Notes to Property and Ownership

1. Of course, B’s use of A’s intellectual product may interfere with A’s ability to profit from it. But that begs the question of property—for A’s profiting is simply her exploitation of a right that her property in the product would confer, viz., the right to exclude others from the using the product if they will not pay her for the privilege.

2. Cf. Blackstone’s (2001 [1763], Vol. II, p. 3) definition of property as ‘that sole and despotic dominion which one man claims and exercises over the external things of the world, in total exclusion of the right of any other individual in the universe.’

3. Indeed the account that Hume gave of the emergence of property conventions is often used as a paradigm for the understanding of conventions generally in social philosophy: see Lewis 1969.

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Jeremy Waldron <>

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