure their social relations. These interests are especially relevant to agreement on principles of justice for the basic structure, for the primary goods are what these principles distribute. Moreover, the specification of the basic liberties and their priority hinge upon the fundamental interests of free and equal moral persons in the development and exercise of their moral powers. (PL ch.8)
Second, like Kant, Rawls regards moral principles as the imposition of reasonable constraints on individuals’ rational deliberations, choices, and actions in pursuit of their interests. This is the “priority of right” over the good (TJ 31f./27f.), which for Rawls represents the structure of practical reasoning of free and equal moral persons. As Kant (according to Rawls, LHMP and CP 497ff.) seeks to model the structure of practical reasoning in the categorical imperative procedure, so Rawls seeks to model the priority of right over the good in the original position by the reasonable constraints imposed on rational individuals’ choice of principles that equitably promote their good.
Third, Rawls is deeply concerned (again like Kant) with demonstrating that the Right and the Good are “congruent.” Congruence in Theory means, first, that, assuming the most reasonable principles are established, justice and the corresponding sense of justice are compatible with our rational pursuit of our individual interests. Moreover, justice and the exercise of their capacities for justice can be a fundamental good for moral persons, worth pursuing and incorporating into their life plans for its own sake (TJ 398/350 rev.; 567–75/496–505 rev.). (See also, Freeman, 2003, 277–315.) Showing that the right and the good are “congruent” is essential to Rawls’s argument for the stability of justice as fairness in a well-ordered society in Theory of Justice. It is also essential to the revisions of this argument in Political Liberalism where the congruence argument takes the form of showing that there can be an overlapping consensus on justice as fairness among reasonable persons’ conceptions of the good as informed by the reasonable comprehensive religious, philosophical and moral doctrines they affirm as members of a well-ordered society of justice as fairness.
These considerations are all relevant to Rawls’s reasons for “modeling” reasonable agreement on principles of justice among members of a well-ordered society in the original position and the parties’ rational agreement behind the veil of ignorance.