Supplement to Phylogenetic Inference

Long descriptions for the figure in Phylogenetic Inference

Figure 1 description

This phylogenetic tree has its root (earliest time) on the left hand side with each node having two branches. The tips of the tree on the right hand side are extant groups (name and picture). We will describe the tree from left to right and bottom to top by using an indented list.

  • root node (unnamed)
    • “Cartilaginous fish” (this and its descendant branches are colored blue)
      • tip: “Elephant shark”
      • unnamed node a
        • tip: “Little skate”
        • tip: “Spotted catshark”
    • unnamed node b
      • “Ray-finned fish” (this and its descendant branches are colored green)
        • tip: “Zebrafish”
        • unnamed node c
          • tip: “Pufferfish”
          • tip: “Tilapia”
      • unnamed node d (this and its descendant branches are colored purple)
        • tip: “Coelacanth”
        • unnamed node e
          • “Lobe-finned fish” end with a tip: “Lungfish”
          • “Tetrapods” (this and its descendant branches are colored purple and pink in the original figure; we use fuchsia in this description)
            • unnamed node f (amphibians)
              • tip: “Chinese brown frog”
              • tip: “Western clawed frog”
            • unnamed node g
              • unnamed node h
                • tip: “Lizard”
                • unnamed node i (birds)
                  • tip: “Zebra finch”
                  • unnamed node j
                    • tip: “Turkey”
                    • tip: “Chicken”
                • unnamed node k (mammals)
                  • tip: “Playtypus”
                  • unnamed node l (marsupials and placental mammals)
                    • unnamed node m (marsupials)
                      • tip: “Opossum”
                      • tip: “Tammar wallaby”
                    • unnamed note n (placental mammals)
                      • unnamed node o
                        • tip: “Armadillo”
                        • tip: “Elephant”
                      • unnamed node p
                        • unnamed node q
                          • tip: “Mouse”
                          • tip: “Human”
                        • tip: “Dog”
On this phylogenetic tree the length of each branch represents the amount of molecular evolution, i.e., the number of nucleotide substitutions from the most recent node. Branch lengths could also represent time or other units of change, or not be biologically meaningful. Biologists will indicate whether branch lengths represent any evolutionary information, and, if so, define those units. One advantage of representing phylogenetic relationships on a tree rather than an indented list is the ability for branch lengths to represent these sorts of evolutionary data and hypotheses.

Copyright © 2022 by
Matt Haber <>
Joel Velasco <>

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