Notes to Treating Persons as Means

1. Alan Wertheimer notes (2010: 201) that some accounts of exploitation themselves invoke “the Kantian notion that one wrongfully exploits when one treats another instrumentally or merely as a means”.

2. Citations from Kant’s texts refer to page numbers in the Königlichen Preußischen (later Deutschen) Akademie edition (see bibliography), which are included in the margins of Immanuel Kant: Practical Philosophy (see bibliography). This article occasionally modifies slightly the translations from this English edition. Some Kant scholars have argued (Kleingeld 2020: 398–399) that the Formula of Humanity should be translated to say: “So act that you use humanity … never merely as a means” on the grounds that “use” more accurately reflects Kant’s text than “treat”.

3. In her reconstruction of Kant’s view, Japa Pallikkathayil suggests that

one treats another merely as a means if and only if one either (1) violates her rights or (2) expresses the denial of the claim that the person has equal practical standing in virtue of her humanity. (2010: 141)

As Pallikkathayil seems to acknowledge (2010: 116, note 1) this account of treating another merely as a means overlaps little with notions of treating others merely as means or just using another prevalent in ordinary moral discourse. For one thing, on Pallikkathayil’s account, it seems, a person can treat another merely as a means without using the other at all. For example, a person can violate another’s rights by violently pushing her out of his way as he’s making his getaway from a crime, and a person can express the denial of the claim that another has equal practical standing by ridiculing her (concerning the latter, see 2010: 141). Moreover, Kant’s own examples of treating another merely as a means (e.g., the false promising example, Kant 1785: 429–430) involve a person’s not just treating another in some way, but using the other.

4. See Kant 1785: 429–430, quoted below, for the most detailed discussion in his published works. For brief invocations of treating others merely as means see, for example, Kant 1788: 59, 87, 131 and Kant 1797: 331, 345–346, 395, 434–435, and 450.

5. Of course, that the pilot does not treat the bystanders as means does not entail that his dropping the bombs is morally permissible.

6. According to Paulus Kaufmann, an agent does not use another if in interacting with him she is aiming ultimately at realizing a state in the other, whether good or bad (Kaufmann 2011).

7. O’Neill suggests (1989: 113) that in Kant’s view an agent’s using another merely as a means amounts to his acting on a maxim to which the other cannot consent. The account described here does not invoke Kant’s notion of a maxim. It is notoriously difficult to specify precisely what Kant means by a maxim.

8. Korsgaard seems to agree with O’Neill on this point. “The question whether another can assent to your way of acting”, she writes, “can serve as a criterion for judging whether you are treating her as a mere means” (Korsgaard 1996:139). See also Korsgaard 1996: 295.

9. O’Neill actually says that it is possible for someone to dissent from a course of action only if he “can avert or modify the action by withholding consent and collaboration” (1989: 110, italics mine). On one natural interpretation, this implies that if a person can modify an agent’s use of him, then he can dissent to it. But this implication seems problematic, as a slightly altered version of the mugging case shows. Suppose that the mugger tells the victim that unless he gives him all of his money, he will kill him. But the victim comes back and says that he will give him half of his money without a struggle and the mugger accepts the arrangement. The victim was able to modify the mugger’s use of him by withholding his agreement to it. So, it seems, O’Neill is implying that the victim can dissent from the mugger’s use of him. But that seems counterintuitive. In any case, it does not seem to be O’Neill’s considered view. For, as we have seen, she also says that in cases of coercion, which the one just described surely is, dissent is in principle ruled out.

10. For a similar understanding and an accompanying argument that treating another merely as a means does not always amount to acting wrongly, see Guerrero 2016.

11. Parfit also discusses a “stronger” principle, according to which “[i]t is wrong to treat anyone merely as a means, or to come close to doing that” (2011: 214). A person comes close to treating another merely as a means if he both treats this person as a means and gives “too little weight” to his well-being or moral claims (2011: 214).

12. Pallikkathayil argues (2010: 124–125) that the possible consent account generates the following conclusion, which she takes to be implausible: it would be morally wrong for you to lie to a murderer at your front door as to the whereabouts of your innocent friend, whom you know to be within.

13. Parfit contrasts an objective view of reasons with a subjective view, according to which our reasons for acting are “all provided by or depend upon, certain facts about what would fulfill or achieve our … desires or aims” (2011: 45). On this view, I would presumably have a reason to remove the splinter from the child’s hand because I want (or would want, if I considered all of the facts) her not to be in pain.

14. Ronald Green (2001) suggests an account of treating others merely as means that might also have this implication. He says:

I use someone as a “means only”, not when I employ their bodies or their talents primarily as an instrument of my purpose, but only when I do so in ways they could not also impartially accept. (2001: 255–256)

Some might say that the healthy person could impartially accept losing his life so that five others can live.

Copyright © 2023 by
Samuel Kerstein <>

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