Supplement to Physicalism

Physicalism and Associated Doctrines

Perhaps because of its connection to the physical sciences, physicalism is sometimes construed as an entire package of views, which contains the metaphysical thesis we have isolated for discussion as only one part. This supplement briefly considers the relation between physicalism (the metaphysical claim) and various other items that at least sometimes have been associated with it.

(a) Methodological Naturalism: the idea that the mode of inquiry typical of the physical sciences will provide theoretical understanding of the world, to the extent that this sort of understanding can be achieved. Physicalism is not methodological naturalism because physicalism is a metaphysical thesis not a methodological thesis.

(b) Epistemic Optimism: the idea that the mode of understanding typical of the sciences can be used by us, i.e. by human beings, to explain the world in total, to provide a final theory of the world. Physicalism is not epistemic optimism because, since commitment to physicalism does not commit you to methodological naturalism, it clearly does not commit you to any optimism about the success of that method in the long run.

(c) Final Theory: the idea that there is a final and complete theory of the world, regardless of whether we can formulate it. One might think it obvious that if physicalism is true, there is a final theory of the world. However, because of some unclarity in the notion of a theory, the issues here are not cut and dried. According to some views, something is a theory only if it is finitely stateable in a language we can understand. If that is so, clearly physicalism does not entail the idea of a final theory. On a looser conception of a theory, however, it is reasonable to say that physicalism entails that there is a final theory.

(d) Objectivity: the idea that the final and complete theory of world, if it exists, will not involve any essential reference to particular points of view or experiences. It is reasonable to say that physicalism entails objectivity. However, given the possibilities discussed in the main text of non-reductive or a posteriori physicalism even here the issues are not settled. On those approaches, it seems possible to have irreducible points of view or experiences supervening on something physical, which compromises objectivity.

(e) Unity of Science: the idea that all the branches of sciences developed by us will or should be unified into a single science, usually (but not always) thought of as physics. This thesis is clearly a methodological thesis about how science ought to proceed. As we have seen, however, physicalism is a metaphysical thesis rather than a methodological thesis about how science ought to proceed. Hence it is not equivalent to the unity of science thesis.

(f) Explanatory Reductionism: the idea that all genuine explanations must be couched in the terms of physics, and that other explanations, while pragmatically useful, can or should be discarded as knowledge develops. Physicalism is not explanatory reductionism because, as noted in the discussion in the text of non-reductive physicalism, physicalism is consistent with the idea that special sciences are quite distinct from physics. One might say that the special sciences are concerned with patterns in the physical that physicists themselves are not concerned with. For that reason the subject matter of the special sciences is distinct from the subject matter of physics.

(g) Generality of Physics: the idea that every particular event or process which falls under a law of the special sciences (i.e. sciences other than physics) also falls under a law of physics. In general, this view presupposes a view about laws and explanation — for example, it implies or seems to imply that special sciences have laws. But physicalism does not entail any such thesis.

(h) Causal Closure of the Physical: the idea that every event has a physical cause, assuming it has a cause at all. Strictly speaking, physicalists are not committed to realism about causation, so they are not committed to causal closure. (Of course, many physicalists do think that causal closure is true, as we will in the text, but their position does not entail causal closure.)

(i) Empiricism: the idea that all knowledge (with the possible exception of conceptual knowledge) is ultimately founded on sensory or perceptual experience. Empiricism can be given a descriptive or a normative reading. On its descriptive reading, it is most likely false. Most of the information that normal humans come to deploy seems to be caused by both experience and inborn structure and maturation. On the normative reading, the claim is that justification is, at the end of the day, based on experience. But this epistemological thesis has nothing to do with physicalism.

(j) Nominalism: the idea that there are no abstract objects, i.e., entities not located in space and time, such as numbers, qualities or propositions. Since physicalism is usually thought of as a theory about the contingent nature of the world, nominalism is often thought to be a distinct issue from physicalism (see, e.g., Schiffer 1987, Stoljar 1996, Montero 2017, Schneider 2017, Witmer 2017). This is not to deny however that physicalists must say something about abstract objects, as we will see in the text.

(k) Atheism: the idea that there is no God as traditionally conceived. In the 17th and 18th century, physicalism (or materialism, as it was then known) was widely but not universally viewed as inconsistent with belief in God (Yolton 1983). Nowadays, this issue is somewhat less discussed (though see the last pages of Montero 2013). Nevertheless, if God is thought of as essentially non-physical, then Atheism does seem to be a consequence of physicalism, at least on some interpretations of the background modal notions.

Copyright © 2021 by
Daniel Stoljar <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free