Supplement to Physicalism
Supervenience Physicalism: Further Issues
Supervenience physicalism as formulated in (1) is relatively simple and clear, but it also faces a number of problems in addition to the sufficiency problem.
- Physicalism is true at a possible world w iff any world which is a physical duplicate of w is a duplicate of w simpliciter.
These are: (a) the lone ammonium molecule problem; (b) the modal status problem; (c) the epiphenomenal ectoplasm problem; (d) the blockers problem; and (e) the necessity problem. This supplement discusses these problems.
1. The lone ammonium molecule problem
(Cf. Kim 1993.) Imagine a possible world W* that is physically exactly like our world except in one trivial respect: it has one extra ammonium molecule located, say, on Saturn’s rings. It is natural to suppose that at W*, the distribution of mental properties is exactly as it is in the actual world — the presence of an extra molecule does not make that much of a difference. On the other hand, for all (1) says, such a world might be radically different in terms of the distribution of mental properties. Since (1) only refers to worlds that are exact physical duplicates of our world, it is silent on worlds that are different even in minute details, and hence is silent on W*. It thus leaves open the possibility that, in W*, everything has mental properties, or nothing has or the only things that have mental properties are Saturn’s rings! But that seems absurd: while W* is clearly not a physical duplicate of our world, for it contains an extra molecule, the distribution of mental properties in W* would nevertheless match that of the actual world.
There are a number of different responses to this problem in the literature (cf. Kim 1993). Perhaps the simplest response is that the problem conflates two issues that are better kept apart: the question of what physicalism itself tells us about W*, and the question of what our general knowledge tells us about W*. It is true that physicalism itself does not tell us anything about the distribution of mental properties at W*. Nevertheless, we know independently what the distribution is — we know independently that the presence or absence of molecules on Saturn doesn’t affect things like who has mental properties here on Earth. But why should one assume that this last piece of knowledge should be a consequence of physicalism? To put the point slightly differently, imagine that we discover that who has mental properties on Earth is in part a function of the behavior of molecules on Saturn. That would of course tell us that we are deeply wrong in our assumptions about how the world works. But it would not tell us that we are deeply wrong about physicalism. (For further discussion of this point, see Paull and Sider 1992, and Stalnaker 1996.)
2. The modal status problem
Some philosophers (e.g. Davidson 1970) have thought of physicalism as a conceptual or necessary truth, if it is true at all. But most have thought of it as contingent, a truth about our world which might have been otherwise. The statement of physicalism encoded in (1) allows a way in which this might be so. (1) tells us that physicalism is true at a world just in case the world in question conforms to certain conditions. But it leaves it open whether or not the actual world conforms to those conditions as a matter of fact. Perhaps it is not true of our world that a physical duplicate of it would be a psychological duplicate. If so, physicalism would not be true at our world.
But for some it is puzzling that physicalism is stated using modal notions and nonetheless is contingent. To see the problem, suppose as that S is a statement which specifies the physical nature of the actual world and S* is a statement which specifies the total nature of the world. If supervenience physicalism is true, the following entailment thesis will also be true:
- S entails S*.
On the other hand, (E) is clearly a necessary truth. However, if (E) is a necessary truth, how can physicalism be contingent? After all, (E) seems equivalent to physicalism. But if the two are equivalent, how can one be necessary and the other contingent?
However, while (E) is necessary, it is not equivalent to physicalism. Rather, (E) follows from physicalism given various contingent assumptions, in particular the assumptions that S and S* are the statements we say they are — it is contingent fact, for example that S* summarizes the total nature of the world. It is important here to distinguish (E) from a different entailment thesis that we discuss in the text (“the physical truths entail all the truths”). This thesis is plausibly equivalent to physicalism but it is not necessary. (Not all entailment claims are necessary. Consider ‘my aunt’s favorite statement entails my uncle’s favorite’ — that statement is contingent even though it is most naturally thought of as an entailment claim.)
3. The epiphenomenal ectoplasm problem
(Cf. Horgan 1983, Lewis 1983.) Imagine a possible world W that is exactly like our world in respect of the distribution of physical and mental properties, but for one difference: it contains some pure experience which does not interact causally with anything else in the world — epiphenomenal ectoplasm, to give it a name. The problem this possibility presents for (1) is that, if (1) provides the correct definition of physicalism, and if physicalism is true at the actual world, then there is no possible world of the kind we just described, i.e., W does not exist. The reason is that W is by assumption a physical duplicate of our world; but then, if physicalism is true at our world, W should be a duplicate simpliciter of our world. But W is patently not a duplicate of our world: it contains some epiphenomenal ectoplasm that our world lacks. On the other hand, it seems quite wrong to say that W is an impossibility — at any rate, physicalism should not entail that it is impossible.
In order to solve the epiphenomenal ectoplasm problem, we need to adjust (1) so that it does not have the truth of physicalism ruling out W as a possible world. While there are a number of different proposals about how to do this, one influential proposal is due to Frank Jackson (cf. Jackson 1993. For earlier proposals and further discussion, see Horgan 1983 and Lewis 1983.) He proposes replacing (1) with:
- Physicalism is true at a possible world w iff any world which is a minimal physical duplicate of w is a duplicate of w simpliciter.
By ‘minimal physical duplicate’, Jackson means a possible world that is identical in all physical respects to the actual world, but which does not contain anything else; in particular, it does not contain any epiphenomenal ectoplasm. Unlike (1), (1*) does not have physicalism ruling out W, and so (1*) is on the face of it preferable to (1) as a statement of physicalism, though we don’t need to be concerned with this in the main text.
A different proposal is due to David Chalmers (1996). He proposes replacing (1) with:
- Physicalism is true at a possible world w iff any world which is a physical duplicate of w is a positive duplicate of w.
By ‘positive duplicate’, Chalmers means a possible world that instantiates all the positive properties of the actual world, where in turn a positive property is defined as “one that if instantiated in a world W, is also instantiated by the corresponding individual in all worlds that contain W as a proper part” (1996, p. 40). Unlike (1), and like (1*), (1**) does not have physicalism ruling out W, and so (1**) is on the face of it too preferable to (1) as a statement of physicalism, though again we do not need to be concerned with this in the main text.
4. The blockers problem
(Cf. Hawthorne 2002, Leuenberger 2008) Imagine a possible world similar to ours with respect to the distribution of mental and physical properties, except for this difference: the relation between physical facts and mental facts is weaker than supervenience—mental facts are entailed by physical facts so long as there are no facts which block that entailment—blockers, as they are called. For example, being in an overall physical condition P will necessitate being in pain so long as you do not also instantiate some further property B. If you are in both P and B you are not in pain; but if you are in P and not in B, you will be in pain.
The problem that this possibility raises for supervenience definitions of physicalism is as follows. Let us suppose that the relation obtaining at a world W between the mental and the physical is one of weak necessity as just defined; that is, suppose that, at W, the mental is necessitated by the physical but only if certain blockers are absent. Intuitively it would seem that physicalism is false at W. On the other hand, if physicalism is defined in the way suggested by Jackson it would be true. After all, applied to W, Jackson’s definition says that physicalism is true at W just in case any minimal physical duplicate of W is a duplicate simpliciter. But that seems to be true of W as we have imagined it. Conclusion: if blockers are possible, physicalism is false at W, and yet it should not be false on Jackson’s definition.
There are a number of possible responses to the blockers problem. One is to resist the intuition that physicalism is false at W in the circumstance described, even if we adopt Jackson’s definition of physicalism. A different response is to adopt a formulation of physicalism that is weaker than supervenience physicalism; this strategy is pursued in Leuenberger 2008. A third response is to say that what the blockers problem brings out is that there is a difference between two ways that physicalists have sought to respond to the epiphenomenal ectoplasm problem; in particular, if one adopts (1**) rather than (1*) as one’s response to the epiphenomenal ectoplasm problem, this would have the advantage that it does not also face the blockers problem. For if the relation of the mental to the physical that obtains at W is one of weak necessity, then not only is physicalism false but it is also false that any world which is a physical duplicate of W is a positive duplicate of W — at some physical duplicate worlds, for example, there will be no psychological properties at all. None of these responses are clearly correct however, and the proper treatment of the blockers problem (and indeed of the epiphenomenal ectoplasm problem, of which the blockers problem is a development) is an open question in the literature.
5. The necessity problem
(Cf. Montero 2013) Imagine a possible world W which is similar to ours with respect to the distribution of physical properties, but with this difference: the chemical or biological properties of W are fundamental and only bear a contingent relation to its physical properties. Ideas of this sort, or at least something like them, have been considered at different times in the history of science; regardless of that, the possibility certainly makes sense.
The problem this possibility presents for (1) is that it suggests it does not articulate a necessary condition on physicalism’s being true, that supervenience is not necessary for physicalism. The reasoning for this may be brought as follows. First, if (1) is the correct definition of physicalism, then physicalism is not true at W: a world physically identical to W need not be a world identical to it in all respects, since it might lack the chemical or biological properties in question. But, second, physicalism plausibly is true at W. After all, there is no temptation to say that dualism of a traditional sort is true at W; the psychological properties instantiated in W are nothing over and above other properties instantiated there. Putting these together: contrary to (1) supervenience on the physical is not necessary for physicalism.
One response to this argument questions whether physicalism is true at W. It may be that dualism of a traditional sort is not true at W, but it doesn’t quite follow that physicalism is true there. As we noted above, physicalism as articulated by (1) is a thesis that applies to the world in general. That very general thesis seems to be false at W even if dualism is not, since chemical or biological properties are fundamental there. A different response to the argument turns on issues we will look at again later, namely, how exactly to understand the notion of the physical. This argument against (1) assumes a notion of the physical according to which chemical or biological properties are non-physical. In response, a friend of (1) might say they are interested in a broader notion on which these properties are themselves physical. If that is defensible, the problem goes away.