Supplement to Preferences

The Strong Axiom of Revealed Preference

The fifth and strongest of the properties of a choice function is the so-called strong axiom of revealed preferences (SARP). In essence, SARP is a recursive closure of WARP:

If
X1,X2, …, XnA1,
X2, …, XnA2,
…,
Xn-1,XnAn−1,
XnAn, and
X1C(A1), X2C(A2), …, XnC(An),

then

for all B with X1,X2,…,XnB, if XiC(B), i∈{1,…,n},
then X1,X2,…,Xi−1C(B)    (SARP)

Simplified, SARP says that if from a set of alternatives A1, X is chosen when Y and Z are available, and if in some other set of alternatives A2, Y is chosen while Z is available, then there can be no set of alternatives containing alternatives X and Z for which Z is chosen and X is not. (SARP says this for chains of unlimited length). SARP is much stronger than α, β and γ combined. However, for choice functions that specify choices over all subsets of the alternative set with at most three elements, SARP is equivalent to WARP and hence to properties α and β (Sen 1971, 50).

Second Construction Method

A second construction method defines an alternative X as “at least as good as” an alternative Y if and only if X is chosen from the binary set that contains Y.

XBY iff XC({X,Y}) (2)
XBY iff XBY and not YBX
XBY iff XBY and YBX

If the choice function is defined over all binary subsets of a set of alternatives, ≽B is complete. However, ≽B does not necessarily satisfy transitivity of strict preference, transitivity of indifference, IP- or PI-transitivity.

A third method defines an alternative X as “strictly preferred to” an alternative Y if and only if X is chosen from some set of alternatives that also contains Y, but Y is not chosen from that set.

XRY iff for some B, XC(B) and Y∈[B\C(B)] (3)
XRY iff not XRY
XRY iff XRY and YRX

If the choice function is defined over all relevant subsets of the set of alternatives, ≽R is always complete. However, ≻R may violate transitivity of strict preference, and ≽R may violate transitivity of indifference, IP- or PI-transitivity.

In constructing ≽B, if C({X,Y})={X,Y}, then indifference holds, i.e. XBY. However, this is not the only possible interpretation. One can interpret C({X,Y})={X,Y} either as an indifference between X and Y or as incomparability between these two alternatives. Extra information is required to distinguish the two. One possibility of obtaining such extra information is the small improvement argument (Chang 1997, 23-26). When observing an agent choosing C({X,Y}) = {X,Y}, the observer makes the agent repeat the choice, now with an offer of a small independent incentive i attached to one of the alternatives. If the agent chooses C({Xi,Y}) = {Xi}, the observer may conclude that the agent was indifferent between X and Y, and that the addition of i to X shifted the balance to Xi over Y. If the agent however chooses C({Xi,Y}) = {Xi,Y}, then the observer may conclude that X and Y were incomparable for the agent, and that the addition of i to X did not alter X's incomparability to Y. Because the agent's evaluation of i is presupposed, this method is not uncontroversial.

The elicitation of preferences through choices is of particular importance in economics, where prices and choices of large groups of agents are often the only available empirical data. The revealed preference method proceeds in two steps. In the first step, an agent's observed choice of a goods bundle Xi = ⟨x1,…,xn⟩ in combination with the prices Pi = ⟨p1,…,pn⟩ for these goods determine the set of alternatives from which the agent chooses. If the agent chooses Xi = ⟨xi1,…,xin⟩ under prices Pi = ⟨pi1,…,pin⟩, her budget is B = Xi × Pi = ⟨xi1,…,xin⟩ × ⟨pi1,…,pin⟩, assuming that she spends all her resources. Under price regime Pi, she can thus choose between all goods bundles Xj that are affordable under the budget B, i.e. for which BXj × Pi. In the second step, preference construction method (1) is applied. If the agent is observed choosing bundle Xi from budget B, then Xi is declared weakly preferred to all Xj affordable under B. The revealed preference connection, in accord with method (1), is then formulated as:

XiCXj if and only if Xi × PiXj × Pi
XCY iff XCY and not YCX
XCY iff XCY and YCX

It may be the case that an agent chooses Xi under prices Pi and Xj under prices Pj, even though Xi × PiXj × Pi and Xj × PjXi × Pj. The revealed preference method then elicits XiCXj and XjCXi, which violates asymmetry of strict preference. To avoid this undesirable conclusion, only those choices are considered that satisfy the Weak Axiom of Revealed Preferences (WARP). It says that if X is chosen when Y is available, then there can be no budget set containing both alternatives for which Y is chosen and X is not (see section 5.1). Thus, asymmetry of ≻C is secured.

As discussed in section 5.1, for situations that specify choices over all subsets (up to three elements) of the alternative set, WARP also ensures that the relation ≽C is transitive. For practical purposes, however, this method is not very helpful, as the space of prices and goods bundles is very large. Social scientists do not have the resources to observe agents' choices from all relevant preference sets. If they want to derive a transitive preference relation from a choice function not defined over all subsets (up to three elements), then they have to restrict themselves to consider only choices that satisfy the strong axiom of revealed preferences (SARP). It says that if X is chosen when Y is available, and if in some other budget set Y is chosen when Z is available, then there can be no budget set containing alternatives X and Z for which Z is chosen and X is not. Thus, transitivity of ≽C is ensured.

Copyright © 2017 by
Sven Ove Hansson <soh@kth.se>
Till Grüne-Yanoff <gryne@kth.se>

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