Supplement to Experiment in Physics

Appendix 6: Sometimes Refutation Doesn't Work: The Double-Scattering of Electrons

In 1929, Mott (1929, and later 1931, 1932) calculated, on the basis of Dirac’s theory of the electron, that there would be a forward-backward asymmetry of approximately 10% in the double scattering of electrons from heavy nuclei. Mott clearly specified the conditions that would have to be satisfied in order to observe this effect. One had to double scatter relativistic electrons at large angles (90°) from heavy nuclei (most calculations assumed a nuclear charge \(Z\) approximately 80). The first scatter would polarize the electrons and the second scatter would analyze the produced polarization, giving rise to an asymmetry.

The earliest experiment that discussed Mott’s calculation was performed by Chase (1929). He observed a 4% asymmetry in the double scattering of electrons but attributed it to a difference in the path that the electrons followed. His subsequent experiment (Chase 1930) reported a 1.5% effect, and this time did attribute it to Mott scattering. Most experiments during the early 1930s, showed no polarization effects, although some of them did not satisfy the conditions for Mott scattering (For details see Franklin (1986, Ch. 2)). The sole positive results were provided by experiments done by Rupp (1929; 1930a; 1930b; 1931; 1932a; 1932b; 1932c). Rupp’s 1932 experiment first scattered electrons at 90° from a gold foil, followed by a 90° scatter from a gold wire. He found a 3–4% asymmetry at an electron energy of 130 keV and an asymmetry of 9–10% at 250 keV. These results , although positive, were in quantitative disagreement with Mott’s prediction of 15.5% at 127 keV and 14% at 204 keV (Mott 1931). Dymond (1931) also reported a positive result, but one that was five times smaller than the theoretical prediction.

Mott and the rest of the electron-scattering community were quite aware of both the confused nature of the experimental results, and of the apparent discrepancy between experiment and theory. Langstroth (1932) reviewed the situation and commented on the difficulty of experiment-theory comparison when one deals with real, as opposed to ideal, experiments. “In view of the fact that practical conditions may be immensely more complicated than those of Mott’s theory, it is not surprising that it does not furnish a guide, even in a qualitative way, to all of the above experiments. This may be due to (a) the fact that a large proportion of the beam scattered from a thick target consists of electrons which have undergone more than one collision, (b) the insufficiency of the theoretical model, (c) the inclusion of extraneous effects in the experimental results” (pp. 566–67).

The situation became even more confused when Dymond(1932) published a detailed account of his experiment, which restated his positive, but discrepant, result. Adding to the confusion was the fact Dymond’s experiment seemed to satisfy all the conditions for Mott scattering. Rupp (1934) continued his work, this time using thallium vapor rather than gold targets, and again found a positive result. G.P. Thomson (1933), on the other hand, found no effect. At approximately the same time Sauter (1933) redid Mott’s calculations and obtained identical results. He also considered whether or not screening by atomic electrons could cancel the predicted effect and found that it could not. If things weren’t difficult enough, they got worse when Dymond (1934) published a full repudiation of his earlier results. He had found a considerable and variable experimental asymmetry in his apparatus, and concluded that he had not, in fact, observed any polarization effect. Dymond also considered possible reasons for the theory-experiment discrepancy including inelastic, stray, and plural scattering, and nuclear screening and rejected them all. He concluded, “We are driven to the conclusion that the theoretical results are wrong. There is no reason to believe that the work of Mott is incorrect;… It seems not improbable, therefore, that the divergence of theory from experiment has a more deep-seated cause, and that the Dirac wave equation needs modification in order to account successfully for the absence of polarization” (Dymond 1932, p. 666).

G.P. Thomson (1934) also published a comprehensive review of the field. He reported no effects of the type found by Rupp and he found a forward-backward ratio of \((0.996\pm 0.01)\) in comparison to Mott’s prediction of 1.15.Thomson also concluded that there was a serious discrepancy between theory and experiment.

Faced with this apparent theory-experiment discrepancy, theorists sought either to modify Dirac’s theory or to propose a new theory, and thus accommodate the experimental results. Hellmann (1935), Halpern and Schwinger (1935), and Winter (1936) offered modifications of the Coulomb potential, each of which had the effect that it “annihilates the polarization effect completely.” Although each of the theoretical calculations predicted null results from double scattering experiments, they were not regarded as solving the problem. One might speculate that this was because these modifications had no physical or theoretical underpinning. They seemed invented solely for the purpose of explaining the experimental results.

Experimental work also continued. The situation became even more confused when Rupp (1935) withdrew several of his results on electron scattering This eliminated the most positive results supporting Mott’s theory.[1] In 1937 Richter published what he regarded as the definitive experiment on the double scattering of electrons. He claimed to have satisfied the conditions of Mott’s calculation exactly and had found no effect. He concluded that “Despite all the favorable conditions of the experiment, however, no sign of the Mott effect could be observed. With this experimental finding, Mott’s theory of the double scattering of electrons from the atomic nucleus can no longer be maintained. It cannot be decided here how much Dirac’s theory of electron spin, which is at the basis of Mott’s theory, and its other applications are implicated through the denial of Mott’s theory” (Richter 1937, p. 554). The discrepancy was further confirmed by the theoretical work of Rose and Bethe (1939). They examined various ways of trying to eliminate the discrepancy and concluded that “the discrepancy between theory and experiment remains—perhaps more glaring than before” (p. 278).

Thus, at the end of 1939 there was a clear discrepancy between Dirac theory, as used by Mott, and the experimental results on the double scattering of electrons. Yet the theory was not regarded as refuted. Why was this? The reason is that, at the time, Dirac theory, and only Dirac theory, predicted the existence of the positron (a positive electron). This particle had been discovered in 1932 and had provided very strong support for Dirac theory. In comparison with this success, the discrepancy in electron scattering, along with another small discrepancy in the spectrum of hydrogen, just did not have sufficient evidential weight. The unique, and confirmed, prediction of the positron outweighed these discrepancies. It isn’t easy to refute a strongly confirmed theory. Neither is it impossible as demonstrated by the histories of both parity nonconservation and CP violation discussed earlier.

Interestingly, it was the experimental results that were wrong. In the early 1940s experimental work showed that the way in which the experiments were performed during the 1930s had precluded the possibility of observing the polarization effects predicted by Mott. In order to avoid problems with multiple scattering the experimenters had scattered the electrons from the front surface of the targets. Unfortunately this made the effects of plural scattering, a few large scatters rather than just one as required by Mott, very large. The symmetric plural scattering swamped the predicted polarization effect. When the experimental apparatuses were changed to eliminate this problem the discrepancy disappeared.[2] Mott’s theory was then supported by the experimental evidence.

We have seen here a classic case of the Duhem-Quine problem and how the physics community attempted to solve it. There was a clear discrepancy between the experimental results and the predictions of a well-confirmed theory. The experiments were redone to check the results, with careful attention to the experimental conditions required by the theory. Theorists checked on whether or not other effects might mask the predicted polarization effect. Other theorists offered competing explanations. Ultimately a solution was found.

Does the fact that Dirac theory was not regarded as refuted even though experiment clearly disagreed with its predictions mean that physicists disregard negative results whenever it suits their purposes? Do physicists really tune in on existing community commitments, as some social constructivists would have it, and overlook negative evidence? The answer is no. There is no indication in this episode that the negative evidence was disregarded. The physics community examined the theory in the light of all the available experimental evidence, weighed its importance, and then made a decision. I note that even though Dirac theory remained relatively unscathed, both experimental and theoretical work continued until the problem was solved. The discrepancy was not hidden from view, nor was it ignored.

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