Notes to Pascal's Wager

1. Hájek 2012 argues that in fact this is too quick. This article considers a series of increasingly strong senses of “superdominance” (the one considered here is “superdominance+”), and he argues that none of them is strong enough to confer such a requirement. This, in turn, casts doubt on the validity of the first of Pascal’s wagers. However, the details get somewhat intricate, and I have chosen not to get into them in this exposition.

2. Those interested in the reconstruction over the years of the text itself should consult Lafuma 1954.

3. Our demarcation of the arguments follows that of Hacking 1972, although we will differ on certain points of detail.

4. Unfortunately, he squanders this insight when he lapses back to the assumption that the probability is 1/2 shortly thereafter: “And so our proposition is of infinite force, when there is the finite to stake in a game where there are equal risks of gain and of loss, and the infinite to gain.”

5. Consider a gamble that pays you \(W\) units (for ‘win’) if \(X\), and nothing otherwise. We are seeking the fair price \(f\), at which you should be indifferent between playing the gamble and not; you should be prepared to pay that much, but no more. Expected utility theory tells us that the fair price is the gamble’s expected utility:

\[ f = P(X)W \]

where \(P(X)\) is the chance of gain (and so \(1 - P(X)\) is the chance of loss).

Let’s derive this from Pascal’s answer, quoted here again:

… the uncertainty of the gain is proportioned to the certainty of the stake according to the proportion of the chances of gain and loss …

You will pay \(f\) with certainty: this is “the certainty of the stake”. It is uncertain whether you win, but if you do your gain is \(W - f\): this is “the uncertainty of the gain”. This is proportioned to the certainty of the stake, \(f\)—that is,

\[ \frac{f}{W-f} \]

according to

\[ \frac{P(X)}{1 - P(X)} \]

That is,

\[ \frac{f}{W-f} = \frac{P(X)}{1 - P(X)} \]

Simple algebra gives

\[ f - fP(X) = P(X)W - fP(X) \]

and hence

\[ f = P(X)W \]

The fair price is the gamble’s expected utility!

6. In the basic version of decision theory that we have presented, states are assumed to be independent of actions. Evidential decision theory generalizes this. It replaces in its expectation calculation for a given action the unconditional probabilities of states by the conditional probabilities of the states, given the action—see Jeffrey 1983. Now perhaps what you do is not independent of whether God exists. For instance, maybe God helps people wager for Him, so that

\[ {\scriptsize P(\text{God exists} \mid \text{you wager for God}) \gt P(\text{God exists} \mid \text{you wager against God}).} \]

Still, the expected utility calculations are as before, provided the first conditional probability is positive and finite: infinite for wagering for God, finite for wagering against God.

Causal decision theory replaces evidential decision theory’s conditional probabilities with probabilities that capture the degree of causal relevance of an action to each state. There are various versions of causal decision theory—see Lewis 1981. Using some such version would presumably not significantly affect matters here. We would just replace the assumption that your probability is positive and finite with the same assumption about whatever probability is used instead.

7. After all, infinite utilities run afoul of the Archimedean, or continuity axiom that is commonly assumed in decision theory:

If you prefer \(A\) to \(B\), and prefer \(B\) to \(C\), then there is a gamble between \(A\) and \(C\) (\(A\) with probability \(p\), \(C\) with probability \(1 - p\), for some real-valued \(p\)) that you regard as equally desirable as \(B\) for sure.

For suppose that salvation, say, has infinite utility for you. You prefer salvation to $1, and prefer $1 to nothing; but there is no such gamble that rewards you with salvation if you win, and nothing if you lose, that you value at $1. Indeed, assuming that the probability of winning remains positive, you prefer the gamble to any finite reward; but if the probability of winning drops to 0, your preference discontinuously switches to the finite reward. The objection, then, is that infinite utilities run afoul of the underpinnings of decision theory (by violating a preference axiom), and thus of the theory itself. Yet that theory is appealed to in Premise 3 of the argument. In short, Premise 1 is in tension with Premise 3.

The issue then becomes whether continuity is a requirement on rational preference. Hájek 1997 argues that it is not, and gives further positive arguments for allowing infinite utilities into decision theory. Sorensen 1994 likewise argues for “infinite decision theory”. For a highly technical presentation of ‘non-Archimedean’ decision theory, see Skalia 1975. For related work on infinite utilities that is more philosophical, see Cain 1995, Nelson 1991, Ng 1995, Vallentyne 1993, Vallentyne 1995, Vallentyne and Kagan 1997, and van Liedekerke 1995. Some of the literature on the so-called two-envelope problem is also relevant—see, for example, Broome 1995, Castell and Batens 1994, Chalmers 1997, Jackson et al. 1994, Nalebuff 1989.

8. It should be pointed out that the rival Gods must award infinite utility for salvation in order to create a problem—otherwise they will be trumped by the ones that do. (It seems that Kali and Odin thus drop out of consideration, for example.) And to be damaging to the Wager, the alternative hypotheses about how salvation is achieved should be mutually exclusive. If there is some common core to the theistic hypotheses, and it suffices to (strive to) believe that in order to be saved, then there is no problem. For instance, it will not matter that you do not know what God’s favorite real number is, if it turns out that you are saved as long as your belief is adequate in other respects. So it is crucial that salvation hinges on getting the details of the belief right. What, then, should we believe? To settle this question, it seems we get nowhere with Pascal-style practical reasoning.

One response is that we are therefore in a position somewhat like that of Buridan’s ass, unable to settle which course of action is best; and that like the ass we are better off doing something rather than nothing, and in this case that means choosing one of the theistic hypotheses, and hoping we choose the right one. So it might still be rationally required to be a theist. See Jordan 1994a for a version of this “ecumenical” response. There are at least two counter-responses. Firstly, the assumption that there are alternative Gods who offer infinite rewards really plays no role in the many-Gods objection. All that matters is that there are sources of infinite reward besides Pascal’s God. These sources could even be inanimate—as it might be, supreme pleasure machines, which offer infinite utility irrespective of one’s beliefs. Secondly, one of the alternative Gods might punish those who wager for him, and reward those who don’t—see Martin’s 1983 “perverse master”.

9. Here are the third and fourth problems for Premise 2.

3. Infinitesimal probability for God’s existence.

One might reply that you can rationally assign infinitesimal probability to God’s existence—see e.g. Oppy 1990. The argument might run, for example, that there are infinitely many possible Gods to consider (see our discussion of the many Gods objection), and for some infinite subset of them that includes Pascal’s God, rationality does not favor any one over the rest. Treating them even-handedly then requires assigning infinitesimal probability to each. Or again, a Bayesian might say that you could coherently assign to God’s existence an infinitesimal probability, provided that you also assign a probability to God’s non-existence that falls short of 1 by the same infinitesimal.

It is remarkable that Pascal anticipated the notion of infinitesimal probability, when he says: “if there were an infinity of chances, of which one only would be for you, you would still be right in wagering one [life] … if there were an infinity of an infinitely happy life to gain.” But what he says here is far from obvious. If \(\infty\) is a legitimate utility value, then offhand it would seem that \(1/\infty\) is a legitimate probability value, and indeed it seems to be the very one that he is considering. However, then we have:

\[ \mathrm{E}(\text{wager for God}) = \infty \times \frac{1}{\infty} + f_1 \times \left(1 - \frac{1}{\infty}\right) \approx 1 + f_1 \]

And it is not clear that this should exceed \(f_3\).

All of this treats \(\infty\) as if it is a number, subject to ordinary arithmetic operations, such as taking reciprocals, multiplying and adding. Perhaps, for example, \(\infty \times (1/\infty)\) is not defined, much as \(\infty - \infty\) is not. But that is just another way in which a probability of \((1/\infty)\) might thwart Pascal’s reasoning. We will say more below about infinite numbers for which such arithmetic operations are unproblematic.

4. Imprecise (vague) probability for God’s existence

So far we have presupposed that probability assignments are sharp. However, Pascal’s argument is addressed to us—mere humans. And it is apparently a fact about us that our belief states are irremediably imprecise: we cannot assign probability, precise to indefinitely many decimal places, to all propositions. (Such imprecision about probabilities is also called “vagueness”.) Or perhaps even ideally rational agents may, or indeed should, assign imprecise probabilities when their relevant evidence is impoverished, as Pascal thinks that it is here. (See Joyce 2005 for more on this route to imprecise probabilities in general.) Perhaps, then, rationality permits us to assign imprecise probability to God’s existence. If it moreover permits us to assign it probability that is imprecise over an interval that includes 0, then the Wager fails—see Hájek 2000. Indeed, Pascal’s claim that “[reason] can decide nothing here” might be thought to support a probability assignment to God’s existence that is imprecise over the entire \([0, 1]\) interval.

10. One could also insist that rational choices must be ratifiable (à la Jeffrey 1983 or Sobel 1996), and that the act of maximum expectation might not be.

A common rationale for maximizing expectation comes from the various laws of large numbers. Their content is roughly that under suitable circumstances, in the limit, one’s average reward tends to the expectation; and of course one wants to maximize one’s average reward. But the strong law of large numbers assumes that the expectation is finite, and since the expectation of wagering for God is putatively infinite, it clearly cannot be appealed to here. (See e.g. Feller 1971, 236.) Perhaps an appeal to the weak law of large numbers, which allows infinite expectation, would suffice. But being a limit theorem, it concerns infinitely long runs of trials. Far from having such a long run here, we have just a single-shot decision problem. This is a decision that you do not get to repeat. This is not so troubling, perhaps, when the variance (a measure of the spread of the distribution of outcomes) is small, so that getting an outcome close to the expectation is probable; but what about when the variance is large?

This brings us to yet another problem for Pascal’s third premise. To be sure, the expectation of wagering for God is infinite, if we accept Pascal’s earlier assumptions; but so too is the variance. Expectation does not seem to be such a good guide to choiceworthiness when the variance is large—for what one might end up getting can then be much worse than the expectation—let alone when the variance is infinite. (See Weirich 1984 and Sorensen 1994 for versions of this last point.) Indeed, the lower one makes \(f_2\) (or more generally, some highly dispreferred outcome), the less compelling premise 3 seems; and the lower one makes the probability of salvation (or more generally, of some highly desired outcome), the less compelling premise 3 seems. Yet consistent with premise 1, \(f_2\) could be (almost) as low as one likes, and consistent with premise 2, the probability of salvation could be (almost) as low as one likes.

11. Recall Schlesinger’s (1994, 90) tie-breaking principle: “In cases where the mathematical expectations are infinite, the criterion for choosing the outcome to bet on is its probability”. Similarly, Golding (1994, 139–140) offers this principle: “given a decision problem where an infinite value is at stake, the option that offers the highest probability of attaining the infinite value is the rational choice, regardless of what other probabilities or finite values are at stake”. This clearly rules out the coin-tossing strategy, the die-tossing strategy, and all the other mixed strategies, since these have lower probabilities of your achieving salvation than outright wagering for God does. Sorensen 1994 objects to Schlesinger’s principle as being ad hoc. One way of putting the objection is that the principle lacks the foundational support that maximizing expected utility has. Bartha 2007 provides it such support. Be that as it may, Pascal does not appeal to the principle in his argument. As it stands, the argument is apparently invalid.

The problem is that multiplying ∞ by any positive, finite probability again yields ∞. Let us call this property of ∞ reflexivity under multiplication (by such a probability). Such reflexivity is at once the strength of the Wager (for then Pascal does not need to say anything more about your probability of God’s existence), and its weakness (for then all the various mixed strategies get maximal expectation also). One could try to fix the weakness, while saving as much one can of the strength. This would involve finding a utility for salvation that is not reflexive under multiplication, yet which is still sufficiently large to swamp your probability, whatever it is, in the expectation calculation.

For instance, if the utility of salvation were enormous, but finite (as it is on Golding’s reading of the Wager, 1994, 130–131), then the mixed strategies would yield lower expectation than outright wagering for God (multiplying that utility by 1/2, 1/6, etc. makes a difference). And the utility could be made enormous enough to offset any actual person’s probability assignment, however small (provided it is positive and finite), so that the expectation of outright belief is maximal for everybody. Or suppose that the utility of salvation were an infinite number that is not reflexive under multiplication. Consider, for example, the infinite numbers of non-standard analysis (see Robinson 1966, Nelson 1987), or the surreal infinite numbers of Conway 1976. Multiplication of such a utility by a positive, finite probability (less than 1) yields another, smaller infinite number. So the expectation of wagering for God again exceeds that of wagering against God, whatever your probability is (provided it is positive and finite), and also that of each mixed strategy. See Hájek 2004 for various devices along these lines.

These proposals appear to yield valid arguments for wagering for God, where Pascal’s argument was invalid. The trouble is that they do not seem adequately to capture Pascal’s reasoning. He writes: “Unity added to infinity adds nothing to it”. Let us call this property of infinity reflexivity under addition. We can see why Pascal would want the utility of salvation to be reflexive under addition: salvation is supposed to be the best possible thing. But if that utility is finite, or non-standard infinite, or surreal infinite, then adding one to it does make a difference. What is wanted, then, is the seemingly impossible: a representation of the reward of salvation that is reflexive under addition (so that it cannot be bettered), but not reflexive under multiplication by positive, finite probabilities (so that the mixed strategies can be distinguished in expectation from outright belief). See Hájek 2012 for further reformulations of Pascal’s Wager that appear to be valid; moreover, one of them capture’s Pascal’s idea of salvation being the best thing possible, with the utility of salvation being ∞, while the utility of damnation is −∞ (the way that some authors understand the Wager in the first place). See also Herzberg 2011 for a valid reformulation of Pascal’s Wager with hyperreal utilities.

Another approach, more faithful to Pascal’s theology, eschews premise 1’s numerical utilities altogether, opting instead for comparative judgments of value, and making suitable adjustments elsewhere in the argument. For example, Rota 2016 offers a reformulation that replaces premise 1’s values of \(\infty\), \(f_1\), \(f_2\), \(f_3\), with O1, O2, O3, O4, respectively, where O1 is much greater than O3, and O2 is either greater than, equal to, or only a small amount less than O4. Premise 2’s quantification over all positive probabilities is replaced by one over probabilities of \(1/2\) or higher. The conclusion essentially is that practical rationality requires agents with such probabilities to wager for God (slightly changing Rota’s wording to conform with ours).

Copyright © 2017 by
Alan Hájek <>

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