Plato’s Aesthetics

First published Fri Jun 27, 2008; substantive revision Mon Jul 22, 2024

If aesthetics is the philosophical inquiry into beauty, or another aesthetic value, and art, then the striking feature of Plato’s dialogues is that he devotes as much time as he does to both topics and yet treats them oppositely. Art, mostly as represented by poetry, is closer to a greatest danger than any other phenomenon Plato speaks of. Beauty is close to a greatest good. Can there be such a thing as “Plato’s aesthetics” that contains both positions?

Strictly speaking the phrase “Plato’s aesthetics” is anachronistic, given that this area of philosophy only came to be identified in the last few centuries. But even those who take aesthetics more broadly and permit the term will still find something exploratory in Plato’s treatments of art and beauty. He might be best described as seeking to discover the vocabulary and issues of aesthetics. For this reason Plato’s readers will not come upon a single aesthetic theory in the dialogues. For the same reason they are uniquely situated to watch core concepts of aesthetics being defined: beauty, imitation, inspiration.

There is something more to be said about the label “aesthetics” that is important about Plato. One normally speaks of aesthetics or a philosophy of art when the theory covers more than a single art form. For understandable reasons the Platonic dialogues focus on poetry, with special energy directed toward dramatic poetry. Tragedy and comedy were culturally dominant art forms during Socrates’ lifetime and much of Plato’s. Innovative, memorable, and now long enduring, Athenian drama invited scrutiny. Even so, and tellingly, when the dialogues comment on poetry they also look at it in tandem with the visual arts – not capriciously either, but in keeping with an ancient Greek tradition of comparing art forms – and in this approach toward an overarching theory they deserve to be described as practicing or undertaking the philosophy of art.

James Porter argues that analogizing between art forms characterized a culture of sensualist aesthetic thinking before Plato and so makes possible the early appearance of a general idea “art.” Poetry commented on architecture, drama on rhetoric (Porter 2010, 188). In another fashion tragedy compared itself to sculpture (Pappas 2012b, 325). Even if one finds some of these interpretations of aesthetic analysis controversial, there is no denying that the Homeric “shield of Achilles” passage (Iliad 18.479–609) implies a parallel between the shield’s presentation of war and peace and the treatment of those subjects in Homer. What Hephaestus depicts on the shield, Homer depicts in his epics (Cunningham 2007, Francis 2009).

The poet Simonides makes analogizing between art forms explicit. “Painting is silent poetry and poetry is painting that speaks” (Plutarch The Glory of the Athenians 3.1, 346f-347a). A common element unites the forms of art even though poetry casts itself as the standard that painting fails to achieve (possessing as it does the voice that painting lacks).

Plato’s explication of poetic mimêsis by means of the mimêsis in painting (see below on Republic Book 10) belongs in this analogizing tradition, as Aristotle’s account of mimêsis will after him (Poetics Chapter 4 1448b4–19; Halliwell 2002, 178). On both theories, painting and poetry belong together as fellow species within a larger artistic genus. However faulty the theory that joins them, it attempts to describe the broader genus.

At the same time, Plato appears to consider painting on its own terms, and not merely illustrating a process also found in poetry. Many passages speak in approving terms of painting and sculpture, or recognize the skill involved in making them as a technê “profession, craft” (Ion 532e–533a; Gorgias 430c, 448b, 453c–d, 503e; Protagoras 318b–c; see Demand 1975, Halliwell 2002, 37–43). Even the famously anti-poetic Republic contains positive references to paintings and drawings. Sometimes these are metaphors for acts of imagination and political reform (472d, 500e–501c), sometimes literal images whose attractiveness helps to form a young ruler’s character (400d–401a), in any case visual arts appreciated on their own terms and for their own sake.

When the Republic treats painting and poetry together, in other words, it does so possessed of an independent sense of visual depiction. It aims at developing a philosophy of art.

The subject “Plato’s aesthetics” calls for care. If perennially footnoted by later philosophers Plato has also been much thumbnailed. Clichés accompany his name. It is worth going slowly through the main topics of Plato’s aesthetics—not in the search for a theory unlike anything that has been said, but so that background shading and details may emerge, for a result that perhaps contrasts with the commonplaces about his thought as a human face contrasts with the cartoon reduction of it.

In what follows, citations to passages in Plato use “Stephanus pages,” based on a sixteenth-century edition of Plato’s works. The page numbers in that edition, together with the letters a–e, have become standard. Almost every translation of Plato includes the Stephanus page numbers and letters in the margins, or at the top of the page. Thus, “Symposium 204b” refers to the same brief passage in every edition and every translation of Plato.

1. Beauty

The study of Plato on beauty begins with a routine caution. The Greek adjective kalon only approximates to the English “beautiful.” Not everything Plato says about a kalos, kalê, or kalon thing will belong in a summary of his aesthetic theories.

Readers can take the distinction between Greek and English terms too far. It always feels more scrupulous to argue against equating terms from different languages than to treat them interchangeably. And the discussion bears more on assessments of Platonic ethical theory than on whatever subject may be called Plato’s aesthetics.

But even given these qualifications the reader should know how to distinguish what is beautiful from what is kalon. The terms have overlapping but distinct ranges of application. A passage in Plato may speak of a face or body that someone finds kalon, or for that matter a statue, a spoon, a tree, a grassy place to rest (Phaedrus 230b). In those cases, “beautiful” makes a natural equivalent, and certainly a less stilted one than the alternatives. Yet even here it is telling that Plato far more often uses kalon for a face or body than for works of art and natural scenery. As far as unambiguous beauties are concerned, he has a smaller set in mind than we do (Kosman 2010).

More typically kalon appears in contexts to which “beautiful” would fit awkwardly if at all. For both Plato and Aristotle—and in many respects for Greek popular morality—kalon plays a role as ethical approbation, not by meaning the same thing that agathon “good” means, but as a special complement to goodness. At times kalon narrowly means “noble,” often and more loosely “admirable.” The compound kalos k’agathos, the aristocratic ideal, is all-round praise for a man (i.e. an adult male human being), not “beautiful and good” as its components would translate separately, but closer to “splendid and upright.” Here kalon is entirely an ethical term. Calling virtue beautiful feels misplaced in modern terms, or even perverse; calling wisdom beautiful, as the Symposium does (204b), will sound like a mistake (Kosman 2010, 348–350).

Some commentators try to keep kalon and “beautiful” close to synonymous despite differences in their semantic ranges (Hyland 2008). David Konstan rejuvenated the question by emphasizing the beauty not in uses of the adjective kalon but in the related noun kallos (Konstan 2014, Konstan 2015). As welcome as Konstan’s shift of focus is regarding Greek writing as a whole, it runs into difficulties when we read Plato; for the noun kallos carries associations of physical, visual attractiveness, and Plato is wary of the desire that such attractiveness arouses. His dialogues, and notably the Hippias Major, more often examine to kalon when asking about a property named by a noun, wanting to know “what it is to be kalon,” or (as Jonathan Fine has rightly emphasized) “what makes all beautiful things beautiful and is in no way ugly.”

Besides seeking a Greek equivalent for “beautiful,” translators from Greek look for a different word when rendering kalon into English. One understandably popular choice is “fine,” which applies to most things labeled kalon and is also appropriate to ethical and aesthetic contexts (so Woodruff 1983). There are fine suits and string quartets but also fine displays of courage. Of course modern English-speakers have fine sunsets and fine dining as well, this word being even broader than kalon. That is not to mention fine points or fine print. And whereas people frequently ask what beauty really consists in, so that a conversation on the topic might actually have taken place, it is hard to imagine worrying over “what the fine is” or “what is really fine.”

The deciding criterion will be not philological but philosophical. Studying the Hippias Major each reader should ask whether Plato’s treatment of to kalon sounds relevant to questions one asks about beauty today.

1.1 Hippias Major

The Hippias Major was considered Platonic in antiquity, but faced accusations of inauthenticity in the nineteenth and twentieth centuries (Tarrant 1927). One peculiarity of the dialogue is Socrates’ extended pretext that his own objections to Hippias come from an unnamed third party (who sounds a lot like Socrates) who has levied these same arguments against him (e.g. 288d, 290e, 304d). This feature of the Hippias Major may read as un-Platonic, although to strikes some as a sign of Plato’s wit (Guthrie 1975, IV, 176).

It has also been noted that Aristotle quotes from Plato’s much shorter dialogue Hippias Minor (Metaphysics 5.30 1025a6–8). If Plato would not have written two works with the same name, the longer Hippias Major must be a forgery. But after all he may well have given two works the same title.

Today the debate seems to lie in the past. Most scholars agree that Plato wrote the Hippias Major, and its sustained inquiry into beauty is seen as central to Platonic aesthetics.

The Hippias Major follows Socrates and the famous sophist Hippias through a sequence of attempts to define to kalon. Socrates badgers Hippias, in classic Socratic ways, to identify beauty’s general nature, and Hippias answers with definitions, three in all. For instance, “a beautiful young woman is beautiful” (287e). This one scarcely appears to qualify as a definition, and could be taken for one of those non-definition “mere examples” that Socrates complains about, in other dialogues, as not even on the road to a general account (Euthyphro 5d–6e, Laches 190e–191e, Meno 72a–b). After all Hippias has put himself forward as a fact-filled polymath. In real life he compiled the first list of Olympic victors, and might have written the first history of philosophy. On that reading, his over-ingestion of specifics has left him unable to digest his experience and generalize to a philosophical definition.

On the other hand Socrates makes no methodological rebuke to Hippias of the kind that other interlocutors like Euthyphro hear. He might realize that Hippias is proposing an exemplar of beauty, not a mere token but a standard and even a way of thinking generally about that property (Politis 2021, 17). Understood in these terms, Hippias knows that Socrates is seeking an essence for beauty, although he still goes wrong in proposing exemplars known from Homer – woman, tripod, mare, cauldron, gold, two-handled bowl (Iliad 23.261–270, 539–611) and appealing to Greek aristocrats (Gold 2021).

After giving up on seeking a definition from Hippias, Socrates tries out three of his own. These are philosophical generalizations but they fail too, and—again in classic Socratic mode—the dialogue ends unresolved. In one excursus Socrates says beauty “is appropriate [prepei]” and proposes defining it as “what is appropriate [to prepon]” (290d). Although ending in refutation this discussion (to 294e) is worth a look as the anticipation of a modern debate. Philosophers of the eighteenth century argue over whether an object is beautiful by satisfying the definition of the object, or independently of that definition (Guyer 1993). Kant calls the beauty that is appropriateness “dependent beauty” (Critique of Judgment, section 16). Such beauty threatens to become a species of the good. Within the accepted corpus of genuine Platonic works beauty is never subsumed within the good, the appropriate, or the beneficial. Plato seems to belong in the same camp as Kant in this respect. (On Platonic beauty and the good see Barney 2010.) Nevertheless he is no simple sensualist about beauty. The very temptation in Plato to link the beautiful with the good and to assess it intellectually is part of why Porter calls him and Aristotle “formalists,” who diverted ancient theorizing about art from its sensualist origins (Porter 2010).

Despite its inconclusiveness the Hippias Major reflects the view of beauty found elsewhere in Plato:

  1. Beauty behaves as canonical Forms do. It possesses the reality that they have and is discovered through the same dialectical inquiry that brings other Forms to light. Socrates wants Hippias to explain a) the property that is known when any examples of beauty are known (essence of beauty), b) the cause of all occurrences of beauty, and more precisely c) the cause not of the appearance of beauty but of its real being (286d, 287c, 289d, 292c, 294e, 297b).
  2. Nevertheless beauty is not just one Form among others. It stands out among those beings, for it bears some close relationship to the good (296d), even though Socrates argues that the two are distinct (296e ff., 303e ff.).
  3. Socrates and Hippias appeal to artworks as examples of beautiful things but do not treat those as central cases (290a–b, 297e–298a). Artworks are neither the aristocrat’s prize possessions and status symbols, nor the countercultural philosopher’s inherently valuable items. So too generally Plato conducts his inquiry into beauty at a distance from his discussion of art. (But the Republic and the Laws both contain exceptions to this generalization: Lear 2010, 361.)

These three aspects of Platonic beauty work together and reflect beauty’s unique place in Plato’s metaphysics, something almost both visible and intelligible.

1.2 Beauty and art

The three principles of beauty in the Hippias Major also apply in the Symposium, Plato’s other analysis of beauty. In the Symposium Socrates claims to be quoting his teacher Diotima on the subject of love, and in the lesson attributed to her she calls beauty the object of every love’s yearning. She spells out a soul’s progress toward ever-purer beauty, from one body to all, then through all beautiful souls to laws and kinds of knowledge, finally reaching beauty itself (210a–211d). The object of erotic longing, despite being contained within visible experience, can induce a desirous (and thoughtful) observer’s progress toward purely intelligible beauty.

Diotima describes the poet’s task as the begetting of wisdom and other virtues (209a). Ultimately desiring what is beautiful, the poet produces works of verse. And who (Diotima asks) would not envy Homer or Hesiod (209d)? But aside from these passages the Symposium seems prepared to treat anything but a poem as an exemplar of beauty. In a similar spirit the Philebus’s examples of pure sensory beauty exclude pictures (51b–d).

The Republic contains tokens of Plato’s reluctance to associate poetry with beauty. The dialogue’s first discussion of poetry, whose context is education, censors poems that corrupt the young (377b–398b). Then almost immediately Socrates speaks of cultivating a fondness for beauty among the young guardians. Let them see gracefulness (euschêmosunê) in paintings and illustrative weaving, a sibling to virtue (401a). Their taste for beauty will help them prefer noble deeds over ugly vulgar ones (401b–d, 403c). How can Plato have seen the value of beauty to education and not mentioned the subject in his earlier criticisms? Why couldn’t this part of the Republic concede that false and pernicious poems affect the young through their beauty?

The answer is that the Republic denies the legitimacy of the beauty in poetry. Republic 10 calls that beauty deceptive. Take away the decorative language that makes a poetic sentiment sound right and put it into ordinary words, and it becomes unremarkable, as young people’s faces beautified by youth later show themselves as the plain looks they are (601b). The Republic can hardly deny some attractive effect that poetry has, for people enjoy the way poems can present experience to them. Yet it resists calling this attractiveness beauty.

1.3 Beauty and nature

As if to accentuate the difference between art and nature, Plato’s reader finds emphatic and repeated assertions of appreciation for the beauty in nature.

Plato stands out among ancient authors where the admiration of natural scenes and settings is concerned. Pausanias’s Description of Greece (the closest thing to a travel guide in antiquity) seems not to notice the spectacular views in the countryside it moves through (Pretzler 2007, 59–62). If anything, bucolic scenes myth provided opportunities for rape (Homer Hymn to Demeter 5–14; Euripides Ion 889ff.). But Plato’s Phaedrus follows Socrates and young Phaedrus on their walk through the countryside until they stop and sit and cool their feet. Socrates declares it a kalê … katagôgê “beautiful spot to rest” (230b). This may be the only extant Greek passage that calls any area or natural scenery beautiful.

Further from the nature that surrounds human observers is the ouranos, a word that means “heaven” but that in Plato’s Timaeus also denotes the visible world (28a–b). The Timaeus calls the ouranos and the whole kosmos beautiful (28b, 29a, 30a–d; see 53b, 54a, 68e on the beauty of the world’s elements). One does not have to guard against or qualify one’s admiration for heavenly beauty. Taking in the fine sight of the stars has taught human souls number, the inquiry into nature as a whole, and therefore philosophy (47a–b). The pseudo-Platonic Epinomis, which shows Plato’s influence, likewise traces thoughts of number to astronomical observations (977a–978e). The Laws credits the movement of the stars with inspiring belief in gods (966d–e). Any serious person who admires nature’s beauty will learn from it.

1.4 The Form of beauty

It is fundamental to understanding Platonic beauty as part of Plato’s aesthetics that Plato sees no opposition between the pleasures that beauty brings and the goals of philosophy. The Timaeus suffices to make that point when it credits contemplation of the heavens with the origins of philosophy.

More broadly, many passages associate a Form with beauty: Cratylus 439c; Euthydemus 301a; Laws 655c; Phaedo 65d, 75d, 100b; Phaedrus 254b; Parmenides 130b; Philebus 15a; Republic 476b, 493e, 507b. Plato mentions beauty as often as he speaks of any property that admits of philosophical conceptualization, and for which a Form therefore exists. Thanks to the features of Forms as such, we know that this entity being referred to must be something properly called beauty, whose nature can be articulated without recourse to the natures of particular beautiful things. (See especially Phaedo 79a and Phaedrus 247c on properties of this Form.)

Beauty is Plato’s example of a Form as frequently as it is for a pair of reasons. On one hand it bears every mark of the Forms. It is an evaluative concept as much as justice and courage are, and suffers from disputes over its meaning as much as they do. The Theory of Forms seeks to guarantee stable referents for disputed evaluative terms; so if anything needs a Form, beauty does, and it will have a Form if any property does.

In general, a Form F differs from an individual F thing in that the property F may be predicated unambiguously and plainly of the Form. The Form F is F. An individual F thing both is and is not F. In this sense the same property F may be predicated only equivocally of the individual (e.g. Republic 479a–c). Plato’s analysis of equivocally F individuals (Cratylus 439d–e, Symposium 211a) recalls observations that everyone makes about beautiful objects. They fade with time; require an offsetting ugly detail; elicit disagreements among observers; lose their beauty outside their context (adult shoes on children’s feet). Such limitations of individual things are rarely as clear where other Form properties are concerned as they are for beauty. Odd numbers may fail to be odd in some hard-to-explain way, and large objects may or may not grow small as the years go by, but the ways in which beautiful things fall short of perfection are obvious even to the unphilosophical.

While typical qua Form, physical beauty is atypical in being a Form that humans want to know. The process known as anamnêsis or recollection is more plausible for beauty than it is for most other properties. The philosophical merit of equivocally F things is that they come bearing signs of their incompleteness, so that the inquisitive mind wants to know more (Republic 523c–524d). Therefore, beauty promises more effective reflection than any other property of things. Beauty alone is both a Form and a sensory experience (Phaedrus 250d).

So the Phaedrus (250d–256b) and Symposium ignore people’s experiences of other properties when they describe the first movement into philosophizing. Beautiful things remind souls of their mystery as no other visible objects do, and in his optimistic moments Plato welcomes people’s attention to them.

The optimistic moments are not easy to sustain. To make beauty effective for learning, Plato needs to rely on its desirability (as foregrounded in Konstan 2015), but also on the soul’s ability to transfer its desiring from the visible to the intelligible (Philebus 65e). Plato is ambivalent about visual experience. Sight may be like knowledge metaphorically; metonymically it calls to mind the ignorant senses (Pappas 2015, 49). The sight of beauty must overcome itself to become the higher sight of a higher beauty.

When the transfer of attention and desire succeeds, beauty’s unmatched pedagogical effects show why Plato talks about its goodness and good consequences, sometimes even its identity with “the good” (Laws 841c; Philebus 66a–b; Republic 401c; Symposium 201c, 205e; but the relationship between beautiful and good, especially in Symposium, is controversial: White 1989). These desirable effects also explain why Plato speaks grudgingly of beauty in art and poetry, lest the dangerous arts find a place in the development of good thinking. Another question matters more than either poetry or beauty does: What leads a mind toward knowledge and the Forms? Things of beauty do so excellently well. Poems mostly don’t. When poems (or paintings) set the mind running along unphilosophical tracks away from what is abstract and intelligible, the attractions they possess will reveal themselves as meretricious. The corrupting cognitive effect exercised by poems demonstrates their inability to function as Plato knows the beautiful object to function.

The corrupting effect needs to be spelled out. What prevents poems from behaving as beautiful objects do? The answer will have to address the orienting question in Plato’s aesthetics, namely: What fosters philosophical enlightenment, and what obstructs it?

2. Imitation

The top candidate for the cause of error (or something worse than mere ignorance) in art is mimêsis, a word most commonly translated into English as “imitation.” Other translations include “representation” and “emulation.” And to make things confusing, the transliterated Greek word sans diacritical mark has come to be accepted as English (“mimesis”).

All the translations capture something of the word’s meaning. As long as “imitation” is used with the awareness that it will not mean everything that mimêsis does, it makes a serviceable translation. “Imitate” functions well enough as the verb mimeisthai; so does “mimic.” (See Sörbom 1966; also Marušič 2011.)

One may just use the Greek mimêsis, as this discussion will do. For simplicity’s sake some prefer the now-English “mimesis.” But this last choice brings a risk. The English word “mimesis” has begun picking up its own contexts and connotations, becoming English proportionately as it ceases to substitute for the Greek word.

Besides mimêsis Plato sometimes speaks of a mimêma. “Imitation” like mimêsis can refer either to a process or to its outcome. You engage in the act of imitation in order to produce an imitation. A mimêma however is only ever a copy, not also the copying act that produced it.

(Mateo Duque was of much help in thinking through issues in the coming sections.)

2.1 Mimêsis in Aristophanes

Authors before Plato used mimêsis more vaguely than he did, neither attaching the word to a poetic process nor implying its fraudulence —with one important exception. The comedies of Aristophanes, obsessed with Euripides and with all tragedy (Birds 787, 1444; Clouds 1091; Plutus 423–4), introduce comments about tragic stagecraft that say mimeisthai and mimêsis in pejorative ways.

Although comedy is sometimes identified as antagonist to philosophy in the “ancient quarrel” that Plato speaks of between philosophy and poetry (Most 2011), Aristophanes has also long been seen as Plato’s precursor in the moralistic critique of poetry. The two share conservative sensibilities that outweigh Aristophanes’ slander of Socrates in Clouds (Nussbaum 1980). But Aristophanes’ influence on Plato also extends to the nature of mimêsis. He uses that word in a technical sense that describes what actors do in a play, and with Platonic suggestions of fraud or concealment.

In addition to the face-off between Aeschylus and Euripides in Frogs, one might cite Aristophanes’ Women Celebrating the Thesmophoria, which calls mimêsis a disruption of life and opposes it to nature. Moreover Women Celebrating the Thesmophoria finds an ambiguity in dramatic imitation that anticipates Plato. In that play, as in the Republic, mimêsis mixes together composition and performance, the invention of characters and the portrayal of them (Pappas 1999).

2.2 Republic 2–3: impersonation

The Aristophanic ambiguity between composition and performance appears, in Plato, in Book 3 of the Republic, which is one of the two dialogues (along with Laws, in Book 4) that investigates mimêsis as a characteristic specific to poetry.

Books 2 and 3 of the Republic assess poetry’s role in the curriculum for the city’s guardian class. At least ostensibly, their purpose is pedagogical. The first part of this argument runs from the final pages of Book 2 through the first part of Book 3, condemning the images of gods and demigods that Homer and the tragedians have produced (377e–392c). Pernicious stories about gods and heroes blaspheme the divine, and set bad examples for young warriors. Socrates focuses on the harmful effect of saying that the gods quarrel (378c), and that Cronus castrated his father and was overthrown in turn by Zeus. Gods are good and should not be said to cause harm (379b).

The emphasis on content and the focus on what children hear make this part of the discussion seem to have only limited relevance to aesthetics. But in the first place, the restrictions on poetry expand as the argument goes on, from what “nurses and mothers” must attend to (377c) to proclamations that some stories “shouldn’t be told” (378b), that no one should hear of a god’s causing evil (380b–c), and that a play asserting such a thing shouldn’t be allowed to train a chorus (383c). What at first should not be heard by the young finally should not be heard at all.

In the second place, strictures on what may be said about the gods goes beyond content to hint at the formal analysis that comes in Book 3. When ruling out tales about divinities in disguise, Socrates says that gods would not change their form. A god would not be a goêtês “sorcerer” (380d). The comment is both the oblique first connection between poetry and sorcery in the Republic, and also the first mention of impersonation. Gods who change their form are playing a dramatic part, and practicing sorcery when they do.

Socrates concludes his criticism of how poetry presents gods and heroes and asks about the lexis “style” of narration. Poetic narration can take place through narration alone, through mimêsis alone, or by combining the two (392d).

Already this way of differentiating among storytelling methods proceeds irregularly, as if one were to analyze walking into pure walking, running, and a combination of the two, and declared that to be an explanation of running. Such an analysis would mark the act of running as deviant walking. Likewise the taxonomy of narrations presumes that mimêsis is deviant.

The subsequent pages continue treating mimêsis as something comprehensible only under the sign of anomaly and failure. Socrates defines imitation, develops two arguments against it, and finally proclaims that no mimetic poetry will be admitted into the city that the Republic is founding.

The defining example establishes mimêsis as impersonation or emulation. Homer’s poems alternate between third-person accounts of events (in which Homer narrates in his own voice) and speeches made by the characters involved in those events. In the latter instances, Homer “makes himself like” the characters speaking, deceptively producing a speech “as if he were someone else” (393b). The poet “hides himself” (393d), thus even losing personal autonomy.

When Homer recounts Agamemnon’s rebuke to the priest Chryses, Socrates says, he uses the abusive language that a warriors’ king would use when such a king refused to show mercy (393a–c).

This passage leaves the presentation of character ambiguous between the act of writing or composing the words of a character like Agamemnon, and the act of reciting (performing, acting out) those words. Epic poets likely put together their works and also performed them, therefore acting out the parts; dramatic poets may well have spoken parts in character as they wrote; such independent dramatic traditions as the Japanese noh featured players who both wrote plays and acted in them (Hare 2008, 40). The ambiguity between writing and reciting (which already appeared in Aristophanes) lets Socrates deploy more than one argument against the presentation of characters.

The main argument is blunt but clear, and it is plausible enough. What the new city really does not want is the presentation of base types, because performing such parts fosters the behaviors that are found in the persons being mimicked (395c–397e). Attempts to read this impersonation as attention to appearance alone (Lear 2011) have the advantage of unifying Book 3 with Book 10, but sacrifice the psychological simplicity behind the argument.

If acting a part does lead to taking on the characteristics of the part, then in one respect the Republic has a powerful point to make, and in another respect generates a misleading argument. The point is powerful inasmuch as it lets the newly formed city ban all portrayals of vicious and ignoble characters but not those of brave soldiers, philosophers, and other wholesome types. Moreover the factual premise is believable. Taking on someone else’s traits and tics can have a more lasting effect than the Republic’s critics sometimes acknowledge. Actors even today comment on how a role changed them. Those who play lovers in movies sometimes fall in love.

Even this most plausible part of the argument runs into trouble. Plato’s list of things unworthy of imitation proves surprisingly commodious. Alongside villains one finds women, slaves, animals, musical instruments, gears and pulleys, and sounds of water. And these last examples beg the question. Sounding like machinery does not make the imitator more like a gear or pulley. Nor do actors start to behave and think as if they were flowing water. The impersonatory act must be a deranged practice only insofar as all impersonation is deranged. But that more fundamental derangement had been what the argument was aiming to prove.

What significantly misleads in this argument amounts to more than the passing hyperbole. The case against mimêsis exploits the ambiguity between impersonation as something a writer does and impersonation as the performer’s task. Eric Havelock (1963) stressed the importance of this ambiguity to Book 3, but understated the degree to which Plato exploited the ambiguity. The most convincing part of Book 3 has to assume that mimêsis is performance, both because such effects as thunder are mimicked in performance, not on the page; and because the bad effects of impersonation on character make more sense when describing young actors’ playing a vicious role than grown playwrights in the act of writing that role.

On the other hand performance does not involve a whole population. It brings about the worst effects to a fraction of the city. The Athenian population mostly did not perform dramatic roles. They may have enjoyed drama in the theater, but banning plays from the city calls for seeing something inherently wrong with dramatic works themselves, whether as performed or just as written, and so with a quality in them that follows from the mimêsis in the composition of them. The conclusion to this passage makes clear that the city will ban all mimetic works:

If a man were to arrive in the city whose wisdom [sophia] empowered him to become everything and to mimic all things—together with the poems he wanted to perform [epideixasthai]— we would worship him as someone holy [hieron] and wonderful and pleasant, but tell him there is no man like him in our city, nor by our traditional law [themis] can come to be here; and we would send him off to another city after pouring myrrh on his head and crowning him with wool. (398a)

The religious language is lavish. No ordinary deeds are being excluded but ones that smell of sacred power. And the city fathers running mimetic poetry out of town have broadened their scope from the young guardians’ education to the cultural life of a community. The literary representation of characters will receive no hearing anywhere. It is even doubtful whether the city will permit dramatic poems to circulate in written form, as if their very potential for being performed rendered them toxic. The sins of performance extend to the allegedly performative author of dramatic parts.

The poet is a visitor because mimetic poetry has no natural home in the philosophers’ town. (Maybe Plato is thinking of literal outsiders, like tragic playwrights from Syracuse: Monoson 2012, 163.) Moreover he arrives offering to recite his poems. That they are his makes him a poet, that he comes to recite them makes him a performer. Thus he embodies the ambiguity built into Book 3’s definition of mimêsis. If the fate of imitative composition stands or falls with the fate of imitative performance, a reasonable worry about behaviors that young people experiment with balloons into an argument against a body of literature. The equivocation between performance and composition lets the argument proceed to its grand conclusion.

Book 3 took its assessment of poetry beyond criticism into aesthetics by developing imitation as a formal concept. This is to say 1) that one can distinguish poetic mimêsis from poetic narration by looking for a formal element in the poetry; and 2) that mimêsis may make poetry more deleterious than it would otherwise be, but does not work these bad effects by itself, only when the characters represented are bad to begin with. The definition of imitation in Book 3 entails no general ideas of similarity or likeness, and it remains confined to one art form.

Book 10 will look at imitation from a different perspective. Space does not permit a review of all existing proposals about how to square the two passages. Whether Books 3 and 10 offer compatible accounts of mimêsis, and how one might make them compatible, remains the most controversial question about Plato’s aesthetics. (See Belfiore 1984, Halliwell 1988, Nehamas 1982; and for a superb summary of the main proposals, Naddaff 2002, 136n8. Lear 2011 is a recent argument in favor of the two passages’ agreement with one another.) Still one may trust a few summative statements. Republic 10 revises the formal aspects of mimêsis with an imagistic depiction that entails more than direct quotation. The enhanced concept cannot be understood without reference to the Republic’s psychological theory. And in its expanded form the term refers to something bad in itself.

If Books 2 and 3 presented an account of the content in poetry and then an analysis of its form, Book 10 may be said to show how form invents content (to use a phrase attributed to the novelist Gilbert Sorrentino). The result is that, where the critique of mimêsis in Book 3 allowed a loophole making representation acceptable if it portrayed virtuous characters, the argument in Book 10 will promise that such an outcome will never happen (605a). Good mimêsis presents bad people.

2.3 Republic 10: copy-making

As the Sophist also does (see below), Book 10 of the Republic treats mimêsis as a process at work in more art forms than drama. The topic in this passage, roughly the first half of Book 10 (595a–608b), is a mimêsis common to painting and poetry and much like picturing or copying. It is a relationship between a visible original and its visible likeness.

As Book 10 begins, Socrates links the coming treatment with what Book 3 had said about imitation and also establishes the difference between the passages. What follows will defend Book 3’s banishment of “imitative poetry” in terms that the Republic developed after Book 3. “Now that we have differentiated the soul’s eidê,” Socrates says, the danger of imitation becomes more evident (595a–b). An eidos is a kind, and this phrase “kinds of soul” is usually taken to mean the parts of the soul that Book 4 distinguished (435b–441c, 445d). The Republic’s theory of reason, spirit, and desire can enlarge what had been in Book 3 no more than suspicion about the impersonation of ignoble people. The new argument will charge poetry with upsetting the balance among the soul’s parts. (Daniel Mailick contributed to this discussion of the Republic’s psychological theory.)

In all Socrates presents three theses during this first half of Book 10:

  1. Poetic mimêsis, like the kind found in painting, is the imitation of appearance alone, and its products rank far below truth. (596e–602c)
  2. Therefore poetic mimêsis corrupts the soul, weakening the rational impulse’s control over the person’s other drives and desires. (602c–608b)
  3. It should therefore be banned from the good city.

The argument supporting (1) seeks to spell out how badly poetry and painting fare at grasping and communicating knowledge. Partly because they do so badly, but also for other reasons, mimetic arts bring moral and psychological ill effects (2).

The words “imitation of appearance” in (1) follow from a three-way differentiation:

  1. Form (of couch, of table) made by a god.
  2. Individual things (couches, tables) made by humans.
  3. Paintings (of couch or table) made by imitators.

The carpenter works with eyes aiming “toward [pros]” the Form (596b)—not with eyes on the Form, but looking in that direction—so the individual couch the carpenter makes is something less than the Form: an honest failing after a decent try. If the Form is an object of knowledge, human creators at least possess true opinion (601e).

Thus category II is never referred to as a realm of imitation, and – as a result – the table depicted in a painting does not turn into (in the popular phrase) the “imitation of an imitation.” The argument against art does not focus on what a carpenter or other skilled worker does in making an artifact. Nevertheless Plato’s phrase “imitation of appearance” does characterize artistic mimêsis as a compounded problem. Imitation intensifies a weakness present in existing objects; it not only fails but fails doubly. The good-faith effort at approximating to the Form of the couch produced a visible object. Visible objects represented in artistic imitation possess both intelligible and visible properties, and that imperfection in objects leaves them vulnerable to being imitated only in their visible aspects.

Those visible aspects are the subject matter for a visual representation. When you look at a couch from different perspectives, you are still looking at the same couch, when that object is understood intelligibly. But the couch seen from different perspectives makes for different paintings. Therefore the painting must be not an image of the couch but an image of its appearance (598a).

The same difference applies if the painter depicts a shoemaker (598b–c), erring in that representation of a human professional by dint of lacking the professional’s knowledge. The painter gives us a shoemaker as seen by one who has no idea what shoemakers know, as the dramatic poet represents everything in a character except what that character knows. A full and true account of a doctor must include medical knowledge, or else you are not describing the reality of the doctor.

Skipping ahead for a moment, the Republic’s reader finds a second three-way distinction (601c–602a) that criticizes imitation from another perspective:

  1. User (of a flute or bridle) who knows.
  2. Maker (of flute or bridle) who has correct belief.
  3. Imitator (of flute or bridle) who is ignorant.

This intriguing new list is hard to make sense of. The three items belong alongside the previous three-part ranking. The carpenter who makes a table resembles the leatherworker making the bridle; both tripartitions put the visual imitator lowest. But why do flautists and jockeys suddenly appear in the top spot, in place of a god so supreme as to create even Forms?

The answer might appear among the particular manufactured objects that these passages refer to. For the reader familiar with Greek religion, both rankings evoke Athena. The couch- and table-making carpenter practices a trade whose patron is Athena, while myths known to Plato depict her as the original user of both flute (Pindar 12th Pythian Ode) and bridle (Pindar 13th Olympian Ode). These associations put the imitator at the opposite pole from a god, rendering the products of imitation not only lowly nothings but malevolently profane, even blasphemous. Athena’s technologies permit the forces that would threaten civilized life to find their place within a city, but imitators exist outside the space of these civilizing technologies (Pappas 2013). One need not subject the passage to so much pressure in the effort to make it fit alongside the earlier tripartite hierarchy, but those who see religious lines running through the Republic’s arguments about art might want to develop this interpretation.

The argument thus far posits painting as the default case of mimêsis (Golden 1975, Nehamas 1982, Belfiore 1984, Moss 2007). But Socrates springboards beyond pictorial art to condemn tragedy and its “father” Homer. Homer was ignorant, never taught a useful thing to anyone (599b–600e). This apparent ad hominem attack is designed to show that poetry too imitates appearance. For that purpose it suffices to show that one esteemed poet writes without knowledge. If great poetry can come out of someone ignorant, then poetry must not require knowledge. Even if ignorance is not necessary for the composition of poetry Homer’s example demonstrates that the two are compatible.

An obvious complaint comes to mind. “Someone can be ignorant and still write great poetry!” Plato nods in glum agreement, for this is exactly the problem. Nothing good will come of an activity that can not only be attempted ignorantly but even succeeded at in ignorance. The success of the ignorant suffices to prove that no knowledge comes into play in poetic imitation. Poetry too imitates no more than appearance.

The pictorial sense of mimêsis now has eclipsed the embodying or role-playing sense that the argument in Book 3 exploited. Aristotle will follow the Republic in conceiving mimêsis in both ways, although he keeps the two separate. When Aristotle identifies two natural grounds for the appeal of mimêsis, one describes enactment (Poetics 4 1448b6) and the other pictorial depiction (Poetics 4 1448b12). Book 10 is trying to attack poetry that enacts human characters on the grounds that it thereby resembles pictures.

As if to bridge the gap between the two critiques, Socrates goes on to argue that poetry harms the soul. He says that poetry’s illusions fortify the worst part of the soul and turn it against the best. The first stretch of this argument (602c–603b) uses theoretical language taken from the Republic’s psychological theory, while the second (603b–608b) appeals to observable phenomena surrounding performances of tragedies.

Socrates returns to his analogy between poetry and painting. If you are partly taken in by a painting’s tricked-up table apparition but you partly spot the falseness, which part of you does which? The soul’s rational impulse must be the part that knows the painting is not a real table. But Book 4 had established a fundamental principle: When the soul inclines in more than one direction at a time, this conflict represents the activity of more than one faculty or part of the soul (436b; recalled in Book 10’s argument at 602e). So being taken in by an optical or artistic illusion must be the act of some part of the soul distinct from reason. Painting and tragedy both inspire reactions that do not come from one’s calculating capacity.

Invoking Book 4’s psychological theory integrates the critique of poetry of Book 10 into the Republic’s overarching argument. The Republic identifies justice with a balance among reason, spirit or anger, and the desires. This controlled balance is the happiest state available for human souls, and the most virtuous. Because imitation undoes the soul’s justice, it brings both vice and misery.

The Republic does not specify the irrational part in question. Thinking the sun is the size of your hand does not feel like either anger overwhelming you or desires tempting. What do illusions have to do with irrationality of motive?

Again commentaries differ. A complex and fertile debate continues to worry over how perceptual error undermines mental health or moral integrity (Nehamas 1982, Moss 2007). Part of the answer comes from Books 8–9, which sketch four character types graded from best to worst. These are eidê in a different sense of that word, meaning not the parts or separate motives within one soul but the species that one might sort souls into. This taxonomy of soul-types deserves to play a larger role than it has in the discussion of imitation.

The pleasures of the lowest soul-eidos are illusory and feed on illusion. Unreal appearances produce unreliable pleasures, which are all the keener and madder for the ontologically light quality of their instigating images. Book 9 says that desire delights not in true beings but in “idols [eidôlois] of true pleasure” and painted images, eskiagraphêmenais (586b). Skiagraphia – the root within this last word – was an impressionistic manner of painting that juxtaposed contrasting hues to create illusionistic shadow and intensify color (Keuls 1974, Demand 1975, Petraki 2018). Plato disapproved specifically of skiagraphia (Parmenides 165c–d, Phaedo 69b). In fact the Republic’s attacks on painting are sometimes interpreted narrowly as applying only to skiagraphia.

Thus where Book 9 examines the desirous part of the soul and finds its objects to be mere idols, Book 10 determines mimêsis to be a show of mere idols and concludes that it keeps company with the soul’s desirous part. In that case the pictorial quality of poetic mimêsis might be a distraction, its main fault residing in its illusionistic character.

The terminology in Book 9 underscores the connection between these arguments. The tyrant is “at the third remove” from the oligarch, his pleasure “a third-place idol [tritôi eidôlôi]” compared to the truth (alêtheia) of the oligarchic soul’s pleasure (587c). Meanwhile the oligarch’s soul stands third below the “kingly man [tou basilikou]” (587d). Only ten pages later Book 10 echoes this terminology when it calls the imitator “third from the king [basileôs] and from the truth [alêtheias]” (597e; cf. 602c). In other words, the language in Book 10 brings Book 9’s equation of base pleasures with illusory ones into its attack on art. If Book 10 can show that an art form fosters interest in illusions it will have gone a long way toward showing that the art form keeps company with irrational desires.

Another essential step in the argument is the recognition that what Book 3 acknowledged as an exception to its critique, namely the imitation of virtuous thoughtful characters, is not apt ever to take place. Socrates has tragedy in mind (comedy secondarily), and observes that playwrights neither know the quiet philosophical type nor profit from putting that nice type on stage before spectators who came to the theater to see something showily agitated (604e–605a). At one stroke Plato intensifies his condemnation of mimêsis, no longer a dangerous technique when it presents the wrong kinds of people but a technique that seldom presents any other kind.

Tragedy’s hero, who is inherently impulsive and impassioned, acts contrary to the dictates of reason. An illusion of virtue guides him. His son dies, and rather than save his tears for a private moment he lets them flow publicly and at length (603e–604a). The spectators’ reason is appalled; their other impulses rejoice (605c–e). They reckon that there is no harm in weeping along with the hero, enjoying an emotional release without the responsibility one feels in real-life situations. We grow accustomed not merely to feeling strong emotions, but to feeling them without the oversight of reason at work. This is how dramatic illusion induces bad habits of indulging the passions. The soul that had spent its life learning self-control sets about unlearning it.

Incidentally this argument turns on an assumption that Plato asserts without discussion, that mimêsis is the presentation or representation of characters (e.g. 603c; 605a, c). Although Book 10 sometimes speaks of mimêsis in other terms (mimêsis of virtues: 600e), the argument about fostering passions requires that objects of poetic representation be humans. When what we call literary works practice what we call representation, Plato claims that they represent human beings. For him as for Aristotle drama presents prattontas “people doing things,” but where Aristotle emphasizes the things done, for Plato it is the people. Character is the essence of epic and drama. (Halliwell 1988 argues otherwise.)

Plato’s emphasis on character already predisposes him not to find philosophical worth in literature. The reason for mistrusting individual characters becomes explicit in Laws. A character speaks from a single point of view. Bring several characters together representing several idiosyncratic perspectives on the world and the very idea of deriving a general statement from the work becomes impossible (Laws 719c–d). This situation is as it were the dramatic corollary to a general principle in mimêsis, that it represents plurality or multiplicity and so is forever indeterminate, undeterminable. Seeing the plurality of personages in a work as generative of its illusions might help to explain how poetry resembles paintings. But the analogy remains obscure.

2.4 Sophist

Plato’s Sophist, often called a later work than the Republic, proposes its own account of mimêsis. It pursues imitation for the different purpose of defining what a sophist is. But the sophist—whom the main speaker calls an imitator (mimêtês) and sorcerer (goêtês) (235a)—is not far removed from the deceiving poet (Notomi 2011, 311–313).

And although the Sophist’s theory of imitation diverges from the one in Republic 10, similarities between them preponderate. As the Republic does, the Sophist characterizes imitation mockingly as the creation of a whole world, and accuses imitation of misleading the unwary (234b–c), even if it also predicts more optimistically that people grow up to see through false likenesses (234d). Again as in Republic 10 imitation is contrasted with a god’s work—except that in the Sophist gods make all living things (265c–d) and also images, eidôla (266a): dreams, shadows, reflections.

The representation that Plato charges sophists with is fraudulent. It is the kind that makes not an honest likeness (eikasia) but an illusory image, a phantasma (235d–236b). Makers of realistic statues are attending not to what a human figure really looks like but to what looking at it is like. In drawing the distinction between these kinds of representations – a distinction that incidentally appears in no other dialogue (Halliwell 2021, 34) – the Sophist does strike a conciliatory tone not found in Republic 10. Here, it appears that a branch of the mimetic profession retains the power to produce a reliable likeness of an object. But the consolation proves fleeting. Reliable imitation plays no role in a definition of sophists, would presumably play no role in talk of poets either, and seems to make an appearance only for the purpose of being shuffled offstage as the excluded mimêsis, that which the imitation being talked about differs from.

The Sophist marginalizes positive imitation when it takes up mimêsis a second time, subdividing the production of illusions to identify a species in which imitators use their own voice and bodies: “This part is called imitation [mimêsis]” (267a). The Eleatic Stranger who is speaking recognizes that he has appropriated the general word for the specific act of enacting false images. We also notice that theatrical enactment becomes, on this analysis, a subset of pictorial image-making. “Let’s designate this to be what we call the imitative profession [mimêtikon].” Everything else in the large genus can go by some other name (267a).

Narrowing the process down to impersonation should make clear that Plato finds a sophist’s imitativeness to resemble a poet’s. Moreover this development neutralizes suggestions that mimêsis might have a good side. The imitative technê will have many manifestations, including those legitimate practices that the Statesman and other dialogues refer to. But the real work of mimêsis, the one that is worth defining and that applies to dominant art forms, is mendacious impersonation. Where Republic 3’s taxonomy made imitation look like a freakish variety of narration, this use of a word both generically and specially excludes good imitation as the exception and the problem case. Essentially speaking the art of mimêsis is a bad and lying art.

After all, as the Stranger says, there is a shortage of names for types of mimêsis. The ancients did not work hard enough making all relevant philosophical distinctions (267d). It is as if Plato were saying: “Colloquial language being loose, I will sometimes use mimêsis in the broader sense that contains epistemically sound practices, even though the core sense of the word is pejorative.”

2.5 Closing assessment

This coverage of mimêsis in Plato will seem too strong in one respect and too weak or incomplete in another. It emphasizes core Platonic arguments about mimetic poetry. But the dialogues are far-ranging documents, and a reader discovers these core arguments among passages that argue to opposite effect, or deploying the vocabulary of mimêsis in contradictory ways.

For instance: If mimêsis brings about deceptive effects in the poetry about human beings, it also accounts for the visible universe, which Plato’s Timaeus calls an imitation of its intelligible model (39e; and see 44d) – and which, as already seen, that dialogue calls beautiful. For that matter human learning about the natural world also mimics an intelligible reality (47c, 80b) (Spinelli 2021). In the political domain, the Statesman calls existing constitutions mimêmata of moral truths, with no implication of fraud in them (297c). The funeral speech in the Menexenus urges the young to copy their elders’ virtues (236e). Such passages suggest a rehabilitation for the process that the Republic treats as counterfeiting (Robinson 2016).

Recent studies of Platonic mimêsis take the point further, as in a collection edited by Julia Pfefferkorn and Antonino Spinelli (2021). The contributors to that volume examine the appearances of mimêsis outside the “aesthetic” passages to which thought about the concept is usually confined, and they identify a variety of positive functions for the process. So mimêsis plays a role in recollection (Candiotto 2021), and in the ethical effort to assimilate oneself to the divine nature (Männlein-Robert 2021). Stephen Halliwell argues for the general point that “there is no unified and stable conception of mimesis to be found in Plato, let alone a uniformly negative conception” (Halliwell 2021, 29). The Republic’s philosophers themselves engage in mimetic work, whether in embodying the spirit of the new city’s laws (485c) or when patterning themselves after what is most real (500c). We even find philosophers symbolically painting the good city (Halliwell 2021, Marrin 2023).

The complexity surrounding mimêsis may be hardest to sort out when humans are said to learn from nature. The beauty that Plato assigns to nature has been noted, and its place in the growth of knowledge. But there too mimêsis enters the picture. The Menexenus’s speech goes so far as to affirm that women imitate the earth when they bear children (238a). The Timaeus’s praise for seeing and studying the order in the skies describes the psychic betterment that comes of “copying” stellar movements with similar movements in one’s soul (47b–c).

Even in response to Book 10’s anti-poetic argument, a sympathetic reader might make the case that the poet’s error lies not in imitation per se, but in deploying that appealing technique without also, in the process, representing the true look of virtue.

A reading of the Republic’s attack on imitation may silence many of the complicating objections by emphasizing that poetry goes wrong (in formal terms) only insofar as it operates not as simple mimêsis, but in particular the mimêsis of persons. Something about performing an individual’s part brings out the great ignorance and potential for corrupting souls, and the desirable types of mimêsis cited in the Republic and elsewhere tend to make the object of imitation something other than individual humans. This reply itself does have to admit objections, though, such as young philosophers’ efforts to act like upright and serious dialecticians (539c; see Menexenus 236e).

But insisting on the mimêsis of persons also invites broader systematic worries. Why should this one narrowly defined act of character-presentation fall prey to charges that it issues in images of appearance, when other mimetic acts avoid that charge? Just how is drama relevantly like painting when (for example) narrative is not?

Suppose that question does find an answer, and that mimetic poetry about individuals remains guilty of generating mere imitations of appearance. The Sophist’s reference to divine copy-making then invites another worry, in the face of which this discussion of mimêsis can appear too weak. According to the Sophist, the images that gods produce in their kind of imitation are shadows and reflections, and the products of truly bad mimêsis are to be something worse than that. But what could be metaphysically lower than a shadow? Coming back to the Republic one finds shadows and reflections occupying the bottom-most domain of the Divided Line (510a). Where does poetic imitation belong on that ranking?

One may articulate the worry in the Republic’s language. Shadows and reflections belong in the category of near ignorance. Imitation works an effect worse than ignorance, not merely teaching nothing but worse than that engendering a positive and perverse inclination toward ignorance. Plato observes that the ignorant prefer to remain as they are (Symposium 204a), but this turn toward ignorance is different from such complacency. It suggests a wish to know less than one does.

The theoretical question also implies a practical one. If mimêsis poisons the soul, why do people swallow it? Plato’s attack on poetry saddles him with an aesthetic problem of evil.

Republic 10 shows signs of addressing the problem with the vocabulary of magic. Socrates begins by promising that insight into mimêsis operates as a countercharm (595b). People need countercharms because the imitator is a “sorcerer [goêtês],” therefore a deceiver (598d; cf. 602d). Earlier he said that sorcery robs people of knowledge (413b–c). Finally the indictment of Homer’s ignorance ends by saying his poetry casts a spell (601b). As the English “charm” does, this noun kêlêsis can mean “appeal” but also a conjuration. Poetry works magically to draw in the audience that it then degrades.

References to magic serve poorly as explanations but do indicate a need for explanation. Plato sees that some power must be drawing people to give up both knowledge and the taste for knowledge. What is striking about this deus ex machina explaining poetry’s attractiveness in the Republic is what it does not say. In other dialogues the magic of poetry is attributed to one version or another of divine inspiration. Odd that the Republic makes no reference to inspiration in poetry when dialogues as different as the Apology and the Laws mention it and the Ion and the Phaedrus spell out how it works. The Republic’s only invocation of such an event pertains to philosophical education (499b). Odder still, Plato almost never cites imitation and divine inspiration together (the lone exception Laws 719c), as if to say that the two are incommensurable accounts of poetry. Will inspiration play a role ancillary to imitation, or do the two approaches to poetry have nothing to do with one another?

3. Divine Inspiration

In simplest form “inspiration” names the claim that poets are aided in producing their own poetry. At lucky moments a god takes them over and brings value to the poem that it could not have had otherwise.

That much is a common idea. Either a divine source provides the poet with information needed for writing the poem (information about past events or the gods’ lives, for example); or more generally the source gives the poet the talent needed for writing anything. The idea is far from original with Plato. Within Greek culture alone there are Homer and Hesiod before Plato, who begin their great works asking a Muse to “speak into” them; after him Aristotle (Nicomachean Ethics 1099b9, 1179b20–23) (Büttner 2011). Plato will find new meanings in, and new uses for, an idea that has a cultural and religious meaning before him and a long traditional life after him (Ledbetter 2003, Murray 1981, Tigerstedt 1970).

Plato’s version of the idea has proved durable and influential. The old chestnut about a fine line between genius and insanity is only the best-known legacy of Platonic inspiration, as popularized in one way by Cesare Lombroso’s work on “psychiatric art” (Lombroso 1891, 2); in another way by Percy Bysshe Shelley, who translated the Ion in 1821 believing its account of poetic madness supported his own defense of poetry (Shelley 1840).

The topic occurs throughout Plato’s corpus. Platonic characters mention inspiration in dialogues as different as the Apology and the Laws. Socrates on trial tells of his frustrated effort to learn from poets. Their verses seemed excellent but the authors themselves had nothing to say about them (Apology 22b). Socrates concludes that poets work instinctively and while inspired, enthousiazontes, as prophets and soothsayers also do (theomanteis, chrêsmôidoi), as opposed to writing on the basis of sophia (22c). The opposition between wisdom and inspiration does not condemn poets. They write by some nature (phusei tini), as if inspiration were a normally occurring human instinct.

For its part Laws 719c links the effects of inspiration to the nature of drama and its multiple perspectives:

When the poet sits on the Muse’s tripod [en tôi tripodi tês Mousês] he is not in his right mind [emphrôn] but ready to flow like a fountain; and because his profession [technê] is that of imitation [mimêseôs], then in creating people [anthrôpous] who are set against one another he is compelled to contradict himself frequently, and he does not know [oiden] whether these or the other thing of what he says are true [alêthê]. But it is not for a lawmaker to make two statements about a single topic in a law. (719c–d)

As in the Republic, mimêsis leaves the spectator bereft of either truths to evaluate or any wish to assess them. (It is, as there, the imitation of human beings.) As in the Apology, inspiration means the poet has no truths to transmit. When the god’s power comes the poet’s goes. Lawmakers work differently from that. And this contrast between inspiration and the origin of laws—occurring in a dialogue devoted to discovering the best laws for cities—hardly suggests an endorsement for inspiration.

But it is also true that the passage puts the poet on a tripod, i.e. the symbol of Apollo’s priestesses. Whatever brings a poet to write verse also draws divine wisdom out of priestesses; and Plato regularly defers to the authority of oracles. Even supposing that talk of inspiration denies individual control and credit to the poet, the priestess shows that credit and control are not all that matter. She does her best when her mind intrudes least on what she is saying. Her pronouncements have the prestige they do, not despite her loss of control, but because of it (Pappas 2012a). Her audience can trust the god speaking through her.

Another passage in the Laws attributes even reliable historical information to poets writing under the influence of the Muses and Graces (682a). Indeed the Laws overtly credit philosophical conversation to such inspiration (811c, with thanks to Kemal Batak for this reminder). The Meno makes inspiration its defining example of ignorant truth-speaking. Politicians, prophets, and soothsayers alike, “when inspired [enthousiôntes], speak truly [alêthê] about many things, but do not know what they are talking about” (99c). Socrates then calls prophets, soothsayers, and all poets theioi “divine” because of how well they speak without possessing knowledge (99c–d).

In these more tangential remarks, Plato seems to be affirming 1) that inspiration is really divine in origin, and 2) that this divine action that gives rise to poetry guarantees value in the result. It may remain the case that the poet knows nothing. But something good must come of an inspiration shared by poets and priestesses, and often enough that good is truth.

3.1 Ion

Plato’s shortest dialogue, the Ion may be the only one that all his readers would situate within aesthetics. It does not address poetry alone. The character Ion is a performer and interpreter of Homer’s poems, not a poet. Meanwhile, most of what are classed as arts today—painting, sculpture, music—appear in this dialogue as activities for which the problems of irrationality and knowledge signally fail to arise (532e–533c; for painting as technê cf. Gorgias 448c, Protagoras 312d). Nevertheless the Ion belongs in aesthetics by virtue of its focus on artistic inspiration, and the question it provokes of what inspiration implies about poetry’s merits.

As a rhapsode Ion travels among Greek cities reciting and explicating episodes from Homer. Between the recitation and the interpretation, such performances offered much latitude for displays of talent, and Ion’s talent has won him first prize at a contest in Epidaurus. (For some discussion of the rhapsode’s work see Gonzalez 2011, González 2013.)

Ion’s conversation with Socrates falls into three parts, covering idiosyncrasy (530a–533c), inspiration (533c–536d), and ignorance (536d–542b). Ion likes and understands only Homer; Homer composes, and Ion presents the Homeric composition, in a possessed state; and Homer doesn’t know the subjects he talks about, any more than Ion knows the subjects about which he quotes Homer. Both the first and the third sections support the claims made in the second, which should be seen as the conclusion to the dialogue, supported in different ways by the discussions that come before and after it. The idiosyncrasy in Ion’s attachment to Homer shows that Homer, and Ion because of him, function thanks to a divine visitation. But because Ion resists accepting the claim that he is deranged in his performances, Socrates presents a fallback argument. Ion is unqualified to assess any of the factual claims that appear in Homer, about medicine, chariot racing, or anything else. When Socrates compels him to choose between divine inspiration and a very drab brand of knowing nothing, Ion agrees to be called inspired.

This is to say that although poets’ and their readers’ ignorance – the subject of the dialogue’s final section – does emerge as a fact, it is nevertheless a fact in need of interpretation. The ignorance of poets and in poetry is never Plato’s last word. Whether ignorance means as in the Ion that the gods inspire poetry, or as in Republic 10 that imitative poetry imitates appearance alone, it matters less in itself than in its implications. Nor does ignorance alone demonstrate that poets are possessed. The proof of Ion’s ignorance supports inspiration but does not suffice to generate that doctrine.

The idiosyncrasy treated in this dialogue’s opening section, by comparison, is (for Plato) irrational on its face. The idiosyncrasy appears as soon as Socrates asks Ion about his technê (530b). That essential Platonic word has been mistranslated “art” or “craft.” “Skill” is not bad; but perhaps a technê most resembles a profession. The word denotes both a paying occupation and the possession of expertise. In Ion’s case Socrates specifies that the expertise for a rhapsode includes the ability to interpret poetry (530c). Ion rates himself superior to all his competitors at that task, but concedes that he can interpret only Homer (531a). Even though Homer and other poets sometimes address the same subjects, Ion has nothing to say about those others. He confesses this fact without shame or apology, as if his different responses reflected on the poets instead of on his talents. Something in Homer brings out Ion’s eloquence, and other poets lack that quality.

Socrates argues that one who knows a field knows it whole (531e–532a). This denial of the knowledge of particulars in their particularity also appears at Charmides 166e; Phaedo 97d; Republic 334a, 409d. It is not that what is known about an individual thing cannot transfer to other things of the same kind; rather that the act of treating an object as unique means attending to and knowing those qualities of it that do not transfer, and so knowing them as nontransferable qualities. This attitude toward particulars qua particulars is an obstacle to every theoretical expertise. It is the epistemic analogue to the irrational one-on-one erotic bond that Aristophanes describes in Plato’s Symposium (191c–d).

It may well be that what Ion understands about Homer happens to hold true of Hesiod. But if this is the case, Ion will not know it. He does not generalize from one to many poets, and generalizing is the mark of (what Socrates considers) a professional. Diotima’s speech in the Symposium supplies a useful comparison. She differentiates between love that clings to particular objects and a philosophical erôs that escapes its attachment to particulars to pursue general knowledge (210b). Ion’s investment in Homer, like the lover’s lowest grade of attachment, reveals (and also causes) an unwillingness to move toward understanding.

And so Ion presents Socrates with a conundrum. Although the man’s love for Homer prohibits him from possessing expertise, Socrates recognizes how well Ion performs at his job. How to account for success minus skill? Socrates needs to diagnose Ion by means of some positive trait he possesses, not merely by the absence of knowledge.

Socrates therefore speaks of poets and those they move as entheous. He elaborates an analogy. Picture an iron ring hanging from a magnet, magnetized so that a second ring hangs from the first and a third from that second one. Magnets are Muses, the rings attached to them poets, the second rings the poets’ interpreters, third the rhapsodes’ audiences. (For a recent treatment of this image see Wang 2016.)

Plato’s image captures the transfer of charisma. Each iron ring has the capacity to take on the charge that holds it. But the magnetism resides in the magnet, not in the temporarily magnetized rings. No ring is itself the source of the next ring’s attachment to it. Homer analogously draws poetic power from his Muse or god and attracts a rhapsode by means of borrowed power. Maybe in order to vest the great power in a paternal source superseding the Muses, Socrates shifts in the course of his analogy from casting the magnet-stone as feminine Muse (e.g. 533d–534c, 536a) to speaking of the masculine ho theos “the god,” perhaps to be identified with Apollo (534c–d, 536a). Whatever his source is, Ion once charged with Homer’s energy collects enthusiastic fans, as if to his own person and as if by technê—but, to be clear, only as if. The analogy lets poets and rhapsodes appear charismatic without giving them credit for their own charm.

Socrates takes a further step to pit inspiration against reason. “Epic poets who are good at all are never masters of their subject. They are inspired and possessed [entheoi ontes kai katechomenoi]” (533a). Inspiration now additionally means that poets are irrational, as it never meant before Plato. This superadded irrationality explains why Ion rejects Socrates’ proposal, in a passage that is frequently overlooked. He is not unhinged during his performances, Ion says; not katechomenos kai mainomenos, possessed and maddened (536d). Inspiration has come to imply madness and the madness in it is what Ion tries to reject.

What went wrong? The image of rings and magnets is slyer than it appeared. While the analogy rests transparently on one feature of magnetism, it also smuggles in a second. Socrates describes iron rings hanging in straight lines or branching. Although each ring may have more than a single ring dependent upon it, no ring is said to hang from more than one. But real rings hang in other ways, all the rings clumped against the magnet, or one ring clinging to two or three above it. Why does Socrates keep the strings of rings so orderly?

Here is one suggestion. Keeping Homer clung only to his Muse or god, and Ion clung only to Homer, preserves the idiosyncrasy that gave Socrates the excuse to deny expertise to Ion. Otherwise a magnet and rings would show how genuine knowledge is transmitted. Suppose you say that a Muse leads the doctor Hippocrates to diagnostic insights that he tells his students and they tell theirs. That much divine help is all that the image of magnet and rings strictly implies. It poses no threat to a profession’s understanding of itself. But no one would claim that a doctor can learn only from a single other doctor, or that a doctor treats a unique group of adulatory patients. That constraint on medical practice would threaten its status as technê; and that is exactly the constraint added by the array of rings as Socrates describes it. (For a contrasting and compelling reading of this passage, see Chapter 3 of Capra 2015.)

Analogies always introduce new traits into the thing being described. But Plato’s readers should become suspicious because the feature that slips into this figure, the orderly hanging of the rings, is neither called for by the way iron actually transmits magnetic force, nor neutral in effect. Plato has distorted magnetism to make it mean not inspiration simpliciter but something crazy.

The combination of possession and madness in the Ion’s version of inspiration makes it hard to decide whether the dialogue registers some approval for inspired poetry or condemns it entirely. Readers have drawn opposite morals from this short work. (On this controversy see Stern-Gillet 2004.) As Socrates characterizes enthousiasmos, it denies Ion’s professional credibility, not to mention his sanity. But there is religion to think of. If not traditionally pious, Plato is also not the irreverent type who would ascribe an action to divinities in order to mock it. And consider the example of inspired verse mentioned here. Socrates cites Tynnichus, author of only one passable poem, which was a tribute to the Muses (534d). It’s as if the Muses wanted to display their power, Socrates says, by proving that their intervention could elicit a good poem even from an unskilled author. If this is Socrates’ paradigm of inspired poetry, then whatever else inspiration also explains, it appears particularly well suited to producing praise of the gods. And praise of the gods is the poetic form that Plato respects and accepts (Republic 607a).

Finally there is a version of the same problem that arose regarding the Apology, Laws, and Meno, that the Ion calls soothsayers and diviners possessed (chrêsmôidos, mantis: 534d). That already seems to justify inspiration. Add in that Socrates calls the diviner’s practice a technê (538e; cf. 531b) and this dialogue seems to be saying that an activity can be both professional and the result of divine possession.

So what does the charge of madness mean? The word makes Ion recoil—but what does he know about higher states of understanding? Maybe madness itself needs to be reconceived. The Ion says far from enough to settle the question. But Plato’s other sustained discussion of inspiration returns to the language of madness and finds some forms of it permissible, even philosophical.

3.2 Phaedrus

When introducing the Phaedrus’s major speech on erôs (244a–250d), Socrates defines desirous love as a species of mania, madness, in a context that comments on philosophy and poetry with an aside about mimêsis a few pages later.

Madness comes in two general forms: the diseased state of mental dysfunction, and a divergence from ordinary rationality that a god sometimes brings (265a–b). The first is a passing fit of possession, the other the encompassing condition of someone’s soul (with thanks here to Joshua Wilner). The divine latter condition subdivides into love, Dionysian frenzy, oracular prophecy, and poetic composition (244b–245a). In all four cases the possessed or inspired person (enthousiazôn: 241e, 249e, 253a, 263d) can accomplish what is impossible for someone in a sane state. All four cases are associated with particular deities and traditionally honored.

On reconciling the possession described in the Ion with that in the Phaedrus, see Gonzalez 2011 for extended discussion. Briefly we can say that the madness of the Phaedrus is separated from ordinary madness as the Ion’s version is not, and is classified pointedly as good derangement. Bad kinds exist too. But, being a god, Eros can’t do anything bad (242d–e). The greatest blessings flow from divine mania (244a).

The Phaedrus does not associate the possessed condition with idiosyncrasy. To account for the madness of love Socrates describes an otherworldly existence in which souls ride across the top of heaven enjoying direct visions of the Forms (247c–d). After falling into bodily existence a soul responds to beauty more avidly than it does to any other qualities for which there are Forms.

Associating beauty with certain cases of inspiration suggests that poetry born of inspiration might also have philosophical worth. But before welcoming the lost sheep Plato back to the poetry-loving fold, recognize the Phaedrus’s qualifying remarks about which poetry one may now prize. It cannot be imitative. When Socrates ranks human souls depending on how much otherworldly being they saw before falling into bodily form—philosophers come in first on this ranking—the poet or other mimêtikos occupies sixth place out of nine (248e).

Indeed the argument of the Phaedrus only identifies a single type of poem that the Muses call forth: the poem that “embellishes thousands of deeds of the ancients to educate [paideuei] later generations” (245a). But Plato exempts hymns to gods and encomia of heroes from even his harshest condemnation of poetry (Republic 607a). Quite compatibly with the Republic’s exemption the Ion specifies a hymn to the Muses as its example of inspiration and the Phaedrus describes the praise of heroes. Whenever possible Plato reserves the benefits of inspiration for the poems he does not have reason to condemn. And this restriction on which poems derive a true merit from being inspired leaves inspiration a long way from guaranteeing value for poetry as a whole.

4. Imitation, Inspiration, Beauty and the Occasional Wisdom in Poetry

Mimêsis fails, when it does, in two ways. 1) It originates in appearance rather than in reality, so that judged on its own terms the product of imitation has an ignoble pedigree (Republic 603b). 2) The imitative arts positively direct a soul toward appearances, away from proper objects of inquiry. A mirror reflection might prompt you to turn around and look at the thing being reflected, but an imitation keeps your eyes on the copy alone.

Although the dialogues offer few arguments for the second claim, the perverseness with which mimêsis leads one to prefer appearance partly follows from a contrast between traditional visual art and its later developments. Aeschylus had allegedly praised the religiosity of the rougher old visual forms, by comparison with later visually exciting statues that inspired less of a sense of divinity (Porphyry On Abstinence from Animal Food 2.18). Early votive objects, sometimes no more representational than a plank or oblong stone, were treated as markers of the gods’ presence and points of contact with unseen powers (Faraone 1992, Collins 2003). Stone and wooden figures could serve as surrogates for absent humans, as when mourners buried an effigy in place of an irrecoverable body (Herodotus Histories 6.58; Vernant 2006, 322; Bremmer 2013), or treated a grave marker as if it were the buried person (Euripides Alcestis 348–356; see Burkert 1985, 193–194). Whereas the mimetic relationship connects a visible likeness with its visible original, such objects though visible link to invisible referents.

Plato seems to distinguish between the pious old art and its modernized forms, as he distinguishes analogously among poems. Statues suggest communication with divinities (Laws 931a, Phaedrus 230b). Wax likenesses participate in the magic of effigies (Laws 933b). Metaphorically the dialogues imagine a body as a statue that invites comparison with its invisible referent the soul (Charmides 154c, 157d–158c; Symposium 215b, 216d–e), or as a sêma “tomb” but also “sign” of the soul within (Cratylus 400b–c, Gorgias 493a). Compared to such referential relations, the mimetic art object’s reference to what is visible can feel like a forcible misdirection of attention to appearances and to delight with visibility as such.

Beauty by comparison begins in the domain of intelligible objects, since there is a Form of beauty. And more than any other property for which a Form exists, beauty engages the soul and draws it toward philosophical deliberation, toward thoughts of absolute beauty and subsequently (as we imagine) toward thoughts of other concepts.

It has been noted that some appearances of mimêsis give it a role to play in philosophizing, as when recollecting the Forms or assimilating oneself to the divine nature. This constructive turn does not seem to be made available to the poems or paintings that imitate individual human beings. If one seeks something in poetry and the arts that would function oppositely to mimetic poetry and would serve philosophical enlightenment, inspiration might offer the most promising possibility.

A significant datum here comes from the Republic, which despite its stance against much poetry still draws from notable poems in its argument. The “noble lie” (414b–415d), by means of which Socrates proposes to teach future citizens the differences among them, reworks the Hesiodic “ages of humanity” from Works and Days (107–179). Hesiod must have understood something important about people that the Republic’s city will turn into its civic lesson (Van Noorden 2010). And Geoffrey Bakewell has shown how the appearances of verses from Aeschylus progress, as the Republic goes on, to form good advice to the city and its control over music. Seven against Thebes “deserves a place in Kallipolis” (Bakewell 2017, 274).

Where Hesiod is concerned one may multiply examples from the Symposium and Critias, but most of all from Plato’s Timaeus, that show the dialogues engaged with that great archaic poet as interlocutor and source (Boys-Stones and Haubold 2010). Plato could credit the wisdom in such poems to the inspiration that had fallen upon their authors.

Does such wisdom as good poetry contains necessarily come from the domain of Forms? The Phaedrus comes closest to saying so, both by associating the gods with Forms (247c–e), and by rooting inspired love in recollection (251a). But this falls short of showing that the poets’ divine madness likewise originates among objects of greater reality. It might, but does not have to.

It has been argued that because reason plays a role for Plato in predictive dreaming (see Timaeus 71e–72a), reason is therefore also at work in cognitive states that resemble the inspired condition of the soothsayer. Given such resemblance, the function of reason in predictive dreaming would imply a role for reason whenever inspiration comes (Büttner 2011). Yet the dialogues never speak of dreaming on a par with mantic prophecy. Socrates speaks twice of his own dreams in the dialogues and expects to find truth in them (Crito 44b, Phaedo 60e–61a), but does not equate his dreaming with a possessed condition.

The Ion says less about poetry’s divine origins than the Phaedrus does, certainly nothing that requires an interpreter to discover Forms within the Muse’s magnetism. Laws 682a and Meno 99c–d credit the inspired condition with the production of truths, even in poetry. Neither passage describes the truths about Forms that philosophical dialectic would lead to, but that might be asking too much. Let it suffice that inspiration originates in some truth.

What about the effects of inspired poetry? Could such poetry turn a soul toward knowledge as beautiful faces do? The Phaedrus does say that Muse-made poems teach future generations about the exploits of heroes. Inspired poetry at least might set a good example. But one can find good examples in verse without waiting for inspiration. Even Republic 3 allows for instances in which the young guardians imitate virtuous characters.

A clear opposition between imitation and inspiration, or any clear relationship between them, would suggest a coherent whole that can be titled “Plato’s aesthetics.” In the absence of such a relationship it is hard to attribute an aesthetic theory to Plato as one can straightforwardly do with Aristotle.

If unification is possible for the elements of Plato’s aesthetics, that may arrive from another direction. Religion has not been explored as much as it should in connection with Plato’s aesthetics, even though a religious orientation informs what he has to say about beauty, inspiration, and imitation. The quasi-divine status that beauty has in the Symposium; the Republic’s characterization of the imitator as enemy to Athena and other gods; and of course inspiration, which cannot be defined without appeal to divine action: All three subjects suggest that Plato’s aesthetics might come together more satisfactorily within Plato’s theology. The question is worth pursuing now, for scholarship of recent decades has advanced the study of Greek religion, providing the resources for a fresh inquiry into the fundamental terms out of which Plato constructs his aesthetics.


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Other Internet Resources

  • The Perseus Project, Tufts University; a collection of ancient writings on line. Plato’s works in both Greek in English with any number of linguistic and scholarly tools.
  • Maecenas: Images of Ancient Greece and Rome, was formerly hosted at SUNY/Buffalo, now available at the Internet Archive.
  • DMOZ Directory, meta-source no longer updated. It’s a guide to over 100 sites in ancient philosophy. These vary in richness but make many resources available, some of them appropriate for beginners and others for advanced scholars.
  • Plato and Aristotle on Tragedy, a fine outline of the issues that Plato and Aristotle address in speaking of tragedy; a greater focus on tragedy in particular than in the present entry.


Parts of section 1 were informed and guided by the work of Jonathan Fine. Parts of 2.3 and 2.5 are indebted to arguments made by Taylor Kloha (specifically, on what a full and true account of something requires and how the poet’s error lies not in imitating per se but in doing so without representing the full and true account). I am also grateful to Elvira Basevich, Daniel Mailick, and Andrea Tisano for their help with earlier versions of this entry. And special thanks go to Joshua Wilner for his comments and assistance.

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