Supplement to Charles Sanders Peirce

Peirce's View of the Relationship Between His Own Work and German Idealism

Peirce's own ultimate philosophical position, as claimed by his own self-description of his most mature thinking, had much in common with the transcendental idealism of Kant. In 1905, for example, Peirce writes: “The present writer [i.e. Peirce himself] was a pure Kantist until he was forced by successive steps into Pragmaticism. The Kantist has only to abjure from the bottom of his heart the proposition that a thing-in-itself can, however indirectly, be conceived; … .” Again in 1905, in connection with a series of four papers of 1905 and 1906 published in The Monist in connection with pragmaticism, Kantianism, and common-sensism, Peirce wrote in the voice of the pragmatist: “Kant (whom I more than admire), is nothing but a somewhat confused pragmatist.” (CP, 5.525) Again, “… in half a dozen ways the Ding an sich has been proved to be nonsensical.” (CP, 5.525) Again, “The Ding an sich, however, can neither be indicated nor found. Consequently, no proposition can refer to it, and nothing true or false can be predicated of it. Therefore, all reference to it must be thrown out as meaningless surplusage.” (CP, 5.525) Again, “His [i.e. Kant's] limitation of them [i.e. space, time, and the twelve categories] to possible experience is pragmaticism in the general sense.” (CP, 5.525). One should, of course, hasten to note here that any philosophical elements that Peirce and Kant have in common certainly do not include Kant's purely a priori philosophical methodology or Kant's insistence on the essentially Euclidean nature of space. But Peirce continued well past 1905 to consider his own position to have strong similarities to the views of Kant. In his letter to Victoria Lady Welby of May 20, 1911, Peirce continues the theme of the essential correctness, in his opinion, of Kant's transcendental idealism: “I show just how far Kant was right, even when right twisted up on formalism. It is perfectly true that we can never attain knowledge of things as they are. We can only know their human aspect. But that is all the universe is for us.” Thus, by later in his career Peirce seems to have come to realize that the special kind of idealism that Kant espoused was not everywhere opposed to the kind of empiricism that he himself, as a pragmatist, avowed. Nevertheless, Peirce continued to disagree strongly with particular aspects of the Kantian philosophy. For example, by 1892, in his The Monist paper entitled “The Doctrine of Necessity Examined,” he had come to consider as false Kant's understanding of the crucial category of causation: “I believe I have thus subjected to fair examination all the important reasons for adhering to the theory of universal necessity, and have shown their nullity” (CP, 6.65). Again, in the just-cited letter to Lady Welby of May 20, 1911, Peirce wrote, “… the universe is not governed by immutable law. The proof of this is surprisingly simple. Namely, I show that if precisely the same consequence always resulted from the same cause, there could be no real progress. Now there is real progress.”

Perhaps surprisingly, Peirce ultimately came to regard his views as even closer to those of the absolute idealists Schelling and Hegel than to those of Kant. For example: “I am a Schellingian of some stripe,” he wrote (CP, 6.605; see also CP, 6. 102). By 1892 Peirce wrote: “My philosophy resuscitates Hegel, though in a strange costume” (CP, 1.42). Again, about 1905, he wrote: “The truth is that pragmaticism is closely allied to the Hegelian absolute idealism, from which, however, it is sundered by its vigorous denial that the third category … suffices to make the world … .” (CP, 5.436). Peirce's assimilating his late philosophy to that of the absolute idealists, however, is not quite as straightforwardly understandable as his finding his views similar to Kant's: his explicitly given reasons for the assimilation are not always easy to understand. Here they will be touched upon only very briefly; they obviously require a great deal of interpretation and elaboration.

In the first place, a main reason that Peirce saw his own views as akin to those of Schelling and Hegel concerns Peirce's embracing, after the death of his father Benjamin, a special form of psycho-physical metaphysical monism that is akin to the metaphysical views of his father; Peirce also seems to think that this monism is akin to the views of the absolute idealists. In a paper entitled “Man's Glassy Essence,” published in 1892 (CP, 6.238–6.271), Peirce put forward the monistic conjecture that cytoplasm is some sort of substance that is halfway between the two extremes of mind and matter. This single substance of Peirce's metaphysical monism, Peirce seems to associate with with objective idealists, especially with the Geist of Hegel.

In the second place, from his earliest published writings in 1868 Peirce rejected not only Cartesianism but indeed also any form of foundationalism in epistemology, that is to say any position that takes some fixed type of cognitions to be absolutely basic and thus to be absolutely prior to or beyond all empirical and philosophical inquiry. (See, for example, CP, 5.213–5.263, CP, 5.264–5.317, and CP, 5.318–5.357.) In this respect Peirce's position is akin the the anti-foundationalism of Hegel, who in the section “Sense-Certainty” of his Phaenomenologie des Geistes likewise rejected any form of epistemic foundationalism, especially any form based on Cartesian or Berkeleyan phenomenalism. For both Peirce and Hegel, philosophy can begin, and indeed must begin, wherever it happens to find itself, not at some previously-picked beginning point. It is partly for this very reason that Peirce steadily rejected Kant's claim about the a priori status of space and time, and that, along with Karl Friedrich Gauss, he regarded the structure of physical space and time as an empirical inquiry. (See Peirce's Reason and the Logic of Things.) It is for this same reason that Peirce rejected the a priori status of Kant's twelve categories, and ultimately (as was mentioned) even came to the conclusion that some of them, like the universal principle of causation, were false considered as basic principles of nature. (As did Heinrich Boltzmann, Peirce came to hold that in the place of the principle of universal causation, some sort of principle involving objective “chance,” that is to say objective randomness, is needed as an objective feature of the physical world.)

In the third place, Peirce was impressed by the similarity between his own views and Hegel's picture of the fluidly unending phenomenology of spirit. Hegel, like Peirce, denied that the job of philosophy and of science could ever come to a fixed, final position. For Hegel, every intellectual position has its own inner contradictions, which propel Geist forward to overcome them and hence to achieve a new position in which they are superseded (aufgehoben). In this way, spirit is self-correcting, just as Peirce thinks the scientific method is self-correcting. For Hegel, then, everything is always open to the investigations of spirit; everything is open to revision by intellectual criticism. The meaning for Hegel of absolutes Wissenschaft is not any absolutely fixed starting point or any absolutely fixed final position: it is rather simply the ultimate realization that the investigations of science and philosophy can begin anywhere and never can end. This Hegelian view is virtually identical with the so-called epistemological fallibilism (more on which later in this essay) that occupied such a prominent position in Peirce's thinking. For Peirce, every intellectual position is open to criticism and further investigation. Thus for both Peirce and Hegel there is no final, fixed intellectual position free from any potential for being revised; and the processes of revision are in the long run self-correcting.

In the fourth place, there is a connection between the mature Peirce and Hegel that was repeatedly cited by Peirce but is not easy to grasp: As Peirce expressed the point: “I am myself a scholastic realist of a somewhat extreme stripe.” (CP, 5.470). The analysis and evaluation of this connection can only be hinted at here because it involves a plethora of complicated notions as well as a wide variety of points that are debated by scholars. Peirce, namely, regarded himself in his mature years as a "Scotistic realist" in connection with ideas; in fact, he saw himself as even a purer realist than Duns Scotus himself had been. He was, we might say, an ultra-Scotist, where the word ultra here is taken in its exact Latin sense of beyond. Furthermore, Peirce tended, so he felt, to go beyond Scotus in somewhat the same way that Hegel did. That is to say, Peirce regarded Hegel and himself along with Hegel as more rigorous and thoroughgoing Scotistic realists than even Scotus himself; and he saw himself as even more of a realist than Hegel. What exactly these opinions of Peirce mean is not without obscurity. For Scotus the universal was to be characterized as unum in multis et de multis. That is to say: the universal was something that somehow resided in the individual entity (the suppositum) as part of its reality and yet also was something predicable of the individual entity as part of the grammar of philosophical language. This dual character of the universal, which is obviously quite difficult to grasp, was the central defining characteristic of the view of the universal for the Scotistic realist. For Peirce, however, ultra-Scotistic realism seems to mean something somewhat different: it meant the doctrine of the reality of what Peirce called “thirds”: habits, tendencies, lawlike behavior, meanings, representations, and various forms of metaphysical (as opposed to purely logical) necessity. Peirce considered himself in his later years as approximating Hegel about the reality of thirds, with two differences: first, that for Hegel thirds involved invariant laws, whereas for himself thirds merely involved habits; and second, that for Hegel thirds constituted the whole of reality, whereas for himself thirds needed to be supplemented with something else, “firsts” and “seconds.”

Copyright © 2014 by
Robert Burch <rwb@tamu.edu>

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