Notes to Plato’s Middle Period Metaphysics and Epistemology

1. Finer discriminations are possible. There are, I suspect, transitional dialogues between these broad periods and probably between clusters of dialogues that might make up sub-groups within each period. Besides the placement of the Gorgias and Meno towards the end of the Socratic period, I am not really sure where the Cratylus should go, and I suspect the Phaedrus is best viewed as coming at the end of the critical period. On the dating see Brandwood 1992.

2. aitia is difficult to translate. The English ‘cause’ suggests efficient causation, some factor present in a situation that actually brings about a change. The Greek aitia has a wider sense, embracing cause, reason, explanation, and classification. To appreciate its range consider the different answers we might give to Why questions, e.g., Why did the window break? Because the brick hit it; because the boy threw the brick; because glass is brittle. See Vlastos 1969, Stough 1976, and Bostock 1986.

3. However, there is evidence of a third kind of entity, the forms-in-us or form-copies, e.g., the-beautiful-in-Helen or the large-in-Socrates. Form-copies are individual property-instances, similar to the tropes or abstract particulars of contemporary metaphysicians. See §8.

4. There is logical space for an account that allows only one thing to be predicated of a Form, namely its essence. See McCabe 1994, Chapter Three.

5. This will have to be qualified later when Plato develops the notion of the Interweaving of Forms (Sophist 254bff) and can distinguish self-predication statements from self-characterization statements, i.e., a claim to the effect that certain Forms are characterized by the very property each is. Beauty may well turn out to be among the few Forms that are subject to self-characterization, if Plato believes that all Forms, just because they are Forms, are beautiful.

6. Recall Parmenides. See Nehamas 1999c, Vlastos 1981c, Silverman 1990a, and Code 1986.

7. It seems to me that Plato considers the characterizing relation as the parsing of the claims of an ordinary speaker. I think that he treats it is as prior in the order of discovery, in the sense that initially it seems not to call for explanation. Conversely, I think that the non-characterizing relation does require that he explain what sort of predication is envisaged in the claim that Beauty Is beautiful.

8. From the Symposium one can infer that each Form is beautiful. More controversial is the Phaedo's discussion of the clever aitia 102a-107a. If Snow, Fire and Threeness are Forms, then it is not unlikely that each stands in some predication relation to Cold, Hot and Odd, respectively.

9. ‘Justice is just’ is short for ‘Justice is what it is to be just’. Cf. Nehamas 1999b and 1999c.

10. This is not to say that each essence is predicable of only the Form of which it is the essence. We shall see that there are form-copies, which arguably have the essence, predicated of them. Moreover, if the Form and its essence are identical, then if the Form is predicated of the particular, it will follow that the essence is too.

11.This is one of the reasons McCabe, Individuals, thinks that austerity and complexity are the fundamental differentiae in Plato's metaphysics.

12. Perhaps something could be material (somatic) and not subject to change, and perhaps something could be material and simple. But in these dialogues Plato associates the bodily with the complex and everywhere he assumes that the bodily is not static. It is remarkable, I think, that Plato nowhere confronts the Atomists.

13. Phaedo 65d11, Meno 75c7ff. On the later theory of aisthesis see Burnyeat 1976, and Silverman 1990.

14. If, in fact, compresence is merely apparent, or if there are compresent properties that rely on subjective or relative judgments (non-perceptual judgments) of cognitive agents, then perhaps one could argue that those qualifications would not be a function of the spatio-temporal character of particulars.

15. There are other answers. In all likelihood, the order of events in its natural history also answers the question. I think that by the time of the Philebus and Timaeus, Plato is ready to offer an account embracing more answers to such questions about particulars.

16. I think that a similar account can be given for the moral properties in terms of the idiosyncratic characteristics of the different just individuals.

17. See Nehamas 1999b, 1999c, and Code 1986. On the type-distinction see especially Kung 1981 and Patterson 1985.

18. See Fine 1986, Devereaux 1994 and Silverman 2002. Contemporary concerns with tropes or thick versus thin particulars are other examples of the same worry.

19. Devereaux 1994, a proponent of form-copies, thinks that they must perish, for this is what distinguishes them from Forms.

20. Or universals, matter and soul. What is needed is an account of matter. Plato never satisfactorily explains how the body and soul are united.

21. With the development in the Timaeus of an account of particulars, these matters will have to be reassessed.

22. Sometimes it is said that the Forms are meanings of terms, based perhaps on the Republic's claim (596a) that there is a Form corresponding to every name (common, not proper) in the language. It is arguable that Plato was not given to this semantic one-over-many reasoning, allowing us to interpret him instead to be claiming that there are names or concepts only where there are real kinds.

23. A detailed presentation of this position would have to specify the relation between the complete properties for which there are no Forms, the manner in which particulars have these properties, and the incomplete properties for which there are Forms, and the manner in which these Forms are the way they are. For instance, do the remarks about the Form of the Good being responsible for the knowability of Forms extend only to the Forms of Incomplete Properties, or does the Good somehow condition one's knowledge of the complete properties and facts about the external world? The emphasis of the metaphors suggests that knowledge of the Good is a prerequisite for all other knowledge.

24. If one takes the middle-period Plato to be committed to this strong version of a faculty psychology, then it is tempting to view the first part of the Theaetetus, especially the concluding argument at 184-86, as a revision of his earlier epistemology. Famously Socrates there distinguishes what we do with the senses from what we do through the senses. He concludes that there is one source, namely the thinking soul, which is the single repository of what is delivered through the senses, with the implication that it is a single rational capacity that perceives, believes and knows. See Burnyeat 1976, White 1992, and Silverman 1990.

Copyright © 2014 by
Allan Silverman <>

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