Pragmatic Arguments and Belief in God

First published Mon Aug 16, 2004; substantive revision Fri Jul 29, 2022

Unlike the Cosmological Argument or the Design Argument, theistic pragmatic arguments are not arguments for the proposition that God exists; they are arguments that believing that God exists is rational. The most famous theistic pragmatic argument is Pascal’s Wager. Though we touch on this argument briefly, this entry focuses primarily on the theistic pragmatic arguments found in William James, J.S. Mill, and others. It also explores the logic of pragmatic arguments in general, and the pragmatic use of moral arguments, and arguments predicated on the idea of final meaning in life. This entry looks at an important objection to the employment of pragmatic arguments in belief formation – the objection that evidence alone should regulate belief. It also explores a few pragmatic arguments that have been offered against Theism. 

1. Pragmatic Arguments

As with so much in philosophy, the first recorded employment of a pragmatic argument is found in Plato. At Meno 86b-c, Socrates tells Meno that believing in the value of inquiry is justified because of the positive impact upon one’s character:

Meno: Somehow or other I believe you are right.

Socrates: I think I am. I shouldn’t like to take my oath on the whole story, but one thing I am ready to fight for as long as I can, in word and act – that is, that we shall be better, braver, and more active men if we believe it right to look for what we don’t know than if we believe there is no point in looking because what we don’t know we can never discover.

Meno: There too I am sure you are.[1]

Paraphrased, Socrates’ point is if being better, braver, and more active are among our desires, and if believing that inquiry is worthwhile facilitates our becoming better, braver, and more active, then we have reason, pragmatic reason, to believe that inquiry is worthwhile. Socrates’ argument is an argument for the permissibility of a certain belief, based on the benefits of believing that certain belief. Pragmatic arguments are practical in orientation, justifying actions that are thought to facilitate the achievement of our goals, or the satisfaction of our desires. If among your goals is A, and if doing such and such results in your achieving A, then, all else being equal, you have reason to do such and such:

  1. Doing α brings about, or contributes in bringing about, β, and
  2. It is in your interest that β obtain. So,
  3. You have reason to do α.

As presented this is a particular kind of pragmatic argument, a prudential argument. Prudential pragmatic arguments are predicated upon one’s preferences or goals or self-interest. As we will see, there are pragmatic arguments that are not narrowly prudential but are moral in nature.

Pragmatic arguments are relevant to belief-formation, since inculcating a belief is an action. There are, broadly speaking, two kinds of pragmatic arguments that have to do with belief-formation. The first is an argument that recommends taking steps to believe a proposition because, if it should turn out to be true, the benefits gained from believing that proposition will be impressive. This first kind of pragmatic argument we can call a “truth-dependent” pragmatic argument, or more conveniently a “dependent-argument,” since the benefits are obtained only if the relevant state of affairs occurs. The prime example of a dependent-argument is a pragmatic argument that uses a calculation of expected utility and employs the Expectation Rule to recommend belief:

whenever both probability and utility values are known, one should choose to do an act which has the greatest expected utility.

Among the various versions of his wager argument, Pascal employs this Rule in a version which states that no matter how small the probability that God exists, as long as it is a positive, non-zero probability, the expected utility of theistic belief will dominate the expected utility of disbelief. Given the distinction between (A) having reason to think a certain proposition is true, and (B) having reason to induce belief in that proposition, taking steps to generate belief in a certain proposition may be the rational thing to do, even if that proposition lacks sufficient evidential support. The benefits of believing a proposition can rationally take precedence over the evidential strength enjoyed by a contrary proposition; and so, given an infinite expected utility, Pascal’s Wager contends that forming the belief that God exists is the rational thing to do, no matter how small the likelihood that God exists.

The second kind of pragmatic argument, which can be called a “truth-independent” pragmatic argument, or more conveniently, an “independent-argument,” is one which recommends taking steps to believe a certain proposition simply because of the benefits gained by believing it, whether or not the believed proposition is true. This is an argument that recommends belief cultivation because of the psychological, or moral, or religious, or social, or even the prudential benefits gained by virtue of believing it. In David Hume’s Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, for example, Cleanthes employs an independent argument, “religion, however corrupted, is still better than no religion at all. The doctrine of a future state is so strong and necessary a security to morals that we never ought to abandon or neglect it” (Hume 1776, 87). Perhaps the best-known example of an independent-argument is found in William James’s celebrated “Will to Believe” essay in which he argues that, in certain circumstances, it is rationally and morally permissible to believe a proposition because of the benefits thereby generated.[2]

Unlike independent pragmatic arguments, dependent ones are, in an important sense, truth-sensitive. Of course, being pragmatic arguments, dependent-arguments are not truth-sensitive in an evidential sense; nevertheless they are dependent on truth since the benefits are had only if the recommended belief is true. In contrast, independent pragmatic arguments, yielding benefits whether or not the recommended beliefs are true, are insensitive to truth. Independent-arguments, we might say, are belief-dependent and not truth-dependent.

Theism is the proposition that God exists. A theist is anyone who accepts or believes that proposition. In this entry we limit ourselves to pragmatic arguments concerning Theism – whether pro or con – and skip over pragmatic arguments for non-theistic religions. A theistic pragmatic argument contends that there are practical, prudential, or moral reasons for inculcating theistic belief. An atheistic pragmatic argument holds that there are practical, prudential, or moral reasons for denying Theism.

2. Moral Arguments as Pragmatic Arguments

Pragmatic arguments in support of theistic belief can either be predicated on prudence or on morality. By pragmatic arguments predicated on morality I mean arguments that contend that morality, or some proper part of morality, presupposes, or is facilitated by theistic belief. And if morality, or the proper part of morality, is rational, then so too is theistic belief. Put generally:[3]

  1. Doing α helps to bring about β, and
  2. It is morally desirable that β. So,
  3. It is prima facie morally desirable to do α.

Since (4) specifies actions, we should understand accepting theistic propositions as actions, even if believing is not an action (for more on the distinction between acceptance and belief, see the section, “Pragmatic Arguments and Belief,” below).

It is important to recognize the distinction between theoretical moral arguments for theism (arguments intended to show that God exists), and pragmatic moral arguments for the rationality of theistic belief. George Mavrodes, for instance, constructs a theoretical moral argument by contending that it would be extremely odd that we would have moral obligations the fulfillment of which results in a net loss to the agent. Such a world seems absurd (Mavrodes, 1986). His argument is built upon the idea of a Russellian world, a universe in which mental events are products of non-mental events, and in which there’s no human post-mortem survival, and extinction is the final end of every biological species. A Russellian world implies atheism. Summarized, Mavrodes’ argument is that there are real moral obligations in the actual world. But, real moral obligations would be absurd in a Russellian world, since fulfilling moral obligations often cause a net loss to the moral agent and there is no deep explanation of real moral obligation in a Russellian world (the deep features of a Russellian world would be things like forces and atoms and chance). But, fulfilling moral obligation is not absurd. So, in this respect, there is reason to think that the actual world is not a Russellian world.

Two examples of pragmatic moral arguments are Adams (1979) and Zagzebski (1987). Adams builds his argument on the concept of demoralization – weakening of moral motivation – and the concept of a moral order – roughly, the idea that to achieve a balance of good over evil in the universe requires something more than human effort, yet human effort can add or detract from the total value of the universe. While we cannot do it all on our own, the idea is, we can make a significant difference for better or worse. In short, Adam’s argument is that it is demoralizing not to believe that there is a moral order in the universe, and demoralization is morally undesirable. So, there is moral advantage in accepting that there is a moral order, and theism provides the best account of why that is. Hence, there’s moral advantage in accepting theism.

Zagzebski builds her argument upon the ideas of moral skepticism and moral efficacy, and, though she does not employ the term, moral order. Morality is efficacious if we can make significant contributions to the production of good in the universe and to the elimination of evil. Moral skepticism is a doubting of our ability to acquire moral knowledge, and a doubting of moral efficacy. Zagzebski argues that it is rational to try to be moral only if it is rational to believe that the probability that the attempt will succeed and will produce a great good is not outweighed by the probability that one will have to sacrifice goods in the course of the attempt. But given what we know of human abilities and history, it is not rational to believe that the attempt to be moral is likely to succeed if there is no moral order. Since it is rational to try to be moral, it is rational to believe that there is moral order in the universe, and Christian doctrine is, in part, an account of there being a moral order in the universe. So, accepting Christian theism is more rational than accepting that there’s no moral order in the universe.

Theistic moral pragmatic arguments may face an objection similar to the many-gods objection to Pascal’s wager. The many-gods objection contends that the betting options of the wager are not limited to Christianity and atheism alone, since one could formulate a Pascalian Wager for Islam, certain sects of Buddhism, or for any of the competing sects found within Christianity itself.[4] A similar problem arises for theistic moral pragmatic arguments, at least insofar as those arguments are intended to provide strong support for theistic belief. Let’s say that a pragmatic argument provides strong support for theism just in case it provides reason for thinking that theism alone provides the benefit; and let’s say that a pragmatic argument provides weak support for theism just in case it provides reason for thinking that theism is just one of several alternatives in providing the benefit. Pascal’s Wager, for instance, is intended to provide strong support for theism; while James’s Will to Believe argument is intended to provide weak support. Pragmatic moral arguments, if they are to provide strong support for theism, must provide reason to think that theistic belief alone is necessary for morality, or that theistic belief best facilitates moral practice. But it’s far from clear that theistic belief exceeds its competitors in facilitating moral practice. Until reason for thinking that is forthcoming, it would be premature to hold that theistic moral pragmatic arguments provide strong support.

3. William James’s Will to Believe Argument

The argument presented by William James (1842–1910) in his 1896 essay, “The Will to Believe”, extends far beyond the issue of the rationality of theistic belief to include various philosophical issues (for instance, whether to embrace determinism or indeterminism), and even matters of practical life. James’s argument, in its attack on the agnostic imperative (withhold belief whenever the evidence is insufficient), makes the general epistemological point that:

a rule of thinking which would absolutely prevent me from acknowledging certain kinds of truth if those kinds of truth were really there, would be an irrational rule. (James 1896, 28)

We might understand the agnostic imperative more fully as follows:

for all persons S and propositions p, if S believes that p is just as likely as not-p, then it is impermissible for S to believe either p or not-p.

If James is correct, then the agnostic imperative is false.

The foil of James’s essay was W.K. Clifford (1845–79). Clifford argued that:

…if I let myself believe anything on insufficient evidence, there may be no great harm done by the mere belief; it may be true after all, or I may never have occasion to exhibit it in outward acts. But I cannot help doing this great wrong towards Man, that I make myself credulous. The danger to society is not merely that it should believe wrong things, though that is great enough; but that it should become credulous, and lose the habit of testing things and inquiring into them; for then it must sink back into savagery. (Clifford 1879, 185–6)

Clifford presented evidentialism as a rule of morality: “it is wrong always, everywhere, and for any one, to believe anything upon insufficient evidence” (Clifford 1879, 186). If Clifford’s Rule of morality is correct, then any one who believes a proposition that she does not take to be more likely than not, is, thereby, immoral. It may be worthwhile to note that Clifford’s argument here is itself a moral pragmatic argument.

James has two main concerns in the “Will To Believe” essay. The first is to argue that Clifford’s Rule is irrational (James 1896: 28). The second is that a theistic commitment is permissible. James contends that Clifford’s Rule is but one intellectual strategy open to us. A proponent of Clifford’s Rule advises, in effect, that one should avoid error at all costs, and thereby risk the loss of certain truths. But another strategy is to seek truth by any means available, even at the risk of error. James champions the latter via the main argument of the “Will to Believe” essay. To facilitate matters eight definitions employed by James are paraphrased:

  • Hypothesis: something that may be believed.
  • Option: a decision between two hypotheses.
  • Living option: a decision between two live hypotheses.
  • Live hypothesis: something that is a real candidate for belief. A hypothesis is live, we might say, for a person just in case that person lacks compelling evidence disconfirming that hypothesis, and the hypothesis has an intuitive appeal for that person.
  • Momentous option: the option may never again present itself, or the decision cannot be easily reversed, or something of importance hangs on the choice. It is not a trivial matter.
  • Forced option: the decision cannot be avoided.
  • Genuine option: one that’s living, momentous, and forced.
  • Intellectually open: neither the evidence nor arguments conclusively decide the issue.

The first main argument might be sketched as follows:

  1. Two alternative intellectual strategies are available:
    • Strategy A: Risk a loss of truth and a loss of a vital good for the certainty of avoiding error.
    • Strategy B: Risk error for a chance at truth and a vital good.
  2. Clifford’s Rule embodies Strategy A. But,
  3. Strategy B is preferable to Strategy A because Strategy A would deny us access to certain possible kinds of truth. And,
  4. Any intellectual strategy that denies access to possible truths is an inadequate strategy. Therefore,
  5. Clifford’s Rule is unacceptable.

James asserts that “there are…cases where a fact cannot come at all unless a preliminary faith exists in its coming” (James 1896, 25). Among other examples James provides of this particular kind of truth is that of social cooperation:

a social organism of any sort whatever, large or small, is what it is because each member proceeds to his own duty with a trust that the other members will simultaneously do theirs. Wherever a desired result is achieved by the co-operation of many independent persons, its existence as a fact is a pure consequence of the precursive faith in one another of those immediately concerned. (James 1896, 24)

And if James is right that there is a kind of proposition that has as a truth-maker its being believed, what we might call “dependent truths,” then proposition (9) looks well supported.

Of course, accepting proposition (11), and advancing an alternative strategy of seeking truth by any available means, even at the risk of error, does not entail that anything goes. And an important part of James’s essay restricts what legitimately might be believed in the absence of adequate evidence. Among the requirements suggested by James the most important is:

Only genuine options that are intellectually open are decidable on passional grounds.

James is not arguing against conforming one’s belief to the evidence, whenever there’s a preponderance of evidence. Nor is he arguing against the importance of evidence. His is an argument contra the prohibition of believing whenever the evidence is silent, a prohibition implied by Clifford’s Rule.

The requirement that an option is intellectually open may be redundant. If the evidence were compelling, or even strongly supportive of, say, hypothesis a, and you recognized this, it may be that you would find only a alive. Since you’re aware that the evidence strongly supports it, you would not find not-a living. In other words, to say that an option is living may imply that it is intellectually open. Nonetheless, let’s proceed as if aliveness and openness are logically distinct notions. Additionally, we might ask whether the property of intellectual openness is to be understood as the evidence is lacking, or as the evidence is in principle lacking. That is, is an option intellectually open when the evidence is indeterminate, or when it is essentially indeterminate? James’s argument requires only the former. The lack of adequate evidence is sufficient to render an option intellectually open. If more evidence appears so that one hypothesis is supported by a preponderance of the evidence, then a commitment to abide by the evidence is triggered.

The relevance of all of this to theistic belief, according to James, is that:

Religion says essentially two things. …the best things are the more eternal things, the overlapping things, the things in the universe that throw the last stone, so to speak, and say the final word…. The second affirmation of religion is that we are better off even now if we believe [religion’s] first affirmation to be true… The more perfect and more eternal aspect of the universe is represented in our religions as having personal form. The universe is no longer a mere It to us, but a Thou…. We feel, too, as if the appeal of religion to us were made to our own active good-will, as if evidence might be forever withheld from us unless we met the hypothesis half-way. (James 1896, 25–7)

James asserts that there are two affirmations of religion. By affirmation James means something like an abstract claim, devoid of much doctrinal content, and found in the major religions. The first affirmation is that the best things are the more eternal things, while the second is that we are better off even now if we believe the first affirmation. The first affirmation is particularly puzzling, since James does not assert that the best things are the eternal things; he says that the best things are the more eternal things. He explicates this affirmation with three metaphors and a slogan: “the overlapping things, the things in the universe that throw the last stone, so to speak, and say the final word. ‘Perfection is eternal,’ – this phrase of Charles Secrétan seems a good way of putting this first affirmation of religion” (James 1896, 25). Two ideas are suggested by James’s explication: sovereignty and perfection. If we understand “more eternal” as a kind of necessity, or non-contingency, then perhaps the first affirmation may be understood as asserting that the best things are those things that cannot fail to be sovereign and perfect. This interpretation resolves much of the first affirmation’s puzzle. The plurality though is still puzzling. We can resolve this puzzle by recognizing that, although he does not explicitly call it a third affirmation, James asserts that “the more perfect and more eternal aspect of the universe is represented in our religions as having personal form. The universe is no longer a mere It to us, but a Thou” (James 1896, 26). If we take this as a third affirmation of religion (perhaps at the risk a charge of theistic parochialism), the possibility that the more eternal things are plural is foreclosed. Monotheism, in other words, and not polytheism is established by the third affirmation. Taken together, then, the first and the third affirmations of religion suggest that the supreme good in the universe is the existence of a personal being that is essentially perfect and sovereign. The second affirmation is that we are better off now by believing in the existence of this perfect being. At least in part, we would be better off now by believing the first affirmation because by doing so the possibility of a relationship with this being is established.

According to James, just as one is not likely to make friends if one is aloof, likewise one is not likely to become acquainted with the perfect being, if there is such, if one seeks that acquaintance only after sufficient evidence has been gathered. There are possible truths, James claims, belief of which is a necessary condition of obtaining evidence for them. Let’s call the class of propositions whose evidence is restricted to those who first believe “restricted propositions.” Dependent propositions and restricted propositions are James’s counterexamples to Clifford’s Rule. They are two examples of the kinds of truths that Clifford’s Rule would keep one from acknowledging. That is, Clifford’s Rule is problematic because following it would preclude access to restricted propositions and dependent propositions. The Cliffordian may be forever cut off from certain kinds of truth.

One might object that James has at best shown that theistic belief is momentous only if God exists. If God does not exist, and, as a consequence, the vital good of eternal life does not obtain, then no vital good is at stake. To answer this objection a Jamesian might focus on what James calls the second affirmation of religion – we are better off even now if we believe – and take that affirmation to include benefits that are available, via pro-belief, even if God does not exist. In The Varieties of Religious Experience James suggests that religious belief produces certain psychological benefits:

A new zest which adds itself like a gift to life, and takes the form either of lyrical enchantment or of appeal to earnestness and heroism…. An assurance of safety and a temper of peace, and, in relation to others, a preponderance of loving affections. (James 1902, 475)

In any case, given that theism is intellectually open and that it’s part of a genuine option, and given that there are vital goods attached to theistic belief, James says, the hope that it is true is a sufficient reason to believe. In addition this objection is easily evaded if we revise the notion of a genuine option by removing the requirement that an option is genuine only if momentous, although James himself may have been loath to drop that requirement.

James’s second main argument proceeds:

  1. The decision whether to accept theism is a genuine option. And,
  2. Theism is intellectually open. And,
  3. There are vital goods at stake in accepting theism. And,
  4. No one is irrational or immoral in risking error for a chance at truth and a vital good. So,
  5. One may accept theism.

With this argument, James seeks to support the second of his two primary concerns of his essay, that a religious commitment is permissible.

An objection commonly leveled against James’s argument is that “it constitutes an unrestricted license for wishful thinking… if our aim is to believe what is true, and not necessarily what we like, James’s universal permissiveness will not help us” (Hick 1990, 60). That is, hoping that a proposition is true is no reason to think that it is. A Jamesian might contend that this objection is unfair. As we have noted, James does not hold that the falsity of Clifford’s Rule implies that anything goes. Restricting the relevant permissibility class to propositions that are intellectually open and part of a genuine option provides ample protection against wishful thinking.

A more significant objection contends that James’s argument fails “to show that one can have a sufficient moral reason for self-inducing an epistemically unsupported belief” (Gale 1990, 283). This objection contends that there is a weighty moral duty to proportion one’s beliefs to the evidence, and that this duty flows from moral personhood – to be a morally responsible person requires that one have good reasons for each of one’s beliefs. But to believe an epistemically unsupported proposition is to violate this duty and is thus, in effect, a denial of one’s own personhood.[5] Or think of it another way, as intellectual beings, we have the dual goal of maximizing our stock of (significant) true beliefs and minimizing our stock of false ones. Clifford’s Rule derives its moral validity, one might contend, from that intellectual goal. And from Clifford’s Rule flows our duty to believe only those propositions that enjoy adequate evidential support. James’s argument would, if operative, thwart our intellectual goal by permitting us to violate Clifford’s Rule. Can a morally and intellectually responsible person ever have a moral duty to believe a proposition that lacks adequate evidence, a duty that outweighs the alleged Cliffordian duty of believing only those propositions that enjoy adequate support? To answer this, let’s employ what we might call the “ET” thought experiment. Suppose Clifford is abducted by very powerful and very smart extraterrestrials, which offer him a single chance of salvation for humankind – that he acquire and maintain belief in a proposition that lacks adequate evidential support, otherwise the destruction of humankind will result. Clifford adroitly points out that no one can just will belief. The ETs, devilish in their anticipation as well as their technology, provide Clifford with a supply of doxastic-producing pills, which when ingested produce the requisite belief for 24 hours. It’s obvious that Clifford would do no wrong by swallowing the pills and bringing about a belief lacking adequate evidential support.[6] Moreover, since one is never irrational in doing one’s moral duty, not only would Clifford not be immoral, he would not even be irrational in bringing about and maintaining belief in a proposition lacking adequate evidential support. As we mentioned earlier, given the distinction between (A) having reason to think a certain proposition is true, and (B) having reason to induce a belief in that proposition, it may be that a particular proposition lacks sufficient evidential support, but that forming a belief in that proposition is the rational action to perform.

A very interesting objection to James’s argument is that it falls prey to the very principle it invokes against Clifford:

James writes: “A rule of thinking which would absolutely prevent me from acknowledging certain kinds of truth if those kinds of truth were really there would be an irrational rule”. This may sound like sweet reason itself, but a moment’s reflection should convince us that it is nothing of the kind. Any rule whatever that restricts belief in any way might conceivably shut us off from some truths. (Wood 2002, 24)

According to James, Clifford’s Rule is problematic because, if followed, it would preclude access to restricted propositions and dependent propositions. According to this objection, this alleged flaw of Clifford’s Rule is true of any epistemic principle. Every epistemic principle that divides beliefs into those that are permissible and those that are not runs the risk of shutting off access to certain possible kinds of truth. James’s restriction of the permissible use of the passional nature only to when one faces a genuine option that’s intellectually open is just as guilty of the alleged flaw as is Clifford’s Rule. But an alleged flaw found in every possibility is no flaw. Hence, James’s objection to Clifford fails.

This objection is interesting since it is in one sense true. It’s obvious that any rule that restricts belief in any way might shut us off from certain truths. Still, while interesting, this objection is irrelevant. James’s argument is not predicated on the abstract proposition that “any rule whatever that restricts belief in any way might conceivably shut us off from some truths.” It is predicated on the principle that there are dependent propositions, and there are restricted propositions. His examples of social trust, and acquiring friends, and of social cooperation are intended to make that clear. If theism were true, then it is very likely that there would be dependent propositions and restricted propositions in that realm as well. Clifford’s Rule would preclude access to any restricted or dependent proposition, whether religious or not. James is not arguing against conforming one’s belief to the evidence, whenever there’s a preponderance of evidence. He is arguing against the prohibition of believing whenever the evidence is silent. Since James’s argument specifies the irrationality of Clifford’s Rule’s exclusion of dependent and restricted propositions, and not just the abstract possibility of some kind of true belief or other being excluded, it escapes this objection.

William Wainwright has argued that James’s argument properly fits within an old Christian tradition, which asserts that:

Mature religious belief can, and perhaps should, be based on evidence but… the evidence can be accurately assessed only by men and women who possess the proper moral and spiritual qualifications. This view was once a Christian commonplace; reason is capable of knowing God on the basis of evidence – but only when one’s cognitive faculties are rightly disposed. (Wainwright 1995, 3).

If Wainwright is correct, then James’s argument is not just a pragmatic argument, but also an epistemic argument, since he is arguing that one of the pragmatic benefits is a more reliable access to reality (see also the explication of James’ argument via contemporary epistemic utility theory in Pettigrew 2016). So, the chasm between the epistemic and the pragmatic is not unbridgeable, since James’s Will to Believe argument spans the gulf between the pragmatic and the epistemic. Importantly, we should keep in mind that whatever else it is, James’s argument is, at least in part, a pragmatic argument, and, moreover, James probably saw his argument as having a similar status as Pascal’s Wager, since he offers a positive evaluation of the Wager, very often overlooked by commentators, “Pascal’s argument, instead of being powerless, then seems a regular clincher, and is the last stroke needed to make our faith…complete” (James 1896, 11).

4. J.S. Mill’s License to Hope

The posthumous publication of Mill’s Three Essays on Religion (1874) drew criticism from the faithful, but it also drew a surprising disappointment from those who expected the “saint of rationalism” to argue for agnosticism. The cause of this consternation is found in the third of the three essays, “Theism,” a short work begun in 1868 and unfinished when Mill died in 1870. The faithful found “Theism” objectionable because of Mill’s criticism of several of the standard arguments of natural theology. The disappointment of the other side flowed from Mill’s endorsement of a position that can be summed up by the principle that where probabilities fail, hope can properly flourish. As Mill expressed this principle when discussing immortality, “…to any one who feels it conducive either to his satisfaction or to his usefulness to hope for a future state as a possibility, there is no hindrance to his indulging that hope” (Mill 1874, 210). Mill thought that belief in a creator of great but limited power was supported by the design argument, and one could certainly erect the superstructure of hope upon the base of a belief in a creator who would extend human existence beyond the grave:

Appearances point to the existence of a Being who has great power over us – all the power implied in the creation of the Kosmos, or of its organized beings at least – and of whose goodness we have evidence though not of its being his predominant attribute; and as we do not know the limits either of his power or of his goodness, there is room to hope that both the one and the other may extend to granting us this gift provided that it would really be beneficial to us. (Mill 1874, 210)

Since we do not know that granting postmortem existence to humans is beyond the capability of the creator, hope is possible. As Mill puts it:

…in the regulation of the imagination literal truth of facts is not the only thing to be considered. Truth is the province of reason, and it is by the cultivation of the rational faculty that provision is made for its being known always, and thought of as often as is required by duty and the circumstances of human life. But when reason is strongly cultivated, the imagination may safely follow its own end, and do its best to make life pleasant and lovely… On these principles it appears to me that the indulgence of hope with regard to the government of the universe and the destiny of man after death, while we recognize as a clear truth that we have no ground for more than a hope, is legitimate and philosophically defensible. The beneficial effect of such a hope is far from trifling. (Mill 1874, 248–9)

For our purposes the item of interest is Mill’s claim that “any one who feels it conducive either to his satisfaction or to his usefulness to hope for a future state as a possibility, there is no hindrance to his indulging that hope” (Mill 1874, 210). Mill’s license to hope is issued on pragmatic grounds: it is permissible to hope if and only if:

For all one knows or justifiably believes, the object of one’s hope obtains; and,
One believes that hoping contributes to one’s own happiness, or to the well-being of others.

The second condition (L2) is straightforwardly pragmatic and restricts hope to those who have goals either of personal happiness, or of contributing to the well-being of others. Believing that hope will result in the increase of happiness or well-being is a necessary condition of permissible hope.

There’s little doubt that Mill agreed with Clifford’s Rule. Mill was no subjectivist or fideist. But hope and belief are not the same; and the standards for the permissibility of the latter are considerably higher. Mill thought that (L1) and (L2) were the relevant standards for permissible hope. If one believes that Clifford’s Rule should govern any and all propositional attitudes and not just belief, then it is easy to see why Mill’s liberal treatment of hope would disappoint.

Mill held that one may hope that God exists, but one may not believe that God exists, as the evidence is lacking. Suppose one agrees with Mill, that faith can subsist on hope, trust, or some other non-doxastic attitude other than belief. Suppose further that one seeks to build a theistic commitment on hope. The acceptance of theistic hope provides reason to act as if theism were true, not because one believes that it is true, but because one hopes that it is. What is it to act as if theism is true? It is to put into practice behaviors characteristic of a particular religious tradition, such as Judaism, Christianity, or Islam. Acting as if a certain religious tradition were true would include reorienting one’s values, priorities, and life-projects in order to reflect a commitment to a particular tradition. It would also involve engaging in the rituals and behaviors associated with the particular tradition; and investing a significant portion of one’s time and money in support of causes associated with the tradition.

A problem arises however. Social psychology, with its theories of biased scanning, social-perception theory, and cognitive dissonance theory, advances the idea that behavior can alter, influence, and generate attitudes, including beliefs (see Jordan 2016). By regularly engaging in behaviors and practices characteristic of a particular religious tradition, one engages in actions that tend to inculcate religious belief. Belief is catching, as associating with and imitating the faithful is an effective way of self-inducing the beliefs of the faithful. Those who seek to replace belief with hope will find themselves taking steps to build a theistic commitment on hope, while holding that they ought to avoid theistic belief. Yet, the very steps involved in fostering a commitment on hope – immersive role-playing as a theist, or acting as if theism were true – tend to generate theistic belief. Those who habitually or chronically imitate the actions and rituals of theists find eventually that those are not just tasks they perform, but are at the heart of who they are and what they believe. Yet, theistic belief is off-limits.

One would have to take steps that inoculate against the contagious theistic belief. Yet, the reasons one has to build a theistic commitment on hope and not belief, would conflict with one’s reasons to inoculate against catching belief. One is pushed to act as if theism were true, yet pulled to act to ensure that one does not come to believe that it is. Whatever commitment might emerge out of this dynamic is not likely one characteristic of a mature or wholeheartedly committed theist.

This problem of catching belief flows out of the fact that chronically acting as if something is true is an effective way of inculcating the belief that it is true. Any non-doxastic account of faith put into regular practice, coupled with Clifford’s Rule, is exposed to the problem of catching belief. Religious Fictionalism, for example, which holds that faith that p does not require belief that p, has to deal with the problem. For more discussion, see Malcolm and Scott 2017, and Jordan 2016.

5. Consolation and Needs-based Arguments

In 1770 James Beattie (1735–1803) published a long response to Hume entitled An Essay on the Nature and Immutability of Truth, in Opposition to Sophistry and Scepticism. The essay was a 300 page best seller, which, most commentators agree, was unfair in many respects to Hume. As was his practice, Hume never made an effort to answer Beattie in public; in correspondence, however, Hume referred to Beattie as that “bigoted silly fellow.”[7]

Despite the general weakness of many of his arguments Beattie does offer an interesting pragmatic moral objection to Hume’s attack on religious belief:

…they perhaps have little need, and little relish, for the consolations of religion. But let them know that, in the solitary scenes of life, there is many an honest and tender heart pining with incurable anguish, pierced with the sharpest sting of disappointment, bereft of friends, chilled with poverty, racked with disease, scourged by the oppressor; whom nothing but trust in Providence, and the hope of a future retribution, could preserve from the agonies of despair. And do they, with sacrilegious hands, attempt to violate this last refuge of the miserable, and to rob them of the only comfort that had survived the ravages of the misfortune, malice, and tyranny! Did it ever happen, that the influence of their execrable tenets disturbed the tranquility of virtuous retirement, deepened the gloom of human distress, or aggravated the horrors of the grave? Is it possible that this may have happened in many instances? Is it probable that this hath happened, or may happen, in one single instance? – ye traitors to human kind, how can ye answer for it to your own hearts? (Beattie 1776, 322–23).

Beattie argues that Hume’s clear cutting of the theistic forest in his attack on the credibility of miracle reports, his criticism of the design argument, and his attack on the cosmological argument resulted in a desolated landscape that does a serious disservice to humankind. Since in some cases, Beattie contends, despair flows from the loss of faith. And he assumes that no justifying good exists for Hume to risk causing despair.

Let’s understand desolation as a profound sense of hopelessness and purposelessness. Beattie believed that Christian belief provided consolation, especially to those suffering or oppressed. His argument might be reconstructed as there exists a person S, such that:

  1. Theistic belief provides the great good of consolation for S. And,
  2. S cannot receive a comparable good from any other source. And,
  3. The deprivation of this good is a significant loss for S. So,
  4. Depriving S of the great good of theistic belief renders S significantly worse-off. And,
  5. It is wrong to render someone worse-off without compensation. And,
  6. Public atheistic attacks provide S with no sufficient compensation. Therefore,
  7. Public atheistic attacks are wrong.

While Hume never directly responded to Beattie’s Consolation Argument, Mill had it (or something very much like it in mind) when he wrote:

That what is called the consoling nature of an opinion, that is, the pleasure we should have in believing it to be true, can be a ground for believing it, is a doctrine irrational in itself and which would sanction half the mischievous illusions recorded in history or which mislead individual life. (Mill 1874, 204)

This is an odd objection coming from one who argued in Utilitarianism “actions are right in proportion as they tend to promote happiness, wrong as they tend to produce the reverse of happiness.” If the sole criterion of action is the production of happiness, and if forming a belief is an action, then it is hard to see what answer could be lodged against Beattie’s Consolation Argument (or at least some argument very much like it).[8] If happiness and consolation are irrelevant, and if Clifford’s Rule that “it is wrong always, everywhere, and for any one, to believe anything upon insufficient evidence” is correct, then Beattie’s consolation argument can be rejected as being itself an immoral subornation.[9]

An argument similar to Beattie’s consolation argument is found in a suggestive passage of John Henry Newman’s 1870 An Essay in Aid of A Grammar of Assent, famously known as the “factory girl” argument. Newman (1801–1890) did not formulate the “factory girl” argument as a pragmatic argument, but the argument certainly lends itself to such a formulation:

Montaigne was endowed with a good estate, health, leisure and an easy temper, literary tastes, and a sufficiency of books; he could afford thus to play with life, and the abysses into which it leads us. Let us take a case in contrast.

“I think”, says the poor dying factory-girl in the tale, “if this should be the end of all, and if all I have been born for is just to work my heart and life away, and to sicken in this dree place, with those mill-stones in my ears forever, until I could scream out for them to stop and let me have a little piece of quiet, and with the fluff filling my lungs, until I thirst to death for one long deep breath of the clear air, and my mother gone, and I never able to tell her again how I loved her, and of all my troubles, – I think, if this life is the end, and that there is no God to wipe away all tears from all eyes, I could go mad!”

Here is an argument for the immortality of the soul (Newman 1870, 299–300).

This argument lends itself easily to a pragmatic cast since it places great weight on the idea that certain human needs support the rational and moral legitimacy of religious belief:

  1. We have existential needs – a need for a deep meaning in life, a need for hope, a need for cosmic security, a need for consolation from despair – which are necessary for our well-being. And,
  2. Belief in God satisfies these existential needs. So,
  3. Belief in God is overall justified.

This sort of argument faces many questions and issues that we cannot explore here. Among these issues and questions are: suppose that one, morally and rationally, may satisfy a need, it does not follow that one can satisfy that need in any old way. Some ways of satisfying a need are permissible while others are not. Is belief in God a permissible way? Do humans in fact have the alleged needs? Is belief in God the only feasible way to satisfy those needs? See Williams 2011 for further discussion.

6. Pragmatic Arguments and Meaning in Life

A popular pragmatic argument in support of theistic belief is built upon a saying erroneously attributed to Pascal that humans have a god-shaped hole in their hearts that can be filled only by committing to God. Any finite filler will prove futile, pernicious or hollow. While Pascal nowhere mentions a god-shaped hole, in fragment 148 of the Pensées, he argues that,

All men seek happiness. There are no exceptions. … Yet for very many years no one without faith has ever reached the goal at which everyone is continually aiming. … A test which has gone on so long, without pause or change, really ought to convince us that we are incapable of attaining the good by own efforts.

… What else does this craving, and this helplessness, proclaim but that there was once in man a true happiness, of which all that now remains is the empty print and trace? This he tries in vain to fill with everything around him, seeking in things that are not there the help he cannot find in those that are, though none can help, since this infinite abyss can be filled only with an infinite and immutable object; in other words by God himself. (Pascal)

The argument suggested in fragment #148 is that faith in God alone provides happiness, as theistic commitment alone results in happiness; while all other causes and commitments are chimera too small to fill the hole in our lives. While Pascal wrote of happiness, his argument might be re-focused toward meaning in life, perhaps by arguing that a genuinely or truly happy life will be a meaningful life. Would the existence of God make our lives meaningful? In this context “meaning in life” is a life that makes a positive objective difference in the world. As we have seen, a pragmatic argument in support of doing a particular action conforms to the general scheme that:

  1. Doing α brings about, or contributes in bringing about, β, and
  2. It is in your interest that β obtain. So,
  3. You have reason to do α.

Some have contended that inculcating a theistic commitment plays a vital role in bringing about meaning in one’s life, whether as a sufficient condition or as an enhancement (for discussion see Metz, 2019, and see Mawson, 2019). The view that a theistic commitment is required for meaning in life is voiced by W.L. Craig with his claim that:

If God does not exist, then both man and the universe are inevitably doomed to death. Man, like all biological organisms, must die. With no hope of immortality, man’s life leads only to the grave. His life is but a spark in the infinite darkness, a spark that appears, flickers, and dies forever… If God exists, then there is hope for man. But if God does not exist, then all we are left with is despair. …if God does not exist, then life is objectively meaningless; but man cannot live consistently and happily knowing that life is meaningless… If God does not exist, then life is futile. If the God of the Bible does exist, then life is meaningful. Only the second of these two alternatives enables us to live happily and consistently. Therefore, it seems to me that even if the evidence for these two options were absolutely equal, a rational person ought to choose biblical Christianity. It seems to me positively irrational to prefer death, futility, and destruction to life, meaningfulness, and happiness. As Pascal said, we have nothing to lose and infinity to gain. (Craig 2013)

An argument hinted at in the passage above might be reconstructed as:

  1. A human life has objective meaning only if that life is unending. And,
  2. An unending human life – immortality – is meaningful only if God provides a purpose or point to that life. And,
  3. Immortality would not be surprising if God exists. So,
  4. Human life has objective meaning only if God exists. And,
  5. There are no dispositive reasons to deny Theism. And,
  6. The value associated with one’s life being meaningful is very great. So,
  7. One has pragmatic reason to cultivate a theistic commitment.

This argument rests on several controversial assumptions. For one, the argument assumes that a divine conferral of purpose is necessary for one’s life to have meaning and purpose. Presumably, the idea is that a self-conferral of purpose would be arbitrary and limited by human ignorance or uncertainty as to what is genuinely worthwhile. A conferral by God, however, would not be arbitrary as God would confer only a purpose that is objectively worthwhile. Another assumption is that objective meaning in life requires immorality. One might respond that this assumption neglects that increasing the balance of objective value (good) to disvalue (evil) can make a real difference in the world, even if one lacks immortality. The actions of Lincoln made the world better than it would have been absent those actions. Arguably, then, Lincoln’s life had meaning. More generally, the achievement of good works, or the mitigation of suffering and pain, might be ways that an objective positive difference results from one’s actions. Here is where the stipulation of immortality is supposed to play a role – if one knows that one’s achievements are like footprints on a beach, which the tides of time will eventually sweep away, a sense of futility is, one might argue, unavoidable, whether we admit this or not. Immortality is supposed to ensure, along with the divine conferral of purpose, a permanence which evades futility. Finally, note that premise (31) is particularly contentious, as some would argue that the problem of evil, the problem of divine hiddenness, or the lack of evidence supporting Theism, for examples, puts Theism beyond the rational pale.

While Craig holds that God and immortality are required for meaning in life, one could argue that even if not strictly necessary, immortality and God would enhance the value and meaning of one’s life and that prospective enhancement is reason sufficient to hope that God exists and for human immortality. All else being equal, if one’s achievements were to have an eternal positive effect that does seem more valuable than if they had a limited effect. Is hope motivated by pragmatic reasons a sufficient basis upon which to erect the superstructure of theistic commitment? With this question, we are back to issues concerning the permissibility of hope. There are those who argue that the existence of God would render the world worse-off than if God did not exist. That we should hope that this is not a God created universe. For example, see Kahane 2011, and the last section of this entry for a discussion.

7. The Ethics of Belief

Clifford’s Rule is a vivid presentation of an influential and long tradition in philosophy that carries the name of Evidentialism. We can understand Evidentialism as the thesis that:

For all persons S and propositions p and times t, S ought to believe that p at t if and only if believing p fits S’s evidence at t.

Clearly enough, pragmatic arguments run afoul of (E), since pragmatic arguments are employed either when the evidence is inconclusive, or it is conclusively adverse. Consider the latter case first. Earlier it was mentioned that Pascal’s Wager is the most famous example of a theistic pragmatic argument. Pascal in fact has not one version of the Wager in his Pensées (1660) but four. The third version of the Wager is what Ian Hacking (1972) entitles the “Argument from Dominating Expectation,” and it employs the Expectation rule. We can represent it by letting p stand for a positive probability greater than zero and less than one-half, and letting EU stand for “expected utility,” and employing F2–F4 as finite values:

God exists
~(God exists)
Believe p, ∞ 1 − p, F2 EU = ∞
~(Believe) p, F3 1 − p, F4 EU = finite value

No matter how unlikely it is that God exists, as long as there is some positive non-zero probability that he does, believing is one’s best bet:

  1. For any person S, and alternatives α and β available to S, if the expected utility of α exceeds that of β, S should choose α. And,
  2. Believing in God carries more expected utility than does not believing. Therefore,
  3. One should believe in God.

Because of its ingenious employment of infinite utility, the third version has become what most philosophers think of as Pascal’s Wager. The appeal of the third version for theistic apologists is its ready employment as a worst-case device. Suppose there were a strong improbability argument for atheism. With the third version the theist has an escape: it can still be rational to believe, even if the belief is itself unreasonable, since inculcating theistic belief is an action with an infinite expected utility. This use as a worst-case device is something like a trump card that can be thrown down defeating what had appeared as a stronger hand. Pascal’s third version clearly violates (E).

Now consider James’s Will to Believe argument. As we saw, James’s contention is that any hypothesis that’s part of a genuine option, and that’s intellectually open, may be believed, even in the absence of sufficient evidence. No rule of morality or rationality, James argues, is violated if one accepts a hypothesis that’s genuine and open. If James is correct, then (E) should be replaced with:

For all persons S and propositions p and times t, if believing p fits S’s evidence at t, then S ought to believe that p at t.

According to (E′) if the evidence is adequate, then the question is settled. If there’s a preponderance of support for p, then one is required to believe p. Where the evidence speaks, one must listen and obey. (E′) differs from (E) in part since it says nothing about those occasions in which the evidence is silent, or is inadequate. If one assigns p a probability of one-half, then there’s not a preponderance of evidence in support of p. (E′) says nothing about believing p in that case. Principle (E), on the other hand, forbids believing p in that case. While a proponent of theistic pragmatic arguments cannot swear allegiance to (E), she can, clearly enough, adhere to (E′). Let’s call (E) Strong Evidentialism, and (E′) Weak Evidentialism. So, an employer of theistic pragmatic arguments can conform to Weak Evidentialism, but not Strong Evidentialism.

Is there a good reason to prefer Weak Evidentialism to Strong (in addition to James’s argument)? A promising argument in support of the moral and rational permissibility of employing pragmatic reasons in belief-formation is erected upon the base of what we might call the Duty Argument (or perhaps more precisely, the Duty Argument scheme):

  1. It is necessary that (no one is (overall) irrational in doing what he’s morally obligated to do). And,
  2. It is possible that (doing α is a moral obligation). So,
  3. It is possible that (doing α is (overall) rational).

The Duty Argument employs the box and diamond in the standard fashion as operators for, respectively, conceptual necessity and possibility. The alpha is just a placeholder for actions, or kinds of actions. The locution “(overall) rational” or “(overall) irrational” presupposes that there are various kinds of rationality, including moral rationality, epistemic rationality, and prudential rationality.[10] The idea that there are various kinds of rationality, or put any way, that one can be under conflicting obligations at a particular time, recognizes that dilemmas are possible. One can be obligated to do various things even when it’s not possible to do all of them. Overall rationality is the all-things-considered perspective. It is what one ultimately should do, having taken into account the various obligations one is under at a particular time. Overall rationality, or all-things-considered rationality (ATC rationality), is, in W.D. Ross’s terms, one’s actual duty in the particular circumstances, even if one has other conflicting prima facie duties. The Duty Argument can be formulated without presupposing that there are various kinds of rationality, by replacing the principle that no one is ever irrational in doing her moral duty, with the principle that moral obligations take precedence whenever a dilemma of obligations occurs. In any case the Duty Argument assumes that if in doing something one is not ATC irrational, then it follows that one is ATC rational in doing it.

The relevance of the Duty Argument is this. The action of forming and sustaining a belief upon pragmatic grounds can replace α. That is, pragmatic belief formation could be one’s moral duty. Consider the following four cases in which pragmatic belief formation is, arguably, morally required:

Devious ETs: Suppose you are abducted by very powerful and advanced extraterrestrials, who demonstrate their intent and power to destroy the Earth. Moreover, these fiendish ETs offer but one chance of salvation for humankind – you acquire and maintain a belief for which you lack adequate evidence. You adroitly point out that you cannot just will such a belief, especially since you know of no good reason to think it true. Devilish in their anticipation and in their technology, the ETs produce a device that can directly produce the requisite belief in willing subjects, a serum, say, or a supply of one-a-day doxastic-producing pills. It is clear that you would do no wrong by swallowing a pill or injecting the serum, and, hence, bringing about and maintaining belief in a proposition for which you lack adequate evidence, done to save humankind. Indeed, it is clear that you are in fact obligated to bring about the requisite belief, even though you lack adequate evidence for it.

Pain case: Jones knows that expecting an event to be painful is strongly correlated with an increase in the intensity of felt pain (as opposed to having no expectation, or expecting the event to be relatively painless). Jones is about to have a boil lanced, and believing that she is obligated to minimize pain, she forms the belief that the procedure will be painless. She does so even though she lacks evidence that such procedures are in fact typically painless. Because of her action, the event is in fact less painful than it would otherwise have been.

Small child: Suppose you are the parent or custodian of a small child, who has been hurt. You know that studies support the thesis that the felt pain reported by patients is typically higher in cases in which the patient expected the event to be painful than in cases where the patient did not have that expectation. You have no idea about the relative pain associated with a particular medical procedure that the child is about undergo. The child asks you if the procedure will be painful. Desiring to lower the pain the child will feel, you tell the child that the procedure will not hurt, hoping that the child will form a belief not supported by the evidence, but thereby lowering the child’s felt pain.

Doctor case: Dr. Jones knows that the prognosis for Smith’s recovery is poor, but if she acts on that knowledge by telling Smith of his poor prognosis, she may well strip Smith of hope. Jones believes that maintaining hope is vital for quality of life. Overall, Jones decides it is better not to inform Smith just how poor the prognosis is and she does not disabuse Smith of her evidentially unsupported belief.

These four cases provide possible scenarios in which pragmatic belief formation, or suborning pragmatic belief formation in others, is morally required.

Although controversial, the Duty Argument, if sound, would provide good reason for thinking that there are occasions in which it is permissible, both rationally and morally, to form beliefs based upon pragmatic reasons even in the absence of adequate evidence. If the Duty Argument is sound, then (E) is false.

The Duty Argument presupposes that there are various kinds of rationality. Many Evidentialists, as well as many opponents of Evidentialism, also assume that there are various kinds of rationality. What if however there is only one kind or standard of rationality? What impact would that have on the debate? Susanna Rinard argues that it is best to reject the idea that there are various kinds or standards of rationality, and replace that idea with an equal treatment idea that all states – whether doxastic or not – face a single standard of rationality (Rinard 2017). Equal treatment of states – states like carrying an umbrella, or walking the dog, or voting for this candidate over that, or forming a belief in God – provides greater theoretical simplicity than does the idea that there are various standards or kinds of rationality. Equal Treatment also better explains the methodological attraction of simplicity in science than does the idea that there are various kinds of rationality, Rinard argues. If the equal treatment of all states idea is correct, then doxastic states would face the same standard of rationality as states of action. The Equal Treatment idea provides an additional objection to Evidentialism insofar as Evidentialism implies that beliefs are subject to one standard, while other states are subject to another standard.

Whether it is via Rinard’s Equal Treatment argument, or the Duty Argument, there is, arguably, good reason to reject Evidentialism.

8. Pragmatic Arguments and Belief

The idea that persons can voluntarily and directly choose what to believe is called “Doxastic Voluntarism”. According to Doxastic Voluntarism, believing is a direct act of the will, with many of the propositions we believe under our immediate control. A basic action is an action that a person intentionally does, without doing any other action. Jones’ moving of her finger is a basic action, since she need not perform any other action to accomplish it. Her handing the book from Smith to Brown is not basic, since she must intentionally do several things to accomplish it. According to Doxastic Voluntarism, some of our belief acquisitions are basic actions. We can will, directly and voluntarily, what to believe and the beliefs thereby acquired are freely obtained and are not forced upon us. In short, one can believe at will. The proponent of Doxastic Voluntarism need not hold that every proposition is a candidate for direct acquisition, as long as she holds that there are some propositions belief in which is under our direct control.

It is widely thought that Doxastic Voluntarism is implausible. Opponents of Doxastic Voluntarism can present a simple experiment against it: survey various propositions that you do not currently believe, and see if any lend themselves, directly and immediately, by a basic act of the will, to belief. Certainly there are some beliefs that one can easily cause oneself to have. Consider the proposition that I am now holding a pencil. I can cause myself to believe that by simply picking up a pencil. Or more generally, any proposition about my own basic actions I can easily enough believe by performing the action. But my coming to believe is by means of some other basic action. Since I lack direct control over what I believe, and there’s no reason to think that my lacking in this regard is singular, Doxastic Voluntarism is implausible. Does the implausibility of Doxastic Voluntarism show that pragmatic belief-formation is also implausible?

Not at all: think of Pascal’s advice to act as if one already believes (by going to masses and by imitating the faithful) as a way of inculcating belief. Pragmatic belief-formation neither entails nor presupposes Doxastic Voluntarism. As long as there is indirect control, or roundabout control, over the acquisition and maintenance of beliefs, pragmatic belief-formation is possible. What constitutes indirect control over the acquisition of beliefs? Consider actions such as entertaining a proposition, or ignoring a proposition, or critically inquiring into the plausibility of this idea or that, or accepting a proposition. Each of these involves a propositional attitude, the adoption of which is under our direct control. Indirect control occurs since accepting a proposition, say, or acting as if a proposition were true, very often results in believing that proposition. Insofar as there is a causal connection between the propositional attitudes we adopt, and the beliefs that are thereby generated, we can be said to have exercised indirect, or roundabout, control over belief-formation.

One objection to the foregoing is that pragmatic arguments are, by and large, pointless because beliefs are, by their very nature, psychological states that aim for truth. That is, whenever one believes a proposition, one is disposed to feel that that proposition is probably the case. A person ordinarily cannot believe a proposition that she takes to have a probability of less than one-half or whose probability is uncertain since such propositional attitudes do not aim for truth. The upshot of this objection is that strong evidentialism is unavoidable.

If it is true, as this objection holds, that believing a proposition ordinarily involves being disposed to feel that the proposition is the case then it does appear at first blush that pragmatic belief-formation, as such, is ineffectual. But all that follows from this fact, if such it be, is that some sort of belief-inducing technology will be necessary in order to facilitate the acquisition of a proposition that is pragmatically supported. Now it is true that the most readily available belief-inducing technologies – selectively using the evidence for instance – all involve a degree of self-deception, since one ordinarily cannot attend only to the favorable evidence in support of a particular proposition while neglecting the adverse evidence arrayed against it and, being conscious of all this, expect that one will acquire that belief. The fact that self-deception is a vital feature of the readily available belief-formation technologies leads to another objection.

This second objection is that willfully engaging in self-deception renders pragmatic belief-formation morally problematic and rationally suspect, since willfully engaging in self-deception is the deliberate worsening of one’s epistemic situation. It is morally and rationally problematic to engage in pragmatic belief-formation, insofar as belief-formation involves self-deception.

This second objection is powerful if sound, but we must be careful here. First, while self-deception may be a serious problem with regard to inculcating a belief which one takes to be false, it does not seem to be a serious threat involving the inculcation of a belief which one thinks has as much evidence in its favor as against it, nor does it seem to be a threat when one takes the probability of the proposition to be indeterminate, since one could form the belief knowing full well the evidential situation. Even if it is true that believing that p is being disposed to feel that p is the case, it does not follow that believing that p involves being disposed to feel that p is the case based on the evidence at hand. Second, this is an objection not to pragmatic belief-formation per se, but an objection to pragmatic belief-formation that involves self-deception. Although it may be true that the employment of self-deceptive belief-inducing technologies is morally and rationally problematic, this objection says nothing about those belief-inducing technologies that do not involve self-deception. If there are belief-inducing technologies which are free of self-deception and which could generate a belief on the basis of a pragmatic reason, then this objection fails.[11]

Is there a belief-inducing technology available that does not involve self-deception? There is. Notice first there are two sorts of belief-inducing technologies distinguishable: “low-tech” technologies and “high-tech” ones. Low-tech technologies consist of propositional attitudes only, while high-tech ones employ nonpropositional techniques along with various propositional attitudes. The nonpropositional techniques could include actions like acting as if a certain proposition were true, and morally questionable ones like hypnosis, or indoctrination, or subliminal suggestion. Consider a technology consisting of two components, the first of which is the acceptance of a proposition, while the second is a behavioral regimen of acting on that acceptance. Accepting a proposition, unlike believing, is an action that is characterized, in part, by one’s assenting to the proposition, whether one believes it or not. One accepts a proposition, when she assents to its truth and employs it as a premise in her deliberations. One can accept a proposition that one does not believe. Indeed, we do this much of the time. For example, think of the gambler’s fallacy. One might be disposed to believe that the next toss of the fair coin must come up Tails, since it has been Heads on the previous seven tosses. Nevertheless, one ought not to accept that the next toss of a fair coin must come up Tails, or that the probability that it will is greater than one-half. Acceptance, we should remember, unlike believing, is an action that is under our direct control.

If one accepts a proposition, then one can also act upon the proposition. Acting upon a proposition is behaving as though it were true. The two-step regimen of accepting a proposition and then acting upon it is a common way of generating belief in that proposition. And, importantly, there is no hint of self-deception tainting the process.

One might object that employing a belief-inducing technology at all, whether low or high tech, is enough to entangle one in issues implicating the rationality of the belief induced (see, for instance, Garber 2009). A friend of the pragmatic, however, might argue that that this objection presupposes Strong Evidentialism, and arguments found in William James, the Duty argument, the Equal Treatment argument, have already provided a dispositive ruling on that issue.

9. Atheistic Pragmatic Arguments

While not as common as theistic arguments, there have been atheistic pragmatic arguments offered from time to time. These arguments often arise within the context of a purported naturalistic explanation of the occurrence of religious belief and practice. Perhaps the earliest proponent of an atheistic pragmatic argument was David Hume (1711–1776). In chapter X of his 1757 The Natural History of Religion, Hume wrote:

Where the deity is presented as infinitely superior to mankind, this belief … is apt, when joined with superstitious terrors, to sink the human mind into the lowest submission and abasement …

The idea of Hume’s argument here and elsewhere in his writings (see for instance Dialogue XII of his Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, and appendix IV of the second Enquiry) is that theism, or at least theism of the popular sort – that conjoined with “superstitious terrors,” degrades individual morality, thereby devaluing human existence. Theistic belief, Hume contended, inculcates the “monkish virtues of mortification, penance, humility, and passive suffering, as the only qualities which are acceptable…” But not only does theistic belief harm individual morality, according to Hume, it also harms public morality. In chapter IX, Hume suggested that theism (again he qualifies by writing of the “corruptions of theism”) leads to intolerance and persecution.

Another atheistic pragmatic argument is that of Sigmund Freud (1856–1939), who in The Future of an Illusion (1927) contends that religious belief perpetuates psychological immaturity among individuals, and cultural immaturity on the social level. To make sense of Freud’s argument requires knowing that he employed the term “illusion” in an idiosyncratic way. An illusion in the Freudian sense is a belief that is caused by and in turn satisfies a deep psychological need or longing. Illusions are not held rationally. Illusions stick even in the absence of any supporting evidence. Indeed, according to Freud, they stick even in the face of strong contra-evidence. An illusion could be true, but often they are not. Delusions are false illusions. Religious belief Freud thought was an illusion. While it may have been a beneficial illusion at an earlier time, it no longer is. The religious illusion now, Freud asserted, inhibits scientific progress, and causes psychological neuroses, among its other pernicious effects.

Another atheistic pragmatic argument is Richard Dawkins’s contention that religious belief is a “virus of the mind” (Dawkins 1993). One is religious, according to Dawkins, because one has been infected by a faith meme. A meme is Dawkins’s imaginative construct, which he describes as a bit of information, manifested in behavior, and which can be copied from one person to another. Like genes, memes are self-replicating vehicles, jumping from mind to mind. One catches a meme by exposure to another who is infected. Dawkins claims that the faith meme has the following traits:

The faith meme seems to the person as true, or right, or virtuous, though this conviction in fact owes nothing to evidence or reason.
The faith meme makes a virtue out of believing in spite of there being no evidence.
The faith meme encourages intolerant behavior towards those who possess rival faiths.
The faith meme arises not because of evidence but because of epidemiology; typically, if one has a faith, it is the same as one’s parents and as one’s grandparents.

Dawkins’s meme idea, and his dismissal of faith as a virus of the mind, is both a purported naturalistic explanation of religious belief and a pragmatic dismissal of it as a harmful phenomenon.

A contemporary atheistic pragmatic argument is that the existence of God would make the world far worse in some respects than would be the case if God did not exist, even if it did not make the world worse overall (Kahane 2011). As Kahane notes, if God were to exist, then a full understanding of reality by humans, may in-principle be unachievable. Additionally, if God were to exist, moral autonomy may be limited, since humans, as creatures, might be subordinate to God’s demands, including demands for worship, obedience, and allegiance. Finally, if God were to exist, complete privacy may be lost, as an omniscient being could, presumably, know one’s thoughts and attitudes.

Kahane’s intricate argument is counter to the conventional view that God’s existence is something that all should hope for, since this world would, arguably, be the best or among the best of all possible worlds if God were to exist. Even so, Kahane argues that one could rationally prefer that God not exist. The argument involves a distinction between evaluations from an impersonal viewpoint, and from a personal viewpoint. It is the latter, which proves the most promising for the argument as Kahane contends that the existence of God could undermine the meaning generating life-projects of some. If his argument is sound, Kahane has provided a kind of atheistic pragmatic argument that one could prefer that God not exist, even if God’s existence would render the world better overall than it otherwise would be.

Much of Kahane’s argument consists of comparisons between possible worlds in which God exists (“Godly worlds”), and those in which God does not exist (“Godless worlds”). The modal reliability of these comparisons is far from obvious, since God is standardly seen as a necessarily existing being. For a critical examination of Kahane’s arguments, see Kraay 2013.


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