Plato on utopia

First published Thu Dec 5, 2002; substantive revision Wed Dec 2, 2020

The Laws is one of Plato’s last dialogues. In it, he sketches the basic political structure and laws of an ideal city named Magnesia. Despite the fact that the Laws treats a number of basic issues in political and ethical philosophy as well as theology, it has suffered neglect compared with the Republic. In recent years, however, more scholarly attention has been paid to the Laws. This entry discusses some of the most important issues arising in recent scholarship and suggests avenues for future research.

1. Authenticity and Chronology

In the more exuberantly speculative days of the 19th century, the authenticity of the Laws was rejected by various figures: even the great Platonist, Ast, held that “One who knows the true Plato needs only to read a single page of the Laws in order to convince himself that it is a fraudulent Plato that he has before him.”[1] Such skepticism is hard to understand, especially since Aristotle refers to the Laws as a dialogue of Plato’s in numerous passages and today no serious scholar doubts its authenticity.

On the question of chronology, two external references are helpful:

  1. Aristotle tells us that the Laws is later than the Republic, (Pol. 2.6) and
  2. Diogenes Laertius (3.37) reports that it was unfinished at Plato’s death (and the text of the Laws itself shows some signs of incompleteness and lack of revision).[2]

Platonic scholars also frequently appeal to stylometry (that is, the quantitative study of the features of Plato’s prose style) to help to date the dialogues. Although the usefulness of stylometry is sometimes questioned, it is widely accepted and the agreement of many such studies allows us to divide the dialogues, with some confidence, into three groups.[3]

Group 3: Critias, Laws, Philebus, Sophist, Statesman, and Timaeus

Group 2: Parmenides, Phaedrus, Republic, and Theaetetus

Group 1: the rest

Drawing upon other evidence, it is reasonable to see the dialogues in Group 3 as the latest. Given the length of the Laws (it is the longest of the dialogues and is, roughly 20% longer than the Republic), it seems likely that its composition overlapped with the composition of at least some of the other dialogues in Group 3.

2. Overview

The Laws comprises a conversation in 12 books, set on Crete, among three interlocutors: an unnamed Athenian Visitor (Plato’s spokesman in the Laws), Megillus, a Spartan, and Kleinias, a Cretan. The Athenian proposes that the three discuss governance and laws as they walk along the long road to the temple of Zeus. The first two books of the dialogue consider the proper goal or end (telos) of legislation, which turns out to be the virtue of the citizens. They also contain discussion of topics, such as ethical psychology and education, which will help them to understand how a city could achieve this goal. The third book turns to a discussion of the origins of political systems (politeia) and of changes in those political systems, and attempts to draw lessons for the lawmaker from the histories of various actual states, including Persia, Sparta, Crete, and Athens. At the end of Book 3 (Laws 702B4–D5), Kleinias reveals that he has a practical use for just the kinds of discussions they’ve been having: the cities of Crete have decided to found a new city, to be named Magnesia, in a long abandoned part of Crete, and he, along with nine others, is to be responsible for doing so. He asks the Athenian to help in the construction of the new city’s constitution and laws. The Athenian agrees, and proposes that they use a new method of law-giving – one in which preludes which aim at persuading the citizens come before the laws themselves. Books 4–5 contain an argument for the use of preludes and the Great Prelude to the laws in general. The Great Prelude to the laws in general ends in the latter part of Book 5, after which the Athenian proceeds to sketch, often in considerable detail, the constitution, the political and social institutions, and the laws of this new city, along with the political and ethical principles that justify them.

A brief sketch of the content and structure of the first 5 books of the Laws follows. From that point on (after the end of the Great Prelude), we will organize our discussion topically rather than going book by book.

Book 1

The dialogue begins with an investigation into the reasons for the laws and social practices of Sparta and Crete. The Athenian argues that laws ought to be justified not by reference to war – which is how both Megillus and Kleinias first attempt to justify the laws of their own cities – but rather by reference to what is best, which is complete virtue (that is, courage, justice, moderation, and wisdom, rather than courage alone). In fact, the Athenian says that the complete virtue of the citizens as a whole should be the single goal of the lawgiver (Laws 630C3–6; see also e.g., 705D3–706A4, 963A).[4] The Athenian also tells us that laws are true laws insofar as they promote the happiness (eudaimonia) of the citizens (Laws 631B; see also 715B, 743C–D). Immediately after he first makes this latter claim, he draws a distinction between human and divine goods and tells us that the human goods – like wealth and health – are dependent upon the divine goods, of which wisdom is first, then moderation, then justice, and finally courage; he later describes this dependency by saying that the human goods are good for someone who is virtuous but bad for bad men (Laws 661B–C). The dependency thesis helps Plato bring together the two characterizations of the goal of the laws in terms of the citizens’ virtue and happiness, respectively: if virtue is necessary for benefit and thus for happiness, promoting the happiness of the citizens will require making them virtuous. This dependency thesis, as well as the dual characterization of the goal of the laws, raises but leaves unanswered questions about the precise relation between virtue and happiness, however: for example, is virtue actually sufficient for happiness, or is it simply necessary?[5]

The remainder of Book 1 is concerned with ethical psychology and education: that is, with beginning the project of showing how a city could produce citizens who possess complete virtue. This discussion heavily emphasizes the importance of feeling pleasure and pain correctly; the Athenian, in fact, claims that “[For] human beings who inquire into laws almost their entire inquiry concerns pleasures and pains, in cities and in private dispositions. These two springs flow forth by nature, and he who draws from the right one, at the right time, and in the right amount is happy.” (Laws 636D5–E1). This phase of the discussion begins with the Athenian announcing his intention to discuss the institutions which promote courage, which he swiftly notes should cover the ability to resist pleasure in addition to the ability to resist pain. He proposes controlled symposia (drinking parties) as the institution which will train this ability to resist pleasure, to the surprise of his interlocutors. As this sort of training will serve as an important part of ethical education, this suggestion leads the Athenian to discuss education in general. Education involves the direction of a child’s pleasures, desires, and love towards his adult occupation; in the case of the citizens, education must draw their souls to a desire and love of being a perfect citizen who rules and is ruled in accordance with justice (Laws 643C–D). Pleasure is clearly central to the account of ethical psychology and education in the Laws, and one important question to ask of the Laws is why this is so. Is coming to have the correct pleasures simply of instrumental value (insofar as it blocks one route to akratic action and vice or focuses the child on the things which he must come to find valuable), or are at least some of these pleasures good in their own right, e.g. in virtue of their contents?[6]

The discussion of Book 1 closes with a model of the soul which, the Athenian says, will make it clearer what virtue and vice are, and will help us to understand what effects various sorts of educational practices, such as the symposia, should be expected to have on the human soul (Laws 645C).[7] The model is one of a puppet (thauma)[8] made by the gods, possessing three cords, two, hard and iron, representing the expectations of pleasure and pain, and one, soft and gold, representing reason or calculation (Laws 644D). This model differs in noteworthy ways from the image of the soul as composed of a human, a lion, and a hydra-headed beast in the Republic and the charioteer and two horses of the Phaedrus.[9] The three elements in the puppet image are affections rather than possessors of affections; and the most important division here is between the two iron cords and the golden cord, with no fundamental difference (of the sort that we see when spirit is called reason’s natural ally in the Republic) between the two iron cords. How to explain the differences in the model of the soul that we get here from the ones we get in other dialogues is another important question for interpreters of the Laws.[10]

Book 2

Book 2 begins by returning to the definition of education; the Athenian here tells us that education consists in training a child to feel pleasure and pain, and to love and hate, correctly, before he can understand the reason why (Laws 653B–C). Education in music and gymnastics is particularly crucial for the project of ethical education. The Athenian tells us that young children naturally desire to move and to make noise, and are naturally capable of taking pleasure in order in movement and sound (Laws 653D–654A); one explanation for the centrality of music and gymnastics in the educational program, then, could appeal to the role of music and gymnastics in training this capacity to perceive and take pleasure in order.[11] Book 2 focuses primarily on musical education and the standard of correctness in music; Book 7 returns to the topic of education in gymnastics, and lays out the rest of the educational program. These topics will be discussed further in section 7 of this article (Poetry and Education).

Part of the discussion of poetry in Book 2 deals with its content. The Athenian praises the Spartans and the Cretans for compelling poets to teach that the good man is happy and for giving no attention to the bad man; he also asserts that the poet ought also to teach that human goods are dependent upon virtue and that the most pleasant life, the most just life, and the happiest (most eudaimôn) life coincide (Laws 662C–E). This latter doctrine has great significance given that, as the Athenian says next, no man will voluntarily do anything unless it involves more pleasure than pain; this passage has also been thought to provide evidence that Plato remains a rational eudaimonist in the Laws.[12] The Athenian tells us that the views that the poet is to be compelled to espouse are both most true and most useful for persuading the citizens to live virtuously (Laws 664C).

Book 3

Book 3 abruptly moves to a discussion of the origin of government, beginning from the disorganized condition in which human beings would have been left after one of the great catastrophes which the Athenian takes to have destroyed human society over and over again. After describing how cities would have first come about out of this disorder, the Athenian turns to the discussion of the histories of actual states. He first focuses on the histories of Sparta, Argos, and Messene, with particular attention to the features of the Spartan constitution which saved it from the corruption which afflicted its neighbors. This discussion highlights the destructive power of ignorance about what is to be valued (Laws 688C) and the danger of entrusting too much power to a single, corruptible, individual (Laws 691C–D). The Athenian then turns to a discussion of Persia and Athens. The Athenian begins this discussion by reminding us that a lawgiver ought to aim at his city’s being free, wise, and a friend to itself (Laws 693B). He then claims that there are two forms of constitution from which the rest are derived, monarchy and democracy, and attempts to show the virtues of the moderate forms, and the vices of the extreme forms, of each constitution by considering Persia’s development from a moderate to an extreme monarchy and Athens’s development from a moderate to an extreme democracy. The moral of this discussion is that only a mixture of monarchy and democracy can allow a state to be both wise and free (Laws 693E) – a state which is strikingly characterized in the case of the earlier, more moderate form of Athenian democracy, as voluntary slavery to the laws (Laws 700A).[13] After this discussion has been completed, Kleinias announces that the discussion has had a practical point: he, along with nine others, is to craft laws for a new Cretan colony. He asks for the help of the Athenian and Megillus in building up the laws and institutions of this new state, which is the project of the rest of the Laws.

Book 4

Book 4 opens with a discussion of the way in which the geographical location and features of the proposed city of Magnesia affect the ease or difficulty of creating a virtuous city. It then turns to consider the method of settlement of the proposed city, and the practical challenges of forming a group of settlers (whether they be from one or many states) into a genuinely new society. Here, the Athenian suggests that the easiest way to form new and good institutions in a society is for it to be blessed with a good tyrant who wishes to create institutions conducing to virtue. The Athenian moves on to ask what type of polity they ought to form; he answers by saying that the best ruler a city can have is god, and that they ought to imitate the rule of god by ordering their city in obedience to reason, the immortal element within themselves. These regulations set down by reason are to be called law (Laws 714A).[14]

The Athenian then imagines their address to the new settlers. He begins by emphasizing the power of god over human affairs and suggests that each man ought therefore to become dear to god. The way to do this, he says, is to come to be like god, i.e. to become virtuous (Laws 716A–E). After discussing the worship of the gods and the veneration of parents, the Athenian pauses to reflect on the way in which the laws that he is beginning to describe are to make the city happy (Laws 718B). He distinguishes between two methods of law-giving, one appropriate to free men and another to slaves, illustrating this by means of a distinction between a slave doctor who simply prescribes what he thinks to be right to each of his patients, and a free doctor who investigates the ailment with his patient and instructs him as to the nature of his disease as much as possible, prescribing a treatment only with the patient’s consent (Laws 720A–720E). The analogous method in the case of law-giving, the Athenian tells us, is to offer preludes to the laws that aim at persuasion, and it is this method that he proposes to follow in establishing the laws of Magnesia, condemning the alternative as the employment of mere force (Laws 722B–C). After illustrating this ‘double method’ in the case of marriage laws, the three decide to proceed systematically for the rest of the dialogue, giving first the preludes and then the laws. Issues connected with the preludes will be discussed in greater detail in section 5 (Preludes in the Laws).

Book 5

Book 5 continues the Great Prelude to the laws in general which started with the discussion of gods and ancestors in Book 4. The Athenian begins this next phase of the address by telling the citizens that they ought to honor their souls above all their other possessions, as their souls are both most their own and the most divine of all their possessions. To honor one’s soul, he tells them, is to follow virtue and, in general, good things, rather than to allow it to satisfy any desires and to enjoy any pleasures it might want; and, at the end of the discussion, this ability of the soul to follow the good is identified as that which explains why the soul is to be so highly honored. Next on the list comes the body, which ought to be honored by being put in a moderate state, as that is what best supports the good state of the soul; third are money and property, which also ought to be held in moderation, for the same reason. After a very brief discussion of relations with friends and strangers, the Athenian turns to the character of the person who leads the finest or most noble (kallista) life. There, he describes various praiseworthy or blameworthy traits of character, before giving a general warning to all citizens to avoid excessive self-love as “the greatest of all evils” and “the cause of all of each man’s wrongdoings on every occasion” (Laws 731D6–E5). Instead, he encourages each citizen to love not himself or his own possessions but rather what is just, whether it belongs to himself or to someone else. This claim will be discussed further in section 9 (Ethics).

The prelude then moves from the “divine things” with which it has been occupied to the “human things”, chief among them pleasure and pain, explaining that “to these every mortal animal is, as it were, inextricably attached and bound in the most serious ways” (Laws 732E5–7). The Athenian then sets out the types of pleasures and pains which characterizes moderate and immoderate lives, with the aim of arguing that those which characterize the moderate life should be preferred and thus that the life of virtue is the most pleasant life. This ends the Great Prelude to the laws in general, and the Athenian announces that they must now sketch the organization of the state (Laws 734E). The rest of Book 5 is concerned primarily with the citizens’ properties – the number of households there shall be, the degree of variance in wealth that the citizens shall be allowed to attain, and the way that the citizens should engage with money – and with justifying those precepts with reference to the citizens’ happiness. The rest of the Laws continues to describe and to justify the organization and the laws of this new city.

3. The Laws’ Relation to the Republic

As we’ve seen, the Laws undertakes to create a good city and to discuss political theory, ethics, psychology, and other topics relevant to the creation of such a city. This makes it very natural to ask what the relation between the Laws and the Republic is. The predominant view, until fairly recently, holds that the Republic is Plato’s statement of what the ideally best city is; the Laws, on the other hand, describes the city that would be best, given less optimistic assumptions about what human nature is capable of. This position has two variants, depending on one’s view of whether Plato at the time of the Republic thought that its political program was compatible with human nature. If one thinks that even at the time of the Republic, Plato thought that its ideal city placed too great demands on its citizens to be psychologically realizable, then one can hold that the Laws is entirely consistent with the Republic: they could, at least as far as their philosophical positions are concerned, have been written at the same time.[15] If, on the other hand, one thinks that Plato held that the city of the Republic was psychologically possible, even if difficult to realize, it is natural to see the Laws as the outcome of a change in Plato’s views about human nature.[16] The first view faces two challenges:

  1. providing evidence from the Republic that Plato did not think its ideal city was realizable, and
  2. either explaining why the Republic does not at least gesture in the direction of the arrangements of the Laws as the best humanly possible option or arguing that we can find such evidence.

The second view should explain why Plato becomes more pessimistic about human nature. The need for such an explanation is especially pressing, since the most common attempt to do so by appealing to Plato’s experiences in Sicily is philosophically quite unsatisfactory.[17]

In recent years, it has been argued that there are deep and pervasive differences between the Republic and the Laws (and more generally between the dialogues of Group 3 and those of Group 2) on ethical and political questions.[18] The debate over these claims is just in its initial stages and no scholarly consensus has yet emerged. Among other topics relevant to the interpretation of the Laws, this entry sketches a few important topics of contemporary controversy and then points to lines of future research. To begin, perhaps the most important passage in the Laws directly bearing on its relation to the Republic comes in Book 5. There, in what is nowadays perhaps the most famous passage in the Laws, the Athenian announces that they are to engage in the construction of a “second-best” city.

Anyone who uses reason and experience will recognize that a second-best city [deuterôs … pros to beltiston] is to be constructed … That city and that constitution are first, and the laws are best, where the old proverb holds as much as possible throughout the whole city: it is said that the things of friends really are in common. (Laws 739A3–740C3)

The traditional assumption is that Plato here endorses the city sketched in the Republic as the best possible city, but now thinks that the demands it places on its inhabitants are too high: the city in the Laws is the second-best, but is the best that is likely to be compatible with human nature. It is also sometimes thought to follow from this that Plato still endorses the basic elements of the Republic’s political and ethical theory.

But such an interpretation misreads the passage. Even if Plato were to endorse the political arrangements of the Republic as the best possible ones, it would not follow that he also endorses all the claims concerning political theory made in the Republic, much less that he endorses all of the Republic’s claims in ethics, psychology and epistemology. The political arrangements of the Republic are entailed by, and are consistent with, many different sets of premises, some of which are mutually inconsistent. Nor does the present passage endorse all of the political structures of the Republic, rather it endorses the community of property, women and children and the goal of making the city as unified as possible. But what is most important is that this passage does not in fact endorse the Republic’s method for making the city one by introducing a certain kind of community of property and families. In the Republic, these institutions are restricted to the first two classes, but are rejected for the third class, the producers. The Laws passage presents as the “first-best” city, not that of the Republic, but one in which there is, throughout the entire city, a community of property and of women and children. So the claim that the city sketched in the Laws is second-best does not suggest that the Republic still represents Plato’s ideal political arrangement.[19] What the Laws represents as the ideal – that is to be approximated as closely as possible – is a city in which all citizens are subject to the same extremely high ethical demands.

4. The Social and Political Institutions of Magnesia

This section provides a brief overview of the basic social and political institutions of Magnesia. Magnesia will be located in a part of Crete that has been left empty by an ancient migration and is about ten miles from the sea. The site is basically self-sufficient in resources without having much excess to export. Plato sees this unsuitability for active commerce and distance from the sea as advantages: they discourage the maritime and commercial activities that corrupt cities by fostering a love of money-making in the citizens and by allowing close contact with foreigners who bring innovation and have not received the good ethical education afforded to Magnesians.

The city will be relatively populous: its number of households is to remain permanently at 5,040.[20] Immigration and emigration policies are designed to avoid population excess and deficiency. Each household will have an allotment consisting of two plots of land: one nearer the city’s center and one nearer its borders. Each household’s allotment is intended to be equally productive (Laws 737CE, 745CD) and to support a comfortable, although not luxurious, life for the household’s members. The households and land are not owned or farmed in common, but each shareholder must consider his share to be at the same time the common property of the whole city (Laws 740A3–6). Part of the sense in which the lot is in common is that it is inalienable and cannot be divided or aggregated: the assignment of the lot to a household is intended to support the household throughout the generations. (There are also restrictions on the use of the land.[21] ) Further, each household will help, out of its own resources, to fund Magnesia’s system of common meals.[22] Plato establishes four property classes: the members of the top or first class have assets worth between three and four times the value of the lot (and the tools and animals needed to farm it), the second class between two and three times this value and so on.[23] Anything accumulated over the highest amount will be confiscated by the city (Laws 744D–745A). Such assets do not include gold and silver, since these may be possessed only by the city; there will be only a token currency (Laws 742AB).[24]

Many of Magnesia’s inhabitants are not citizens. There is a considerable slave population (including both public and private slaves) and they, of course, are not citizens. Also found within the city are transient foreigners and resident foreigners (metics) who may stay for twenty years. Slaves and foreigners are an economic necessity for the city for they will carry on the trading, manufacturing and menial occupations that are barred to citizens. The lot holders or heads of households are citizens, but citizenship is not restricted to them and owning land is not a necessary condition of citizenship. The sons and heirs of lot holders are called “citizens” and are liable to military service at age 20, can participate in elections at that age and can serve in office at 30.[25] They will not inherit the household lot, however, until their father dies. What of women? In Magnesia, the private family is not abolished. Although women lack an independent right to own property, they are liable to military training and service and attend their own common meals (Laws 780D). The Athenian holds that they can attain the four cardinal virtues and for this reason requires that they be educated (Laws 804D–805A). For Aristotle, women are not citizens of the ideal city, since they are excluded from political office. But in Magnesia, women can participate in elections and hold political office and the Athenian explicitly counts them as citizens (Laws 814C2–4).[26]

Let us turn to the political system or constitution (politeia) of Magnesia. Magnesia has a rich variety of offices, but the main ones are: the Assembly (koinos sullogos, ekklêsia), the Council (boulê), the magistrates, especially the guardians of the laws (nomophulakes), the courts and the Nocturnal Council (nukterinos sullogos). The Nocturnal Council is discussed in more detail below in section 6.

The Assembly is the main electoral authority in the city; it is composed of all citizens, or more precisely, all those who have served or are serving in the military. The Assembly is responsible for the election of most of the city’s officers and magistrates. The other functions explicitly given to it are

  1. a role in judging offenses against the public,
  2. making awards of merit,
  3. extending the term of residence for metics, and
  4. passing on proposed changes in the laws, at least those regarding dances and sacrifices.

It may also have other responsibilities in connection with foreign affairs.[27]

The Council is composed of 90 members chosen by election from each property class for a total of 360 members. Men are eligible for office at age 30, women at age 40. Members serve one-year terms. The Council exercises ordinary administrative powers, such as calling and dissolving the Assembly, receiving foreign ambassadors, supervising elections and so on.

The guardians of the laws (nomophulakes) are composed of 37 citizens, at least fifty years of age who serve from the time of their election until age 70 (Laws 755A). There are four ways in which the nomophulakes guard the laws:[28]

  1. Although they do not seem to have the authority to discipline other magistrates, they are assigned the general task of supervising them and are expected to bring appropriate cases to the attention of the proper officials.
  2. They exercise wide supervisory powers over citizens in general and, for example, are charged with fining those who spend excessively, granting permission to travel abroad and overseeing the care of orphans.
  3. They possess various judicial functions and are in charge of especially important or difficult cases involving the family, property and the abuse of laws.
  4. Perhaps their most important task is the revision and supplementation of the existing laws, although the extent of revision possible is controversial.[29]

Finally, there is an extensive system of courts in Magnesia, both public and private. One of Plato’s major innovations, compared with Athenian law, is the elaborate structure of appeals in judicial cases. It is worth noting that Plato holds that citizens, in virtue of their standing in the political community, may legitimately expect to have a share in the administration of justice (Laws 767E9–768B3).

5. Preludes in the Laws

A significant part of the impetus for interpretations that see considerable differences between the Republic and the Laws comes from the presence in the latter of “preludes” to individual laws and to the lawcode as a whole that are available to all the citizens. In Plato’s own view, one of the most important innovations in the political theory of the Laws is the requirement that good lawgivers try to persuade the citizens and not simply issue commands to them by means of laws (Laws 722B5–C2). Plato compares the lawgiver in Magnesia to a free doctor treating free people. Slave doctors who treat other slaves merely give them orders and then rush off to other patients. Free doctors treating free people must explain to their patients the condition they have and the rationale for treatment before prescribing (Laws 722B–723B). In doing so, they will “educate” the patients and use “arguments that come close to philosophizing” (Laws 857C2–E5). Similarly, Plato thinks that the lawgiver in Magnesia should not merely issue legal commands: law without persuasion is condemned as mere force (722B). Drawing on Plato’s programmatic remarks in Books 4, 9, and 10 the preludes should have the following features.

  1. What the person who is to be persuaded is asking for is to be “educated” or “taught,” that is, to be given good epistemic reasons for thinking that the principles lying behind the legislation are true (Laws 885DE).
  2. What the lawgiver and the preludes actually do is characterized as “teaching,” that is, giving reasons to the citizens and bringing it about that they “learn” (Laws 718CD, 720D, 723A, 857DE and 888A).
  3. The preludes are thus designed to be instances of rational persuasion, that is, attempts to influence the citizens’ beliefs by appealing to rational considerations. They are not intended to inculcate false, but useful beliefs, or to effect persuasion through non-rational means.
  4. The preludes are meant to provide quite general ethical instruction. The lawgiver is to be a primary source of instruction about what is fine, just and good. Thus the citizens will learn why the laws are fine and just and should also learn why following the laws and, more generally, acting virtuously is good for them. They are to receive a true and reasoned account of what is good for human beings.

The view that this use of preludes marks a significant difference from the Republic depends on two claims.

  1. The Laws advocates the use of preludes, along with other methods, to educate the citizens and give them some rational understanding of the laws and, more generally, an understanding of ethical truths.
  2. The Republic does not intend to provide, except to its highest class, the philosopher-rulers, an education that can result in such a rational appreciation of basic ethical truths.

With respect to (II), advocates of the change interpretation point to passages from the Republic such as the following.

Therefore, to insure that someone like that [one whose reason is not strong enough to rule himself] is ruled by something similar to what rules the best person, we say that he ought to be the slave [doulon] of that best person who has a divine ruler within himself. (Rep. 590C8–D1)

The education provided to the two lower classes, it is argued, thus does not succeed in enabling them to be ruled by their own reason and leaves them in the state of slaves. In Republic Book 7, Plato considers whether the musical education the auxiliaries receive (which is the most advanced education that they get) tends to the good of leading the soul out of the Cave and toward the “intelligible” or “knowable region.” The answer is that it does not, since musical education

educated the guardians through habits. Its harmonies gave them a certain harmoniousness, not knowledge; its rhythms gave them a certain rhythmical quality; and its stories whether fictional or nearer the truth, cultivated other habits akin to these. But there was nothing in it that aimed at any such subject as you are now seeking. (Rep. 522A4–B1, cf. 484C3–D10 and 516E8–517E2)

Thus all citizens, other than the philosopher-rulers, remain within the Cave.

Both (I) and (II) are, however, quite controversial. With respect to (I), some have argued that despite the fact that Plato’s programmatic remarks about the preludes suggest that they are designed to further a rational appreciation of ethical truths, what is actually provided for the vast majority of the citizens is, primarily, rhetorical persuasion appealing to their sense of honor and shame. This gap is then explained either by the hypothesis (i) that Plato is being deceptive, or his mental capacities declined in old age; or (ii) that the programmatic remarks represent an ideal that Plato makes it clear cannot be realized in actual practice.[30] Evaluating the acceptability of (II) will require careful examination of the education provided to the Republic’s auxiliary and money-making classes and, in particular, consideration of what the auxiliaries’ “musical education” provides them with.[31]

Interpretations that see the main aim of the preludes as providing, along with the rest of the citizens’ education, a rational, although less than fully philosophic, grasp of basic ethical principles need not hold that this is the only aim of the preludes or that there is only one kind of prelude. Plato does include some preludes – e.g. those to laws pertaining to murders that are especially heinous in that they are fully voluntary and committed out of desire for pleasure, envy and so on – that work primarily by rhetorical means or appeal to myths that Plato probably did not accept as literally true (e.g. 870D–871A). Such preludes are designed, as Saunders notes, for those citizens who have badly failed to benefit from Magnesia’s educational system (Saunders 1992, 210–11). Such preludes are a last resort before the infliction of punishment and are aimed at the inevitable failures among the citizens. Interpretations stressing the rational aim of the preludes argue that Magnesia’s education is intended to give the citizens as a whole the ability to follow the more sophisticated preludes and that such preludes are not restricted to an elite sub-class of citizens.

Further progress in resolving these disputes might be made by continued research on three topics. First, we must consider the preludes in light of the broader context of the citizens’ education in the Laws. What sort of education is provided for them and what cognitive and ethical abilities will such education foster? Second, we need to examine Plato’s views about education in the other late dialogues, especially the Statesman.[32] Finally, the issues concerning citizens’ education are intimately linked to deep questions in Plato’s psychology and epistemology. In order to understand what kind of education is required in order to have a rational grasp of ethical principles we must consider the nature of ethical learning, given Plato’s epistemology and psychology, in both the middle and late periods. This issue is discussed a bit further in section 10.

6. The Nocturnal Council and Political Participation

A second, more longstanding, controversy about the Laws concerns the role of the body known as the “Nocturnal Council” which is so-called because it meets daily from dawn until sunrise when everyone has the most leisure from public and private activities (Laws 961B6–8).[33] The Nocturnal Council is first explicitly mentioned in Book 10 (but is alluded to earlier at Laws 632C4–6 and 818A1–3) where it is assigned an educational function. Those who have violated Magnesia’s impiety laws due to ignorance, rather than bad character, are to be imprisoned for five years. During their imprisonment, the members of the Nocturnal Council meet with them in order to reform their beliefs by teaching (Laws 909A). The Nocturnal Council’s membership seems to include:

  1. the 10 oldest guardians of the laws,
  2. the current supervisor of education and his predecessors,
  3. examiners (officials who check the qualifications of those entering office and audit them when they leave office) and other citizens who have won awards of honor,
  4. certain citizens who have traveled abroad under official auspices to gather knowledge and have been invited to participate by the Nocturnal Council itself, and
  5. each of the above members is to nominate for membership (whose acceptance is subject to the approval of the other members) a younger associate between the ages of 30 and 40 (Laws 951D4–E5 and 961A1–B6).

In Book 12, the Athenian returns to the Nocturnal Council and emphasizes its great importance for the city. The following passage from Book 12 has encouraged some to think that Plato here grants the Nocturnal Council very great, or even unlimited, political power.

If this divine council should come into being for us, dear friends, the city ought to be handed over to it [paradoteon toutôi tên polin] (Laws 969B2–3, cf. 960B5–E11 and 961C3–6)

Some scholars have held, on the basis of these passages, that Plato intends the Nocturnal Council to be the main political authority in Magnesia. On this view, either it will have the same powers as did the philosopher kings in the Republic to change laws and institutions as it sees fit or the extent of its powers will simply be left to the Nocturnal Council itself to determine.[34] Such an interpretation has, however, quite high costs. As its main contemporary proponent concedes, it requires us to see the Laws as inconsistent: the earlier provisions of political authority to various offices are incompatible with assigning such unlimited powers to the Nocturnal Council.[35] Further, such a grant of power is at least in serious tension with one of the Laws’ basic political principles. Repeatedly in the Laws, Plato emphasizes that allowing any magistrate or political body unchecked authority runs too great a risk of the abuse of power. Such a risk is still too great even if the possessors of power have genuine knowledge: even those with full knowledge are subject to corruption in such circumstances.[36]

Other interpreters, such as Glenn Morrow, have suggested that the Nocturnal Council’s role is primarily informal.[37] This Council is to possess various sorts of knowledge and it must also educate its own members. Even without possessing powers beyond those explicitly assigned to it, the Nocturnal Council should exercise a considerable influence on Magnesia’s governance. Its members include some of the city’s most important officials. Plato would certainly expect that these officials’ administration of the laws and revision of them – if this is permitted – will be informed by their studies. Perhaps even more important, the younger associate members of the Nocturnal Council will come to fill many offices of the state and will exercise an informal, but still significant, influence on other citizens in the deliberations that play such an important role in Magnesia’s system of government, as well as in their other contacts with their fellows.

There is, however, a third option. Morrow adopts his “informal” interpretation in part because Plato does not explicitly assign to the Nocturnal Council any powers beyond those we have noted. But one could hold that the Laws is not intended to provide a fully determinate blueprint of the just city.[38] On this interpretation, there is an open texture to the political and social institutions that Plato sketches and we should allow for a range of ways of implementing the basic structure. For example, Plato appears to assign to the “guardians of the laws” (the nomophulakes) some important role in revising Magnesia’s laws. In his Book 12 discussion, Plato describes the members of the Nocturnal Council as “those who will really be guardians of the laws” (Laws 966B5). The members of the Nocturnal Council will, if properly educated, be “made into guardians whose like, with respect to the virtue of safekeeping, we have not seen come into being in our lives previously” (Laws 969C2–3). We need not see these claims as a volte-face on Plato’s part, if we allow for a range of ways in which the outline of Magnesia sketched can be realized that fall between excluding the Nocturnal Council from any political role at all and seeing them as philosopher kings in disguise. We can thus allow that the Nocturnal Council is intended to have genuine political authority going beyond its explicitly stated responsibilities that still falls well short of autocratic power, without expecting the Laws’ text to make this authority fully determinate.

But in addition to the specific issue of the extent of the Nocturnal Council’s powers, there is a deeper question. The more political authority that is assigned to the Nocturnal Council, the more politically passive most citizens of Magnesia will be. Thus the question about the power of the Nocturnal Council has significant implications for our evaluation of the ethical capacities of non-philosophical citizens. If their education really does give them some rational appreciation of the principles underlying the laws of Magnesia, we should expect that they can, to a significant degree, be free from detailed regulation and supervision by others. Further, not only is it the case that they will be capable of being free from such regulation, but we should expect that deliberating and acting upon their grasp of ethical principles forms an important part of their own good.[39] If, however, their political activity is reduced to the level of the two lower classes in the Republic, who have little or no part in political deliberation or judicial administration, we might think that Plato has the same fairly low estimate of the ethical capacities of ordinary citizens in both works. Resolving the issue of the Nocturnal Council’s powers thus has broad implications for our understanding of Plato’s later ethics.

7. Poetry and Education

The goal of the city of the Laws, as we’ve seen, is to produce citizens who possess complete virtue (Laws 630C3–6; see also e.g. 705D3–706A4, 963A). The education in virtue of the citizens is, therefore, of central importance for the Laws: we are told early on that well-educated men will turn out to be good men and thus that it is of great importance for a state to educate its citizens well (Laws 641B). This makes the education of the citizens a topic of great importance for interpreters of the Laws as well, especially insofar as understanding what effect the educational program of Magnesia can be expected to have on the citizens will help us to understand what sort of virtue the citizens can be expected to have.

The educational program of Magnesia begins with music and gymnastics, and Plato emphasizes the deep importance of this part of the educational program in various parts of the Laws.[40] The right nurture of children begins in the womb, and is described as “pre-natal gymnastics”: pregnant women are to walk, and, later, nurses are to carry the children, so as to, as much as possible, have the children moved as though they were being constantly rocked by the sea (Laws 789B–790C). From the ages of three to six children are to play at prescribed games (Laws 797B; but see also the claim, at 794A, that the games arise from natural instinct). Plato in fact insists that childrens’ games are of decisive importance for legislation, as a change in the games will, he thinks, lead to a change in the childrens’ standards for propriety and impropriety; this will, in turn, lead to a change in their characters and in the laws they desire to be governed by.[41] At the age of six the sexes are to be divided and lessons in music and gymnastics begun. Both music and gymnastics include imitations of virtuous people engaged in virtuous activities or exhibiting virtuous traits, such as fighting courageously or feeling moderate pleasures (see e.g. Laws 655A–655E, 660A, 795E–796C, and 814E–816B); what it is to be well-educated in choristry is to delight in and to hate the imitations that one ought, more so than to be able to execute certain songs and dances skillfully (Laws 654C–D). This education in music and gymnastics is a lifelong process: citizens of Magnesia are meant to sing and dance in age-specific choruses for the rest of their lives, and are told that it is their duty to constantly encourage in themselves an appetite for ethically improving songs (Laws 665C). The oldest chorus members participate in symposia in addition to singing, at least in part with the goal of making their souls soft and youthful, and thus once again capable of being molded by the legislator (Laws 671C–D).

In addition to music and dance, children are given a literary education, are taught to play the lyre, and learn arithmetic, geometry, and astronomy (Laws 809C). The Athenian warns against having children read the poets, as, he says, each has said some things badly, but declares that the text of the Laws itself and whatever other prose, poetry, or speeches should resemble it are appropriate for the children to study (Laws 811B–E).[42] In arithmetic and geometry, the Athenian emphasizes how shameful it is for the citizens to be ignorant (as so many Greeks then were) of incommensurability (Laws 819E–820D). The situation is even worse in astronomy: there, the common belief that the planets wander rather than traveling the same circular path is not only shameful but also impious, as it is a mistake about the gods (Laws 821A–D).

One striking feature of the educational program in the Laws is its emphasis on music and gymnastics, from the very beginning up to the very end of a life. What sort of impact does this type of education have on the soul and how can we explain why it is so central to the educational program? In considering these questions, it is worth thinking about the educational program in the Republic as a contrast case: there the musical education given to the auxiliaries is said to be an education through habits which cannot produce genuine virtue (Rep 522A4–B1, cf. 484C3–D10 and 516E8–517E2).[43] If we think that Plato wants the educational program of Magnesia to produce something approaching genuine virtue in the citizens, then we’ll need to give an account of how music and dance can do more than produce good habits in the citizens. (This is not to say that habituation does not or cannot play an important role in the educational program: see e.g. Laws 656B.)

One recent strategy[44] that might explain the centrality given to education in music and gymnastics in the Laws begins with the following passage:

[A]lmost without exception, every young creature is incapable of keeping either its body or its tongue quiet, and is always striving to move and to cry, leaping and skipping and delighting in dances and games, and uttering, also, noises of every description. Now, whereas other creatures are devoid of any perception of the various kinds of order and disorder in movement (which we term rhythm and harmony), to us men the very gods, who were given, as we said, to be our fellows in the dance, have granted the pleasurable perception of rhythm and harmony, whereby they cause us to move and lead our choirs… (Laws 653D7–654A3)

This passage tells us that human beings are capable of perceiving order in sound and motion and that they have natural tendencies towards moving and making noise which provide the opportunity for that capacity to perceive order to be trained. Insofar as good order is what makes things fine,[45] then the pleasurable perception of the good order in sound and motion will be a way of appreciating finemaking properties, which could in turn help the child to acquire or refine the concepts of fineness and goodness. And if this perception and resulting comprehension of order is cognitively continuous with the grip on order that is involved in genuine virtue, then this also helps us show how this education could be part of the acquisition of genuine virtue.[46], [47]

Citizens of Magnesia, as we’ve seen, also get a sophisticated education in mathematics and astronomy. The particular results that this education aims to impart may be significant. As Ian Mueller has pointed out, incommensurability is itself a non-sensible property: two (physical) lines which represent incommensurable magnitudes will nonetheless appear to someone who measures them carefully to be commensurable.[48] Understanding the fact that there are some incommensurable segments thus crucially involves a grip on non-sensible properties, which is essential for coming to grasp genuine value properties.[49] The results aimed at in astronomical education are also significant: circular motion is the motion associated with reason and thus the circular motion of the gods is related to their status as paradigms of reason and of goodness.

We’ve seen, then, that there are robust resources available for an interpreter of the Laws to show how the educational system of Magnesia could produce something like genuine virtue: their education in music and dance may serve to give students an appreciation of order which will help them to grasp value concepts, and their mathematical and astronomical education may be designed to allow them to articulate those concepts and to see their role in structuring the cosmos. There are, however, also reasons to worry about how robust the virtue established by the educational system of Magnesia really is. The lifelong nature of education – and, in particular, the striking claim that old men must participate in symposia so as to make their souls young and malleable again – suggests that the virtue of the citizens is fragile enough to require constant upkeep.[50] The way in which we account for what does or can go wrong to make the citizens’ virtue need reinforcement will also help us fix on the nature of that reinforcement and thus on the way in which the educational system affects the souls of the citizens more generally. More research, then, is needed into the two interrelated questions of the way in which the education given to the citizens of Magnesia has its effect and of what sort of virtue the educational program of Magnesia can or tends to produce.

Plato also offers some discussion of the standards of music and poetry in their own right in the course of his discussion of education. As in other works, Plato is quite critical of the ethical content of poetry and the ethical knowledge possessed by the poet (see e.g. Laws 719A–C, 811B–E) and heavily censors the poetry that will be allowed into the city (see e.g. Laws 657B, 719B–D, 796E–802E). Plato also here offers a somewhat obscure discussion of the standard for correctness in music, saying both that it must be judged by the pleasure of the virtuous man (Laws 659A) and that, because music is imitative, the standard must involve not pleasure but truth, and that correct music is music which resembles the imitation of the beautiful (Laws 668A–B).[51]

8. Theology

The Athenian opens the dialogue by asking Kleinias and Megillus whether god or some man is responsible for their laws, and they answer that, for each of them, it is a god (Zeus for the Cretans and Apollo for the Spartans).[52] God is thus presented from the very start of the dialogue as the appropriate source of law and human institutions. This notion of god as the lawgiver or ruler for a city returns in Book 4, when the three are considering what sort of constitution to give to their new city: there, the Athenian claims that the best ruler for a city to have is god, and that they ought to imitate the rule of god by ordering their society in obedience to the immortal element within themselves, namely reason, which here will have the name of law (Laws 714A; see also Laws 762E, where service to the laws is said to be service to the gods). God is also presented in the Laws as the appropriate model for a human life. In the address to the new settlers, they are told that they ought to become like god, and that to do this is to become virtuous; in fact, the Athenian claims that god is the measure of human affairs, where this means that god, by possessing the virtues, embodies the standard to which we should aim (Laws 716C–D).[53] It is also worth noting that the early books of the Laws often present a fairly traditional theology: we’re encouraged to pray to the gods, the gods are presented as having the power to intervene in human affairs, and the Athenian happily uses the names of the Olympian gods (see e.g. Laws 717A, 828B–D).

Book 10 takes up the existence and nature of the god(s) as its main theme, and it is here that we get the most sophisticated theology the Laws has to offer. The bulk of the book is presented as the prelude to impiety laws, and consists in an argument against three beliefs which are the characteristic causes of impiety: (1) that the gods do not exist; (2) that the gods are not concerned with human beings; and (3) that the gods can be influenced by prayers and sacrifices.

The Athenian begins by addressing those who believe that the gods do not exist. He attributes to these people the view that it is material substances which exist by nature and which are the causes of the motions we see in the cosmos, and says that what they’ve failed to understand is the nature and power of soul – that is, the fact that soul is “among the first things” and older than bodies, and that “it more than anything governs their changes and all of their transformations” (Laws 892A2–7).[54] He begins by arguing that soul, which he here defines in terms of self-motion, must be the source of all other motions, as none of them have the capacity to move themselves. Soul is not simply the original source of all motion, however; the Athenian also claims that it governs the motion of all bodies which are in motion by using its own characteristic motions (e.g., wishing and believing) to take over the secondary motions of bodies.[55] As soul governs the motion of bodies in general, it must govern the motions of the heavens in particular (896E); and as those motions are orderly, they must be governed by a good soul possessing reason rather than a bad soul (897B–898C). The Athenian then says that such a soul – one possessing reason and governing the orderly motions of the heavens – ought to be regarded as a god (899A–B). This concludes the argument with someone who thinks that the gods do not exist. The Athenian then turns to argue that god (or, the gods) care for human beings and cannot be bribed. These arguments crucially appeal to a characterization of god as a craftsman and a ruler: god would be a poor craftsman indeed if he did not attend to even the small parts of the whole (i.e., human beings), and a bad ruler if he could be bribed with prayers and sacrifices.[56]

These arguments raise a number of questions:

  • The Athenian goes back and forth, in the entire text of the Laws, between speaking of ‘god’ and ‘the gods’. How many gods are there, and, if more than one, is there one which is somehow supreme?[57]

  • What is the nature of a god? Plato’s argument demonstrates that there are gods by identifying a certain sort of soul – one that possesses reason and governs the heavens – as a god. Are all gods like this, or can there be a god without soul? Plato also claims that soul is “among the first things to have come into being” (892C4). Do some or all gods come into being, or is there a god who has always existed?[58]

  • Soul is said to be the cause of all motions and, thus, “of good things and bad” (896D6), and Plato suggests the hypothesis of an evil soul precisely to explain bad things (896E). On the other hand, Plato elsewhere explains the existence of evil in other terms[59]; and soul and especially god are deeply linked to reason and good order in this discussion. Is a cosmic soul (either good or bad) responsible for evil in the Laws, or is there some other cause of evil?[60]

  • How do cosmic souls govern the motions of the celestial bodies? Is it by being within them, by acting on them by means of some external matter, or in some other way?[61]

  • Finally, how does the theology of the Laws relate to the theology of other late dialogues such as the Timaeus, Philebus, and Statesman?[62]

What is clear from the theological discussion in Book 10, however, is that god is something which governs the cosmos, by using reason, in a way that aims at its best state. This adds richness to the idea that god and god’s rule provides a standard for law and for individual human lives: just as god governs the cosmos, so too law governs a society and reason an individual, in all cases for the sake of their best state.[63]

9. Ethics

There is a strong case to be made that Plato, as in other works, accepts rational eudaimonism in the Laws: that is, that he believes that each individual’s goal, insofar as he is rational, is his own happiness or well-being (eudaimonia). Some of the most explicit evidence for this can be found at Laws 662C–E, in which the Athenian presents as appropriate the demand that the life that is recommended by an ancestor or a god be the happiest and most pleasant life[64]; but the emphasis the Laws places on the happiness of the citizens as the aim of the laws and the importance it gives to showing that virtue conduces to a happy and a pleasant life also suggest that Plato remains within a eudaimonist framework. The Laws also offers some discussion of what it is that is good for a human being (as we would expect if Plato remains a rational eudaimonist). Plato distinguishes between human goods such as health, beauty, and wealth, and divine goods, namely the virtues, and claims that human goods are not good independently of virtue. Instead, they are good for the good man, but bad for the bad man (661B–C; cf. 631D). There are important questions here about the precise nature of human eudaimonia and the precise way in which the human goods benefit the good man and fail to benefit or even harm the bad man. Is virtue sufficient or only necessary for eudaimonia?[65] Do the human goods benefit the good man only insofar as they increase his capacity to act virtuously, and harm the bad man only insofar as they increase his capacity to act viciously, or is there additional value and disvalue in the possession of human goods, e.g. are they genuinely good in a way that can only be appreciated by those who are virtuous?[66] What is clear from this discussion, however, is that virtue is an essential component of human happiness and a precondition for all other benefit.

Several passages in the Laws suggest that the sort of virtue that Plato thinks the citizens of Magnesia ought to exhibit involves an impartialist sort of regard for the good of the cosmos as a whole rather than a special regard for one’s own good. Perhaps the most striking of these passages occur in the midst of the theological discussions in Book 10. Immediately after the Athenian’s arguments that god does not neglect men, he goes on to give a short speech in which he declares that the cosmos has been put together by god with a view to the safety and virtue of the whole, and that the parts of the cosmos – including human beings – have come to be for the sake of the eudaimonia (happiness or well-being) of the whole cosmos[67] (Laws 903B–D). This passage suggests that what it is proper for human beings to do, insofar as they are parts of the cosmos and generated for the sake of its eudaimonia, is to aim at its eudaimonia; and this suggestion is confirmed by a passage which follows closely upon this one, in which the Athenian portrays human beings as the allies and the possessions of the gods in a cosmic battle of good against evil (Laws 905E8–906B3). Finally, towards the beginning of the Great Prelude to the laws in general, Plato warns about the evil of self-love and suggests that what each man must do instead is to love “neither himself nor his own belongings, but things just, whether they happen to be actions of his own or rather those of another man” (Laws 731D–732A). This looks like a rejection of partiality to oneself as such, and a requirement to instead love what is of value. The argument turns on the thought that a lover is a bad judge of value, as he is necessarily partial to what he loves. If this is right, the conclusion is very radical indeed: any sort of love that is directed at anything other than the just and good and fine will be problematic, and this will include love of family, friends, and fellow-citizens, except insofar as they are just, good and fine. While these three passages are different in detail, the picture that emerges from them is one on which what we are meant to do is to orient ourselves towards what is of genuine value and, perhaps as a consequence, to aim at the well-being of the cosmos as a whole, rather than to be oriented towards our own narrowly-construed good or the good of particular individuals as such.

The discussion of these passages is still at a very early stage and no consensus about how to understand them has yet emerged. However, if we do think that they show that Plato held impartialist ethical views in the Laws, we will be left with important questions about how to reconcile those views with his eudaimonism. What conception of an individual’s own happiness or well-being could yield as a conclusion that one ought to aim at the happiness or well-being of the cosmos as a whole rather than one’s own (narrowly construed) happiness? And what assumptions would make it plausible to think that my aiming at the well-being of the whole would necessarily correspond to something that was worth calling my own good?[68] (Why, for example, couldn’t my aiming at the well-being of the whole call on me to sacrifice myself to the good of others to the extent that I was no longer able to cultivate my own virtue and thus could not, according to the Dependency Thesis, be benefited by anything at all?[69])

We might also profitably compare Plato’s ethical views in the Laws to those which he expresses in the Republic. Plato in the Republic famously claims that the philosopher-kings will return to rule as a matter of necessity, and there is a large literature exploring just how this fits into a eudaimonist framework, given that it looks like the narrowly-construed good of the philosopher-kings would be best served by contemplation of the Forms. It would be worth exploring the relationship between the two dialogues on this point, especially given that the Laws seems to endorse a conception of an individual’s well-being which could lead them to set aside their own, narrowly-construed well-being in just as, if not more, radical a way than the Republic.

10. Plato’s Later Epistemology, Metaphysics, and Psychology

With respect to the specific controversies we have examined, for example, that over the role of the preludes and that concerning the powers of the Nocturnal Council, we have found that the issues under dispute have important connections to Plato’s epistemology and psychology. This should not, however, be surprising. To understand the nature of ethical learning and what ethical cognitive states can be produced by different kinds of education, we must ultimately turn to Plato’s epistemology, metaphysics, and psychology. Further, since the appropriate political role for citizens depends in large part on the kinds of ethical character and knowledge (or true belief) they can acquire, we can only understand Plato’s later political philosophy by understanding its connections with his later epistemology, metaphysics, and psychology.

The idea that Plato’s ethics and politics rest, at least in large part, on his views in these other areas of philosophy is not novel. Much of the best work on the ethical and political theory of the Republic tries to draw such connections.[70] But this has not yet happened to anything approaching the same degree with respect to his later ethics and politics.[71] This is due perhaps primarily to the fact that while the Republic provides within itself an account articulated in some detail not only of Plato’s ethics and politics, but also of the psychology, epistemology and metaphysics on which they rest, the Laws is comparatively lacking in extended argumentation on these basic philosophical issues. But Plato is not trying in the Laws to provide a comprehensive philosophical statement of the sort found in the Republic. Questions of psychology, epistemology, ethics and metaphysics (including the metaphysics of value) are explored in great detail and with extraordinary sophistication in the other later dialogues. Indeed, they are treated in much more detail and with greater philosophical power than in the middle period. And it is these later dialogues that provide the indispensable background for understanding the Laws. Thus we should read it together with, for example, the Philebus’ metaphysics of value and account of pleasure and with the epistemology and psychology of the Timaeus.[72] More cautiously, we should look for connections with the epistemology, metaphysics and psychology of other dialogues which are plausibly thought to be post-Republic, but do not fall into the final group of six, such as the Phaedrus and the Theaetetus.[73] By examining Plato’s philosophical positions in these later dialogues, we can work out the deeper justification for Plato’s vision of political and ethical community in the Laws. And by articulating this vision, we gain greater understanding of the other later dialogues on which it rests.


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Other Bibliographies

  • Brisson, L. 2018. “Bibliographie platonicienne 2017–2018”, Études platoniciennes, 14, [available online]. doi:10.4000/etudesplatoniciennes.1357. [Note that Brisson publishes comprehensive Plato biographies on a yearly basis. The one cited here was the most recent as of the December 2020 update.]
  • Saunders, T. and L. Brisson, 2000. Bibliography on Plato’s Laws (3rd edition); revised and completed with an additional bibliography on the Epinomis by Luc Brisson, Volume 12, Sankt Augusin: Academia Verlag.
  • Schofield, M. 2016. “Plato’s Laws”. Oxford Bibliographies in Classics, R. Scodel (ed.), New York: Oxford University Press. [available online] doi:10.1093/OBO/9780195389661-0214

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

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