Supplement to Preferences
The Strong Axiom of Revealed Preference
The fifth and strongest of the properties of a choice function is the so-called strong axiom of revealed preferences (SARP). In essence, SARP is a recursive closure of WARP:
IfX_{1},X_{2}, …, X_{n}∈A_{1},
X_{2}, …, X_{n}∈A_{2},
…,
X_{n-1},X_{n}∈A_{n−1},
X_{n}∈A_{n}, and
X_{1}∈C(A_{1}), X_{2}∈C(A_{2}), …, X_{n}∈C(A_{n}),then
for all B with X_{1},X_{2},…,X_{n}∈B, if X_{i}∈C(B), i∈{1,…,n},then X_{1},X_{2},…,X_{i−1}∈C(B) (SARP)
Simplified, SARP says that if from a set of alternatives A_{1}, X is chosen when Y and Z are available, and if in some other set of alternatives A_{2}, Y is chosen while Z is available, then there can be no set of alternatives containing alternatives X and Z for which Z is chosen and X is not. (SARP says this for chains of unlimited length). SARP is much stronger than α, β and γ combined. However, for choice functions that specify choices over all subsets of the alternative set with at most three elements, SARP is equivalent to WARP and hence to properties α and β (Sen 1971, 50).
Second Construction Method
A second construction method defines an alternative X as “at least as good as” an alternative Y if and only if X is chosen from the binary set that contains Y.
X≽^{B}Y iff X∈C({X,Y}) | (2) |
X≻^{B}Y iff X≽^{B}Y and not Y≽^{B}X | |
X∼^{B}Y iff X≽^{B}Y and Y≽^{B}X |
If the choice function is defined over all binary subsets of a set of alternatives, ≽^{B} is complete. However, ≽^{B} does not necessarily satisfy transitivity of strict preference, transitivity of indifference, IP- or PI-transitivity.
A third method defines an alternative X as “strictly preferred to” an alternative Y if and only if X is chosen from some set of alternatives that also contains Y, but Y is not chosen from that set.
X≻^{R}Y iff for some B, X∈C(B) and Y∈[B\C(B)] | (3) |
X≽^{R}Y iff not X≻^{R}Y | |
X∼^{R}Y iff X≽^{R}Y and Y≽^{R}X |
If the choice function is defined over all relevant subsets of the set of alternatives, ≽^{R} is always complete. However, ≻^{R} may violate transitivity of strict preference, and ≽^{R} may violate transitivity of indifference, IP- or PI-transitivity.
In constructing ≽^{B}, if C({X,Y})={X,Y}, then indifference holds, i.e. X∼^{B}Y. However, this is not the only possible interpretation. One can interpret C({X,Y})={X,Y} either as an indifference between X and Y or as incomparability between these two alternatives. Extra information is required to distinguish the two. One possibility of obtaining such extra information is the small improvement argument (Chang 1997, 23-26). When observing an agent choosing C({X,Y}) = {X,Y}, the observer makes the agent repeat the choice, now with an offer of a small independent incentive i attached to one of the alternatives. If the agent chooses C({X∧i,Y}) = {X∧i}, the observer may conclude that the agent was indifferent between X and Y, and that the addition of i to X shifted the balance to X ∧i over Y. If the agent however chooses C({X∧i,Y}) = {X∧i,Y}, then the observer may conclude that X and Y were incomparable for the agent, and that the addition of i to X did not alter X's incomparability to Y. Because the agent's evaluation of i is presupposed, this method is not uncontroversial.
The elicitation of preferences through choices is of particular importance in economics, where prices and choices of large groups of agents are often the only available empirical data. The revealed preference method proceeds in two steps. In the first step, an agent's observed choice of a goods bundle X_{i} = ⟨x_{1},…,x_{n}⟩ in combination with the prices P_{i} = ⟨p_{1},…,p_{n}⟩ for these goods determine the set of alternatives from which the agent chooses. If the agent chooses X_{i} = ⟨x_{i1},…,x_{in}⟩ under prices P_{i} = ⟨p_{i1},…,p_{in}⟩, her budget is B = X_{i} × P_{i} = ⟨x_{i1},…,x_{in}⟩ × ⟨p_{i1},…,p_{in}⟩, assuming that she spends all her resources. Under price regime P_{i}, she can thus choose between all goods bundles X_{j} that are affordable under the budget B, i.e. for which B ≥ X_{j} × P_{i}. In the second step, preference construction method (1) is applied. If the agent is observed choosing bundle X_{i} from budget B, then X_{i} is declared weakly preferred to all X_{j} affordable under B. The revealed preference connection, in accord with method (1), is then formulated as:
X_{i}≽^{C}X_{j} if and only if X_{i} × P_{i} ≥ X_{j} × P_{i}
X≻^{C}Y iff X≽^{C}Y and not Y≽^{C}X
X∼^{C}Y iff X≽^{C}Y and Y≽^{C}X
It may be the case that an agent chooses X_{i} under prices P_{i} and X_{j} under prices P_{j}, even though X_{i} × P_{i} ≥ X_{j} × P_{i} and X_{j} × P_{j} ≥ X_{i} × P_{j}. The revealed preference method then elicits X_{i}≻^{C}X_{j} and X_{j}≻^{C}X_{i}, which violates asymmetry of strict preference. To avoid this undesirable conclusion, only those choices are considered that satisfy the Weak Axiom of Revealed Preferences (WARP). It says that if X is chosen when Y is available, then there can be no budget set containing both alternatives for which Y is chosen and X is not (see section 5.1). Thus, asymmetry of ≻^{C} is secured.
As discussed in section 5.1, for situations that specify choices over all subsets (up to three elements) of the alternative set, WARP also ensures that the relation ≽^{C} is transitive. For practical purposes, however, this method is not very helpful, as the space of prices and goods bundles is very large. Social scientists do not have the resources to observe agents' choices from all relevant preference sets. If they want to derive a transitive preference relation from a choice function not defined over all subsets (up to three elements), then they have to restrict themselves to consider only choices that satisfy the strong axiom of revealed preferences (SARP). It says that if X is chosen when Y is available, and if in some other budget set Y is chosen when Z is available, then there can be no budget set containing alternatives X and Z for which Z is chosen and X is not. Thus, transitivity of ≽^{C} is ensured.