#### Supplement to Possible Worlds

## Further Problems for Combinatorialism

### Problems with Unrestricted Recombination

It is critical to combinatorialism that recombination among simples
is unrestricted — any simple object can exemplify any number of
simple universals. Any modal qualifications of this principle would
undermine combinatorialism's modal reductionism (cf. Bradley 1989,
35–38). Thus, for the combinatorialist, all simple universals
must be compatible; for any simple object *o* and any simple
univesals **P** and **Q**, there must be a world that includes
both [**P**,*o*] and [**Q**,*o*]. On *a priori*
grounds alone, this seems implausible; why should it not turn out
that some of the simple properties of the simple are simply,
primitively incompatible? Likewise, for any simple binary relation
**R**, unrestricted recombination requires that, for any distinct
simple objects *a* and *b*, there is a world that includes
both [**R**,*a*,*b*] and [**R**,*b*,*a*];
there can therefore be no simple, necessarily asymmetric relations.
For the same reason there must be a world that includes
[**R**,*a*,*a*] and, hence, there can be no simple,
necessarily irreflexive relations. Armstrong (1997, 146–7)
acknowledges that unrestricted recombination, or *independence*,
is ultimately an empirical matter but argues that, so long as it is
not empirically refuted, the doctrine is warranted by the simplicity
it brings to the theory of modality.

### The Prospect of Infinite Decomposition

The combinatorialist definition of a possible world appears to hinge
critically on the assumption that, ultimately, there are simple facts
on which all other (first-order) facts supervene. A challenging
possibility for the combinatorialist is that this assumption is
false. In particular, it seems conceptually possible that there are
no simples at all, that every particular comprises yet simpler
particular and that every universal is a conjunction of yet simpler
universals. Should this be the case, then there are simply no
possible worlds the sense of **AW3** or **AW3′**.

Armstrong (1986a, ch. 5) takes up this challenge by introducing the
notion of *relative atoms*. The idea is this: Let *s* be
any fact, simple or not, and call its constituent objects and
universals its atoms (Armstrong 1986, 69):

The totality of recombinations of these 'atoms' yields a set of possible worlds….If the atoms are genuine atoms [i.e., simples], then no more remains to be done. But if the atoms are not genuinely atomic, then this set is a mere subset of the worlds which can be formed. With one or more of the 'atoms' broken up, we can go on to an enlarged set of worlds. If the breaking-up goes on forever…, then at each point in the break-up new worlds emerge.

Clearly, however, a condition has to be placed on the initial state
of affairs **s**. For let **W** be our water molecule from
Figure 1
and let **I** be an (actual) hydronium ion, hence one with
entirely distinct atomic constituents, as indicated (along with the
correpsonding structural universal) in Figure 3.

Figure 3: Hydronium Ion **I** and the Structural Universal
**Hydronium** (**H**)

Now, **W** and **I**, according to Armstrong, are both facts,
presumably of the form [**Water**,**s**] and
[**Hydronium**,**t**], respectively, and **s** and **t**
are, respectively, the sums of the constituent atoms of **W** and
**I**. Since both **W** and **I** exist, there is the
conjunctive state of affairs [**W** & **I**]. If,
however, we consider any recombination of the “atomic”
universals and particulars constituting **W** and **I** —
viz., **Water**, **Hydronium**, **s** and **t** —
(together with its totality state of affairs **T**) to count as a
(contracted) possible world, then we have in particular the world
[[**Water**,**t**] & [**Hydronium**,**s**]
& **T**] (hence a world where **t** exemplifies
**Water** and **s** exemplifies **Hydronium**), which is
clearly impossible for obvious structural reasons (notably, in
reality, **W** consists of only two hydrogen atoms and **I** of
three).

To avoid this problem, Armstrong places a
“non-ovalapping” condition on the recombination of the
relative atoms of a world. Say that universals *overlap* if they
share a common constituent and that particulars overlap if they share
a common part. Then the proposed definition of a possible world is
the following

AW3R |
w is a (combinatorial) possible world =_{def} w is the conjunction
of (i) a recombination of some simple fact f such that
none of f's constituent objects, and none of its
constituent universals, overlap and (ii) the totality state of
affairs T for that recombination.
_{w} |

As simples by definition do not overlap, **AW3R** obviously
generalizes
**AW3′**.
At the same time, because **Water** and **Hydronium** overlap
— **Oxygen** and **Hydrogen** are constituents of both
— [[**Water**,**t**] &
[**Hydronium**,**s**] & **T**] does not represent a
genuine possible world.

Sider (2002) points out that serious problems remain for Armstrong's
idea. By **AW3R**, [**Water**,**s**] (together with its
totality state of affairs) itself constitutes a (very sparse)
possible world **w**. But, as Sider notes, as none of the
constituents of **Water** exist in **w**, “its use in
representation of a possibility has little to do with its actual
nature”; similarly for the (actually) complex object *s*.
The world **w** thus does not represent “much of anything,
beyond that there exist[s something]…which instantiates a single
universal” (*ibid*., 683). Sider then offers up a
plausible reconstruction of Armstrong's basic idea of relative atoms
that avoids this objection, but this effort leads to an array of
further objections to the view.