Notes to Divine Providence

1. Contemporary arguments of this type may be seen as beginning with Plantinga (1974, 26). Essentially the same argument has been endorsed by many other writers.

2. Contemporary defenses of the view that God is timelessly eternal include Helm (1988) and Leftow (1991).

3. The Molinist view receives a thorough and careful defense in (1998), on which the present discussion is based.

4. Molina attributes three kinds of knowledge to God. Natural knowledge consists of logical and conceptual truths — e.g., that no bachelor is married — which are recognized by God as a matter of his essential nature. Free knowledge consists of contingent truths that are settled by God's will as creator — e.g., that there are tigers. Middle knowledge is so named because it falls between these two. The truths of which it is composed are, like those of free knowledge, contingent; but like natural knowledge they are held to be settled independently of God's will.

5. That God could not know counterfactuals of freedom independently of his creative decisions has been argued by Timothy O'Connor (1992). See also Swinburne (1998, ch. 7).

6. It is worth noting that this feature of middle knowledge can be utilized to argue with Mackie (1955, 209) that God ought to have been able to create creatures with free will who never sinned (Swinburne 1998, 130; Lewis 1993).

7. This is a form of the classic objection to libertarian freedom articulated by David Hume (1739-40), and since repeated by many opponents of libertarianism.

8. It might be thought that Jesus' remark (Matt. 26:24) that it would have been better for his betrayer that he not have been born contradicts this. But that cannot be right, for if Judas had not existed, there would have been no "him" to refer to. It is far more plausible to take the remark as saying it would have been better for Judas had he died in his mother's womb.

9. For contrasting views on this issue see van Inwagen (1968) and Stump (1993).

10. Cf. For more on this subject see McCann (2009).

Copyright © 2017 by
Hugh J. McCann
Daniel M. Johnson <>

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