Notes to Structured Propositions

1. Though sometimes speakers’ intuition about speakers “saying the same thing” in uttering sentences clearly does not track sameness of proposition expressed, as when you utter ‘I am hungry’ sometime after I did, and someone else present judges that I said the same thing earlier. This raises interesting methodological questions. See King [2009a] for discussion.

2. Of course there are always dissenters. For example, Mark Richard [1982] argues that modal operators operate on sentence meanings (functions from contexts and times to propositions). Thus it would seem that it is sentence meanings that have modal properties for Richard. Further, there is some controversy as to whether propositions are the things that possess “tense properties” (e.g. having been true, etc.) and are the things tense operators operate on. Kaplan [1977] thinks so. Richard [1982] and Salmon [1989b] think not.

3. See Hanks [2009] for a good critical summary of recent work on propositions.

4. Strictly, Crimmins seems only to claim that sentences sometimes express propositions (in a context), where the propositions expressed contain constituents that are not supplied by any overt expression in the sentences. This does not rule out the possibility that such constituents are contributed by covert (phonologically and inscriptionally unrealized) expressions in the sentence. But there are those who have argued that sentences sometimes express propositions that have as constituents elements that are not supplied by any covert or overt expressions in the sentence. See Stanley [2000] for discussion.

5. See, for example, Montague [1960] for a discussion of an approach of this general sort.

6. Such a view is suggested in Montague [1960].

7. The interested reader should also consult Richard [1990] and Crimmins [1992] for approaches in the broadly neo-Russellian (as I use the term) tradition that try to avoid various consequences of the Salmon-Soames approach.

8. The version of King’s view articulated in [2007] and [2009a,b] will be explained.

9. King does not claim such a language is a possible human language. See pp. 34–38 of King [2007], particularly the discussion of Nenglish.

10. See King [2009] for a discussion of what it means to say that speakers interpret syntactic concatenation in certain ways and what explains their so doing.

11. In King [2007] this is expressed this by saying that R encodes the instantiation function. See pp. 34–38.

12. See the discussion of Englist in King [2007] pp. 36–38.

13. In King [2007], this point is formulated in terms of the propositional relation encoding the instantiation function. See pp. 59–64. The discussion here, talking instead of the propositional relation being interpreted as ascribing the property of swimming to Dara, echoes Soames’ [2010] (discussed below) way of stating what is essentially the same point.

14. As indicated, the propositional relation encoding ascription is simply a matter of it possessing the relational property of being interpreted by us as ascribing the property of swimming to Dara. So the fact that is the proposition on King’s view includes the propositional relation possessing this relational property. See King [2009] for discussion of in what sense we interpret the propositional relation of the proposition in this way.

15. In saying this, we assume that English, Dara, etc. would still have existed.

16. See King [2007] pp. 53–64.

17. See also King [2009] on these last two points.

18. See Chapters 4 and 10.

19. See Soames [2010] p. 103

20. See Soames [2010] p. 81

21. Soames needs a number of primitive mental acts beyond predication. See [Soames 2010] p. 115, 122.

22. See Hanks [2015] pp. 77–78 and note 10, p. 78.

23. Hanks [2015] p. 22.

24. King actually made this point in earlier work. See note above.

25. Recall that on Speaks’ view, the aboutness of propositions doesn’t have to be explained because they aren’t about anything.

26. Merricks [2015] pp. 191–94.

27. Merricks [2015] p. 195.

28. Merricks [2015] p. 207.

29. It may strike some as odd that the views of Cresswell [1985] are included in an article on structured propositions since he explicitly argues against what he calls “the propositional account of belief”. But in so doing, he makes assumptions about propositions that modern structured proposition theorists (e.g. neo-Russellians) would reject, such as that ‘5+7=12’ and ‘12=12’ express the same proposition. And Cresswell’s own views have much in common with the views of other (non-structured meaning) structured proposition theorists.

30. Actually, Cresswell eventually settles on sets of world/time pairs as sentence intensions; but this complication is ignored here.

31. The present discussion suggests that ‘that’ for Cresswell has only two meanings: on one, it combines with a sentence to form a name of an intension/set of worlds. On the other, it combines with a sentence to form the name of the “maximally fine grained entity” that can be named by a ‘that’ clause containing the sentence. But in fact, (given sentences of sufficient complexity), there are “intermediate” meanings of ‘that’ that combine with the sentence in question to form names of entities whose grain is “between” intension/sets of worlds and the “maximally fine grained entity”. This is why it was emphasized above that ‘that’ is highly ambiguous on Cresswell’s view. Again, since our concern here is with more fine grained entities, we ignore this complication and focus on the maximally fine grained entity that can be named by a ‘that’ clause containing a sentence on Cresswell’s view.

32. One can easily use this function to define the intension f of ‘runs’ (function from worlds to extensions) as follows: f is the function from worlds to sets of individuals such that o is in f(w) iff w is in Ir(o), where Ir is Cresswell’s “intension” (function from individuals to sets of worlds) for ‘runs’.

33. It would seem that Cresswell needs to say this. For recall that sentences don’t express fine grained entities in isolation; it is only when combined with ‘that’ (on certain of its meanings) that a fine grained entity is associated with a sentence-plus-‘that’. So it appears that the sentence in isolation (without ‘that’ appended) cannot be true or false in virtue of its association with a fine grained that is in the first instance true of false. For in isolation it is not so associated!

34. The use of variables in expressions like ‘Rxy’ here is perhaps unfortunate. The reader is reminded that R is a relation (not a predicate). Variables are put in to indicate the “argument places” in the relation. Perhaps underlining (___) and other notation to the same effect (#####) would be better. The reader is urged to mentally substitute such things for variables that indicate argument places in relations.

35. For details about the rest of the functions mentioned, consult Zalta [1988], (especially pages 46–51; 58–61, and the Appendix containing his formal intensional logic).

36. For simplicity, the modal and tense operators that should appear in the instances of the comprehension schema are suppressed.

Copyright © 2019 by
Jeffrey C. King <>

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