Notes to Peirce’s Deductive Logic

1. Peano’s arithmetic, Russell and Whitehead’s systems, Gentzen’s natural deductive systems, Hilbert’s programs, and Gödel’s incompleteness theorems are prime examples.

2. According to Peirce’s terminology, there are three kinds of predicates, “absolute terms”, “simple relative terms”, and “conjugative terms” (DNLR [CP 3.63]). These correspond to monadic, dyadic, and ternary predicates, in modern terminology. Also, there is a controversy over “relatives” versus “relations”. Refer to Merrill 1990: 160–163. “I conclude that [Peirce’s] simple relative terms stand for dyadic relations” (1990: 162).

3. Benjamin Peirce placed mathematics before logic (see entry on Benjamin Peirce). Charles Peirce gave full credit to his father’s warning against not-so-mathematical philosophical reasoning for steering him away from his early ambition to combine philosophy, logic, and mathematics (CP 1.560 c. 1905).

4. This occurs as early as his work, Formal Logic (De Morgan 1847).

5. “De Morgan’s own outlook remaining essentially syllogistic, which …would liable to impede him, unfortunately, from definitively taking a radically novel point of view” (Hawkins 1995: 137).

6. “In his [De Morgan’s] effort to break the bonds of traditional logic and to expand the limits of logical inquiry, he directed his attention to the general concept of relations and fully recognized its significance. Nevertheless, De Morgan cannot be regarded as the creator of the modern theory of relations, since he did not possess an adequate apparatus for treating the subject in which he was interested, and was apparently unable to create such an apparatus” (Tarski 1941: 73).

7. Emily Michael (1974) argues for Peirce’s independence, while Daniel Merrill (1978) presents a more nuanced picture by tracking down the correspondences between De Morgan and Peirce.

8. For more details, see Michael (1974) and Merrill (1978: 257–266). The following is one of Peirce’s first examples for relational arguments:

Everyone loves him whom he treats kindly.
James treats John kindly.
Therefore, James loves John.

(Peirce 1866: 10 and quoted in Merrill 1978: 258)

9. George Boole’s work (1847) has been considered as the first systematic and ambitious project to represent logical concepts in terms of algebra. For more details, see section 3 of the entry on George Boole.

10. Houser correctly observes that “[w]hat is most evident in his work is the importance Peirce attached to his basic analysis of relations” (1997: 14).

11. Some relate the distinction between property and relation in terms to Peirce’s own distinction between corollarial and theorematic reasoning. That is, for monadic inference, simple corollarial reasoning is carried out while the logic of relation involves more complicated and ingenious theorematic reasoning (Hintikka 1980 and Shin 1997).

12. What does “,” mean here? For a record, the following citation is in order:

Thus far, we have considered the multiplication of relative terms only. Since our conception of multiplication is the application of a relation, we can only multiply absolute terms by considering them as relatives. Now the absolute term “man” is really exactly equivalent to the relative term “man that is —,” and so with any other. I shall write a comma after any absolute term to show that it is so regarded as a relative term. (DNLR [CP 3.73])

This is interesting indeed, as Brady points out: “We see here an interesting feature of Peirce’s 1870 paper. Peirce takes the multiplication of relative terms as primitive” (Brady 2000: 35). This interpretation is consistent with the citation from DNLR [CP 3.68], where Peirce himself starts with the application of a relation, not the relation of a property. A slightly different, but compatible, interpretation was suggested by the reviewer: Peirce’s symbol “,” is an interesting operation which turns a property into a relation.

13. “Some As are Bs” is an existential statement. Peirce called them particular propositions. “As for particular propositions, Boole could not accurately express them at all” (DNLR [CP 3.138]).

14. “These letters may be conceived to be finite in number or innumerable” (1882a [CP 3.306]).

15. Even though the basic idea for ordered pairs existed in the 1870 paper, we can see more clearly how it is combined with quantifiers and bound variables in the 1883a Note.

16. Using more familiar notation, \(l = \{\langle A, C\rangle, \langle B, D\rangle\}\).

17. The next section “Second-intentional logic” is the first place where second-order logic was discussed. “Peirce’s 1885 paper was his first attempt to formalize higher mathematical notions in the higher order theory of relatives” (Brady 2000: 132). The representation of quantifiers led Peirce to explore whether relatives may be quantified. For this topic, refer to Putnam 1982 and Goldfarb 1979.

18. 1885a [CP 3.396]. Our modern notation is used here. The expression “\(\phi(x)\)” is a formula whose unbound variable is \(x\). More rules are found in the undated Note (see 1885b).

19. Out of the three volumes Peirce’s influence was clear in Vol. 2 and part of Vol. 3, and both of them were published in 1895.

20. “I do believe that the calculus of relations deserves much more attention than it receives” (Tarkski 1941: 89).

21. Frege does not think these two features are not exclusive to each other mainly because he locates a difference between propositional and quantified logic. Hence, Frege believed that his own system Begriffsschrift is both calculus ratiocinator and a lingua characterica.

22. Peirce’s letter (1882b) to O.H. Mitchell showed that he had started playing around with the possibility of graphically representing relations. See Roberts 1973: 18.

23. Peirce’s theory of signs is complicated. See entry on Peirce’s theory of signs and Short 2007: ch. 8.

24. For example, 1885a [CP 3.359–362], and part of 1903d [CP 2.247–249]. Also refer to Dipert 1996.

25. See Grattan-Guinness 2002 and Shin 2012 for a discussion of the relationship between Peirce’s ideas and Kempe’s.

26. Much more interesting work can be done for this claim.

27. For the comparison between these two graphical systems, refer to Shin 2002: 48–53.

28. For more details, refer to Shin 2002: §4.3.

29. If we desire to match the syntax and the reading method in an obvious way, we may have the following alternative definition for well-formed diagrams:

  1. An empty space is a well-formed diagram.
  2. Any letter is a well-formed diagram.
  3. If \(D\) is a well-formed diagram, then a single cut of \(D\) (“\([D]\)”) is a well-formed diagram as well.
  4. If \(D_{1}\) and \(D_{2}\) are well-formed diagrams, then all of the followings are also well-formed:
    1. \(D_{1}\) \(D_{2}\)
    2. \([D_{1}\ D_{2}]\)
    3. \([D_{1}\ [D_{2}]]\)
    4. \([[D_{1}]\ [D_{2}]]\)
  5. Nothing else is a well-formed diagram.

30. For the proof of the legitimacy of the Multiple readings algorithm, refer to Shin 2002, §4.2.2, where the equivalence of the Endoporeutic and the Multiple readings is proven.

31. Roberts’ slightly rearranged version is:

Transformation Rules

  • [R1] The rule of erasure. Any evenly enclosed graph may be erased.
  • [R2] The rule of insertion. Any graph may be scribed on any oddly enclosed area.
  • [R3] The rule of iteration. If a graph P occurs on SA [a sheet of assertion or a sheet of paper] or in a nest of cuts, it may be scribed on any area not part of P, which is contained by {P}.
  • [R4] The rule of deiteration. Any graph whose occurrence could be the result of iteration may be erased.
  • [R5] The rule of the double cut. The double cut may be inserted around or removed (where it occurs) from any graph on any area.

(see Roberts 1973: 40–45)

32. An area which is enclosed by an even number of cuts

33. An area which is enclosed by an odd number of cuts

34. As far as Peirce’s pursuit of graphical representation goes, one more EG system, Gamma graphs, was invented by Peirce after Beta graphs. Gamma graphs aim to represent modality by adding two kinds of signs to Beta graphs—broken cuts and tinctures (1903c, 1906).

35. Although the matter is not yet settled, Dau (2006) has raised a question about one of the rules.

36. Examples in Peirce 1903b [CP 4.455] nicely illustrate the visual effect of an identity line.

37. X is evenly (oddly) enclosed if and only X is enclosed by an even (odd) number of cuts.

38. For more complex examples, refer to Peirce 1903b [CP 4.502] and 1906 [CP 4.571].

39. According to the Endoporeutic reading, we get the following reading first: “It is not the case that something is good but not ugly”. If we adopt the Multiple readings, we may directly obtain the above reading “Everything good is ugly”.

40. Recently, Odland discovered three more pages from Peirce’s Logic Notebook related to his discussion on triadic logic in Peirce’s Triadic Logic: Continuity, Modality, and L (Odland 2020).

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Sun-Joo Shin <>

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