Notes to Probability in Medieval and Renaissance Philosophy

1.The three Kolmogorov axioms specify that (a) probability is a positive real number, (b) absolutely certain events have value 1, and (c) the probability of the conjunction of some mutually exclusive events is the sum of the events’ probabilities (see Hájek 2011, sec. 1).

2. There are some rare earlier examples for the calculation of chances, mainly for games of chance, but no calculus for chances was established; see Bellhouse (2000), Hald (2003, Chap. 4), Schneider (1988).

3. See Green-Pedersen (1984, 87) for the tradition of the Topics. Guillaume d’Auvergne (1180–1249) still discusses probability without reference to Aristotle’s endoxon. Although Guillaume, in De fide, 2, elaborates the relation between probability and faith, these passages contain no deeper conceptual discussion of probability. For the fortuna of Aristotle’s Rhetoric in the Middle Ages see Murphy (1981).

4. The term ‘indicators’ is used to avoid the language of reasons or evidence and its modern connotations. Until Section 3 below, in which typical medieval indicators are discussed, we should not ask how these indicators relate to reasons or evidence.

5. Grosseteste (1981), lib. 1, cap. 19, p.278:

Dico quod opinio tripliciter dicitur, communiter, scilicet, proprie et magis proprie. Opinio autem dicta communiter est cognitio cum assensu, et sic est idem quod fides, et secundum hoc opinio est genus scientiae et opinionis proprie et magis proprie, et quicquid scitur opinatur hoc modo. Opinio vero proprie dicta est acceptio unius partis contradictionis cum timore alterius, et secundum hoc non est scientia opinio. Tamen secundum hoc idem est scibile et opinabile, quia nichil prohibet quin necessarium scibile credatur, cum suspicione tamen quod contradictio eius possit esse vera; sed secundum hoc non est possibile ut idem homo sciat et opinetur simul et idem, sed unum et idem est scibile et opinabile simul a diversis. Magis proprie vero dicitur opinio acceptio veri contingentis in quantum huiusmodi, et secundum hoc non est idem scibile et opinabile.

See also the broad discussion in Buridan (2001), 8.4.3.

6. In most modern accounts, probability and certainty are measurable on a single scale with (full) certainty amounting to a probability of 1. Hence, certainty is measurable in terms of probability. This was not so in scholasticism.

7. For lawyers, see Panormitanus Opera, II, 174; Baldus, “De presumptionibus”, in his Additiones; Baldus, In libros codicis, pars 2, 31; and Motzenbäcker (1958, 112) quoting Huguccio.

8. See also Guillaume d’Auvergne De fide, 3: “idem … est probabile quod verisimile”.

9. The use of probabilis and verisimilis in antiquity is difficult to gauge. Glucker (1995) provides examples for their synonymous use but also gives reasons for regarding probabilis as a translation of the Greek pithanon and verisimilis of the Greek eikos.

10. For the use of opinabilis, see Albert Logica, 4, 2, 277, Gregory of Rimini Lectura, I, prol., q. 2, 3, 81, Schütz (1958, 647). Improbabilis was a positively disqualifying category (Byrne 1968, 149). Deman (1933, 263) claims that Thomas Aquinas uses ‘improbable’ in the sense of ‘repugnant to reason’. This conforms to a usage called positively improbable by Cardenas (1670), tract. 1, disp. 1, cap. 2, no. 19. Positively improbable opinions are certainly false and may even be contradictory or incoherent. Negatively improbable opinions, by contrast, are merely not probable because they lack justification. They are insufficiently backed by truth-directed reasons or authoritative voices.

11. Not every expert will be a wise person, especially if the term sapiens is reserved for those who have attained practical wisdom (the phronimoi). In any case, medieval practice followed Boethius by basing endoxa on the expert status of those who issued them (see also n. 16).

12. Most accounts of medieval probability (following Hacking) distinguish only an evidential or endoxic notion of medieval probability from a frequentist alternative; see Deman (1933), Franklin (2001), Kantola (1994), Knebel (2004).

13. On the rise of the concept of endoxon, mainly until the 13th century, see Von Moos (1991, 2006).

14. Gregory of Rimini, Lectura, I, 83: “Praeterea, cum ‘probabilia’ secundum Philosophum 1 Topicorum dicantur, ‘quae videntur pluribus aut sapientibus’, cui etiam concordat Augustinus Contra Cresconium libro 3 dicens quod probabilia dicuntur, quia ‘probantur, hoc est, approbantur et creduntur’, supple, ‘esse vera’, sequitur quod probatio per auctoritatem sapientum mundi est ratio probabilis.” [Entry author’s translation.]

15. See Kantola (1994, 31) quoting Peter Richeri’s commentary on the Topics.

16. Peter of Spain, Summulae 5, 170, writes: “every expert is to be believed in his science” (“unicuique experto in sua scientia credendum est”). See Rexroth (2012) for the meaning of expertus in the Middle Ages. Uses such as Peter of Spain’s, as commented on by Johannes Versor, show, however, that the term was not only applied to people with experience in some practical or mechanical art.

17. See, e.g., Locke, Essay, IV, 20, §7, 711, for the early modern critique of scholastic probability as overly reliant on authority.

18. The maior et sanior pars emerged from a weighted aggregation of opinions, so that it could be formed by a minority of particularly authoritative persons; see Ganzer (2000). On early modern scholastic views of how a majority of probable reasoners approaches truth, see Schuessler (forthcoming), chap. 6.

19. In the sixteenth century, however, scholastic definitions of probability began to deviate from the endoxon and to include internal reasons; see Maryks (2008), Schuessler (2019), chap. 4, Tutino (2018).

20. Proto-frequentist notions of probability in the Middle Ages were, nota bene, already highlighted by Deman (1933).

21. On Thomas Aquinas’s use of ut frequenter probability, see Byrne (1968, 224), Franklin (2001, 124, 203), Kantola (1994, 40). The claim (most forcefully promoted by Kantola) that Thomas held a frequentist view of ut frequenter probability in a sense which comes close to the modern understanding of frequentism is controversial.

22. Quoted from Kantola (1994, 55): “Sic autem in propositio videmus enim viros et mulieres, viginti quinque annorum emere redditus ad vitam pro tali pretio quod infra octo annos percipiunt sortem et quamvis possint mori infra illos octo annos, probabilius tamen est <quod> possint vivere in duplo; et sic emens habet favorem suum quod accidit frequentius et quod est probabilius.” [My translation.]

23. Kantola (1994, 50): “Expressions probabiliter and ut in pluribus are used here synonymously. Both of them refer to a certain kind of natural or objective relative frequency.” In other places, however, he claims that “the frequent” is a subcategory of endoxa (ibid., 19). This is closer to the view that frequency was an indicator of probability but not a synonym for it.

24. Prierio Summa, s.v. “verbum probabile”: “Probabile dupliciter dicitur, primo ut est quid divisum contra occultum, et est illud, quod per testes probari potest … ”; translation Franklin (2001, 71). Kantola (1994, 34) subsumes testimonial into frequentist probability, but I do not see what the testimony of one or two witnesses has to do with matters of frequency. In any case, Prierio does not connect testimonial probability with an ut frequenter claim.

25. Scholastic lawyers did not, however, analyze the notion of probability in any more depth than theologians or masters of arts. The concept of probability was usually only briefly broached when the classification of presumptions, the nature of proof, or witnesses were discussed. This state of affairs is mirrored in the modern research literature, which only rarely touches on probability; see Hubert (2009), Motzenbäcker (1958), Otte (1971). Decock (2013) is an important exception, but it focuses on early modern contract law.

26. Quoted by Motzenbäcker (1958, 112): “Probabilis est, quae habetur ex communi opinione hominum vel ex verisimilibus indiciis.” On verisimilitude, see also Panormitanus Opera, II, 174; Baldus, pars 2 (1545: 31).

27. Reliance on endoxic probability appears even stronger in the entry “De presumptionibus” in Baldus (1473).

28. Boethius of Dacia Quaestiones, 75: “[P]roprietas habilitans subiectum ad participationem praedicati et non necessitans.” [My translation.]

29. Edited in Engberg-Pedersen (1984, 374-379), at 377: “Aliter tamen definit Boethius probabilia I. suorum Topicorum: probabilia sunt quibus facile animus acquiescit sed veritatis firmitatis in his non tenet, ut est ista propositio ‘si est mater, diligit’. Et pro horum declaratione sciendum est ulterius quod propositio dicitur probabilis in cuius subiecto est proprietas habilitans ipsum ad praedicatum participandum, non tamen necessitans, quia propositio talis est cum formidine de opposito.” [My translation.]

30.Albert, Logica, I, 1, 2, 241: “Probabilia autem (ex quibus fit syllogismus dialecticus) sunt verisimilia. Dupliciter autem verisimilia, eo quod ipsa habitudo praedicati ad subjectum verisimilis est, eo quod nec praedicatum est in subjecto per se, nec subjectum in predicato per se, nec utrumque in utroque, nec praedicatum necessariam et essentialem inhaerantiam habet cum subjecto, sed verisimile est in signis non in causis necessariis acceptum.”

31. See, however, Buridan, Summulae, 695, establishing that dialectical argumentation need not coincide with the dialectical syllogism.

32. See Ockham (1964, 92) for a translation.

33. However, there are scholastic logicians who do not tie opinio to fear of error. See Seifert (1978, p.83) for discussion, with many examples in the footnotes.

34. Seifert (1978, 153 n. 29) notes that later logicians, such as Jodocus Trutfetter and Pierre of Brussels, account for Ockham’s view with a distinction, but that is apparently as far as they go with respect to the implied challenge. Seifert also claims that Ockham devalues the dialectical syllogism because no one can be sure of using a dialectical syllogism under Ockham’s premises. I do not agree, however, that Ockham’s view creates insurmountable problems for users of dialectical syllogism. They would, in any case, not be able to trust the conclusions of dialectical syllogism with more than one subjective conviction (fides).

35. Scholastic investigation of a truly probabilistic logic seems to have started only after the Council of Trent with the discussion of a consequentia probabilis.

36. For a discussion of the rarity of references to equal probability in the medieval period, their increased frequency in the sixteenth century, and implications for the emergence of numerical probability, see Schuessler (2016); Thakkar (2022) and the reply by Schuessler (2022).

37. Aristotle’s methodology of science seems already to have been sensitive to expert disagreement in this way; see Kraut (2006).

38. Such an understanding of endoxic probability is suggested by Buridan, Quaestiones, 19: “Propositio autem dialectica dicitur propositio probabilis; probabile autem per Aristotelem dicitur, cui assentiunt omnes vel plures sapientes.” [My emphasis.]

39. See Marsilius of Inghen quoted by Rosemann (2007, 132): “I have listed these opinions [with respect to the question whether theology is a science] in detail, so that – given the fact that they are all probable in the minds of those positing them – anyone may choose the opinion which he deems more probable.”

40. Although the nature of reasonable disagreement between epistemic peers is still hotly disputed (Christensen 2007; Sosa 2010), it is sufficient here to note the existence of contemporary approaches to this issue which claim that epistemic peers can hold incompatible opinions.

41. Rival claims were often defended by highly reputable academics in scholastic debates. These competitors shared pretty much the same university training, had read the same texts, and attended the same debates. They were all very intelligent and well-informed scholars who strove for the truth. Therefore, they were “epistemic peers” in one of the modern meanings of this term; see, e.g., Christensen (2007), Sosa (2010).

42. Nowadays probabilism is the doctrine that all our beliefs and degrees of belief should conform to the laws of the calculus of probability (see, e.g., Huber 2016). By contrast, the scholastic doctrine of probabilism centers on the permission to follow less probable opinions even against more probable ones. Scholastic probabilism was invented in 1577 and is discussed in the quoted literature on post-medieval developments in scholastic probability discourse cited in this entry. The Latin name probabilismus for the doctrine originated in the late seventeenth century.

43. A distinction between subjective and objective probability was, however, made by the seventeenth century scholastics. See Schuessler (2019), chap. 8.

44. In fact, Kantola (1994, 35, 42, 58) emphasizes the objective character of scholastic frequentist probability.

45. The inter-subjective character of scholastic probability ascriptions is emphasized by Knebel (2000, 82). Wider issues of medieval social epistemology are discussed in Pasnau (2012).

46. See Green-Pedersen (1984, 304). There are earlier uses of this kind of perspectivism: see Kantola (1994, 27) on a 12th-century text. Michalski (1969) claims that such a perspectivism became more pronounced and accepted after the 14th century; but this claim needs further investigation.

47. Reference here is to a manuscript stage entitled Retractatio totius dialectice, which is included in Zippel’s edition of the Repastinatio, but not in other editions of the treatise.

48. “Classical probability” here does not denote the whole of modern probability discourse up to the nineteenth century, as in Daston (1988). Bayesian theories of probability, the main representatives of a logical or evidential approach to modern probability, use Bayes’ theorem to update subjective probabilities, that is, they draw conclusions from the occurrence of an event and its probability given some subjective expectation of the value of the expectation in light of this information. By means of this updating procedure, Bayesians postulate a consistency requirement for the integration of information into subjective degrees of belief.

49. Hájek (2011) adds the very recent best-systems interpretation, which is not listed in many other overviews and can be left aside here, since it is irrelevant in the present context.

50. See Knebel (2000) and Schuessler (2019), chap. 12 for developments in early modern scholasticism which may have facilitated the rise of classical probability.

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