Supplement to Philosophy of Psychiatry

Philosophical Psychopathology

1. Varieties of Philosophical Psychopathology

The work surveyed so far in this entry mostly counts as philosophy of science, where psychiatry is the science in question, and the philosophy is concerned with topics familiar to philosophers of science, such as explanation. Another tradition in philosophy of psychiatry belongs to what Graham and Stephens (1994, 6) call applied philosophy of mind, which is one of the approaches they distinguish in their rough taxonomy of approaches to philosophical psychopathology. The remaining category or work Graham and Stephens recognises looks at the ethical and experiential aspects of mental disorder. This section surveys some recent work in applied philosophy of mind. It does not aim to be comprehensive, since this area has probably seen the most intense flowering of recent philosophical work. We will look at some representative work to get a sense of the varieties of topics and projects under philosophical discussion.

Philosophers writing in this vein (exemplified by Graham, 2010) look to incorporate empirical results into philosophical reflection on topics like personal identity, rationality or voluntary action. They may also seek distinctively philosophical explanations of psychopathologies, which try to understand them in terms borrowed from the philosophy of mind. Whereas Murphy (2006), for example, sees the scope of the mental as defined by the sciences of the mind, Graham thinks of the mental as possessing the twin hallmarks of intentionality and consciousness. Disturbances of intentionality and consciousness are what count as mental illnesses, therefore, and philosophical theories that treat of intentional or conscious states can help us to understand mental disorders better.

This philosophical project involves, but is not limited to, conceptual clarification. Philosophers have made useful contributions by interrogating the details of psychiatric concepts. This way of doing philosophical psychopathology is exemplified by Part One of Potter (2009). She looks at key concepts in the current understanding of Borderline Personality Disorder, which is characterized by feelings of emptiness or loss of self, impulsive or self-destructive behaviour, bursts of anger and unstable relationships. A staple of the literature on the condition is the idea that borderline patients are manipulative. Potter (ch.6) usefully asks what this means. A therapist may often feel outmanoeuvred by a patient who has managed to bring about an outcome that the therapist did not prefer—for instance, a patient who still wishes to be admitted to hospital despite her therapist's judgement to the contrary may deliberately injure herself to force the hospital to admit her. In this case, the patient has certainly taken extreme measures to get her way, but it is not clear that it counts as manipulation. The patient has defied medical opinion, but she has not changed the therapist's mind or been deceptive—we might prefer to think of manipulation as deliberately changing someone else's mind through charm, trickery or some other psychological process. That kind of ability to get your own way is often ascribed to psychopaths, but in her work Potter makes us wonder if the same idea really applies to borderline patients. Perhaps they should just be seen as desperate people who are trying to cope with their distress, or socially inept (115–16) rather than agents setting out to bend others to their will. And even if they are trying to get their own way, well, why shouldn't they? The concern Potter raises is that the concept of manipulativeness is being used by clinicians to just mean something like ‘behaviour that makes my job harder’.

2. Thought Insertion

The program set out by Graham and similar theorists has a different agenda that goes beyond conceptual clarification. It involves both using concepts from psychiatry to shed light on philosophical problems and using existing philosophical positions to explain, or at least make clearer, some of the issues that daunt psychiatrists. Take, for example, delusions of thought insertion. Subjects with this condition say that they have thoughts inside their minds that have been put their by someone else or are actually being thought by someone else, as in the following famous case reported by Mellor (1970): “I look out the window and I think that the garden looks nice and the grass looks cool, but the thoughts of Eamonn Andrews come into my mind. There are no other thoughts there, only his … He treats my mind like a screen and flashes thoughts onto it like you flash a picture.” (Eamonn Andrews was a British TV personality.)

It is very hard to imagine what thought insertion could be like: how can I be introspectively aware of something as an episode in my mind, yet at the same time experience it as someone else's thought? Graham and Stephens (2000) suggest that thought insertion should be seen as alienated self-consciousness. They draw on Frankfurt's (1988, 59) idea that only some of things I do actually express my agency. Some bodily movements can be movements of my limbs without counting as actions of mine—perhaps because someone else is controlling my movements. The same can be true of mental events. If a tune runs through my mind unbidden, it is an episode in my mental history. But it does not count as my mental activity in the same way as the mental arithmetic I do to balance my checkbook counts as mine. The latter, but not the former, comprises intentional thought that expresses my agency. Graham and Stephens (2000, 152) call these properties of thought the sense of subjectivity and the sense of agency. They propose that the two properties can come apart, so that in thought disorder the sense of subjectivity occurs without the sense of agency. On this picture, attributing the thought to someone else makes sense, because it is the kind of mental activity that must be produced by something, carrying as it does the hallmarks of agency (just not my agency).

Such a theory does not explain where the abnormal experiences come from. Rather, it tries to use philosophical resources to make the experience somewhat less unfathomable, and perhaps clear some ground for an explanation by pointing the way towards the sort of mental processes that would need to be involved. A different approach to philosophical psychopathology looks to the science to illuminate a philosophical debate.

3. Psychopaths and Moral Psychology

The debate over psychopathy seems to be a case where empirical findings have a clear philosophical contribution to make. Findings about psychopathy have been appealed to in two debates. First, they are involved in the debate over whether moral judgments are intrinsically motivating, or whether it is possible to know what morality requires yet remain unmoved. Jesse Prinz (2007, 42) has called psychopathy a “test case”, which helps us to discriminate between the claim that moral judgments are intrinsically motivating and the contrary claim that you could form a moral judgment without being motivated to act on it. A second, albeit related issue in moral psychology is the extent to which moral judgments are the product of reason or of affective sentiments.

Hume (1751, section IX) imagined the “sensible knave”, who, “in particular incidents, may think, that an act of iniquity or infidelity will make a considerable addition to his fortune, without causing any considerable breach in the social union and confederacy. That honesty is the best policy, may be a good general rule; but is liable to many exceptions: And he, it may, perhaps, be thought, conducts himself with most wisdom, who observes the general rule, and takes advantage of all the exceptions.” Hume's sensible knave knows what virtue requires but does not care, because he lacks the sentiment of benevolence that normally counteracts self interest. The sensible knave cannot be argued into morality but not because of any intellectual deficiency; he just does not feel the pull of morality at all. Shaun Nichols (2004) has argued that psychopaths are actual cases of sensible knavery, since they seem to fit Hume's criteria.

According to Nichols (2004), psychopaths are sensible knaves—amoral but fully rational agents. They lack prosocial emotions (especially empathy), and this lack leads them to disregard the claims of morality because they do not respond normally to the sufferings of others. Nichols argues that because the moral flaws of psychopaths are traceable to their emotional deficits, rather than any shortcomings of reason, psychopaths refute what he calls “empirical rationalism”. Empirical rationalism is the idea that ethics is based on, or is just a province of, practical reason. Our moral judgments are explicable in terms of the same rational standards that apply to ordinary thought and action. Simply put, being moral is just indistinguishable from being rational. If psychopaths refute this view, thinks Nichols, they count as evidence in favour of a broadly Humean approach to morality

Nichols distinguishes empirical rationalism from moral rationalism. Empirical rationalism claims that it is an empirical fact that moral judgment in humans is a kind of rational judgment; i.e. our moral judgments derive from our rational faculties or capacities. Conceptual Rationalism states that it is a conceptual truth that people who make moral judgments are motivated by them. That is, if you understand what morality requires you will want to do it (because it is the rational thing to do). Nichols concentrates on the empirical case—the extent to which moral psychology is a form of practical reason.

Heidi Maibom (2005) has challenged Nichols' treatment on several grounds. Most directly, Maibom points to literature showing that psychopaths do in fact suffer from rational impairments. Psychopaths seem to have trouble learning from experience, lack a grasp of means-end reasoning, and lack an ability to plan for the longer term or formulate and pursue longer-term goals. Maibom argues that because of these deficits psychopaths fail to meet the rational constraints on practical reason, such as coherence and consistency. Maibom also argues that to support a Humean position, it is not enough to tie these blemishes in the reasoning of psychopaths to ultimate abnormalities in their emotional lives. For a Humean, she argues, emotional deficits should have a direct effect on morality via an absence of empathy, not an indirect one via reasoning failures caused by a general lack of emotions.

It does seem to be correct that psychopaths suffer from various rational deficits. But nobody is perfectly rational, and the case has to be made that psychopaths are different enough from normal subjects. For Maibom to make her case, the rational shortcomings of psychopaths need to make them a different class of subject, since Nichols' argument depends on their being as rational as the average subject. We remain unsure about the nature of the rational deficits in psychopathy, but also about the significance of the various models of psychopathic irrationality. Perhaps it is wrong to think of practical reason as a unitary phenomenon or faculty. Psychopaths seem to be perfectly normal when it comes to theory of mind and general intelligence, so maybe their reasoning deficits are circumscribed in ways that leave them rationally in the same class as normal subjects when it comes to the reasoning systems that matter for morality. It may be in the end that psychopathy involves a combination of emotional and rational shortcomings that reflect a failure of normal neuropsychological development. If that were the case, then they would be less suitable to adjudicate between Humean approaches and Kantian approaches that see morality in terms of practical reason, rather than emotional responses.

Controversy also exists over the extent to which psychopaths really understand moral concepts, which they would have to do in order to count as amoralists, rather than as people who do not understand morality. Although psychopaths can employ moral language and use emotion terms, some theorists (e.g. Hare 1993, ch 3) have argued that they seem incapable of attaching the same sense as the rest of us to the moral concepts they use. This may suggest that they do not really grasp moral concepts. However, it may still be that their failure to grasp moral concepts is due to their emotional stuntedness rather than some deficit in reasoning (Prinz 2007, 46–47).

4 Multiple Personality

Philosophers have also sought scientific support for their theories by appealing to Multiple Personality Disorder, or Dissociative Identity Disorder as it was called in DSM-IV. This has been a very controversial diagnosis. Some philosophers have thought that it shows something very interesting about the development of the self in normal subjects. Other theorist have been more sceptical, both about the philosophical claims and about the very reality of the condition itself.

The basic picture of MPD/DID is that a sufferer has several distinct personality states, known as “alters”. At various times, one of the alters is in charge of the subject's behaviour. Each alter has a peculiar, enduring pattern of perceiving, thinking about and relating to the environment and self, as well as different patterns of speech and physical comportment. The “alters” emerge spontaneously and involuntarily to control behaviour, and function more or less independently of each other. Not all alters are known to the patient. This results in significant amnesia (not ordinary forgetting) on the patient's part for those periods of time when an alter was in control.

Scepticism about MPD in the clinical community was fostered by the circumstances under which it became prominent in the 1970s and 1980s. The existence of dissociation is not controversial. DSM-IV (477) defines it as “disruption in the usually integrated functions of consciousness, memory, identity or perception of the environment. The disturbance may be sudden or gradual, transient or chronic”. Dissociation does not have to be pathological: it can occur in normal life when, for example, one becomes absorbed in a task to the exclusion of other aspects of the environment. And the idea of an alter personality assuming control of behaviour emerged in the nineteenth century. But the sceptics point out that fewer than a dozen cases had been reported before the early 1970s, when a sudden epidemic flowered up in North America, featuring subjects who had several, sometimes dozens, of alters. Proponents of the diagnosis pointed to greater awareness of child abuse as the key factor that made widespread diagnosis possible, since it took great efforts to overcome public reticence on that key causal factor.

By the mid-nineties, the epidemic was waning, as more and more psychiatrists began to conclude that the symptoms of MPD/DID were being produced in the clinic by hypnosis and suggestion, in concert with portrayals of the condition in the media. Questions were also raised in retrospect about the validity of the diagnosis in some of the key cases that inspired the great take-off in the diagnosis (McNally, forthcoming ch 5). But there is no doubting the reality of the symptoms that are displayed by people who receive the diagnosis. A tendency has been to ask whether multiple personality is a real disorder or the product of social circumstances, a culturally permissible way to express distress? We should reject the presupposition that there is an important contrast between being a real disorder and being a product of social circumstances. The fact that a certain suite of mental symptoms appear together only in specific historical or geographical contexts does not imply that it is not real (See Hacking 1998 on transient mental disorders). Philosophical discussion of dissociation is not imperilled if the sceptics about MPD carry the day. However, philosophical theories which are tied strongly to the more controversial claims about the nature and etiology of MPD do look less plausible.

Dennett and Humphrey draw on MPD/DID to support a philosophical proposal about the nature of the self. They do seem to tie their interpretation of MPD/DID to the specifics of the causal story, since they treat the condition as evidence for a particular theory about the development of the self in normal cases. Different alters, as they put it, express exaggerated moods but retain memories of their periods of control that host personalities lack. These memories become aggregated into a distinct self (or self-representation). The causal story they favour (49–51) is borrowed from the MPD community, and asserts that children endure abuse by dissociating and leaving an alter behind to deal with the abuse. Then the alter splits into pieces that express different emotional relations to what is going on (including conflicting feelings towards the parent who is also the abuser).

Are these alters different selves? Dennett and Humphrey distinguish two theories of the self.

  1. The “Proper Self”: a ghostly supervisor who lives inside the head. The seat of thought and consciousness.
  2. The “Fictive Self”: a “center of narrative gravity” of a biography, but with no real causal power. This is a representation of what you are like that does not correspond to anything inside the head.

Dennett and Humphrey dislike the “proper Self” idea because they think that it is untrue to the way the human mind is organized. They argue that the mind is a collection of unintelligent subcomponents, with no overall executive control center. Like a termite colony, a human being is made up of a set of independent systems: different functional units responsible for (e.g.) vision, language processing, theory of mind, working memory, emotional appraisal, spatial cognition and so on. All these simple systems give rise to intelligent behaviour. But unlike a termite colony, a human being has a figurehead: each of us “first creates—unconsciously—one or more ideal fictive selves and then elects the best supported of these into office as her head of mind” (1998, 41)

On this view, normal development of the self is a matter of finding the representation that makes the most sense. The representation that makes the most sense does not have to be accurate. It reflects a desire for coherence (and a role in social relations) rather than accuracy. In MPD, Dennett and Humphrey argue that this process fragments into lots of competing systems, since there are too many inconsistent pictures of the “real you”: so the alters persist as different representations that make partial sense of different aspects of the self. The normal integration of different representations into a coherent one is prevented by the strains of development.

Owen Flanagan (1994) has developed a version of this view that is slightly different. He argues that the self is a narrative: an unfolding rationale for what in fact happens to you. Normally we assume that there is one self per person, and that the self permits continuity across change as we develop. But in the normal case, Flanagan thinks, the self is multiplex—it permits some differentiation across situations. The notion of a complete, well-integrated personality is a normative concept—a way we think people ought to be—rather than anything that is usual in psychology. It is a goal we work towards that can be achieved in different ways.

These views treat MPD as evidence for a particular theory of how the self comes into being via developmental work at integrating different aspects of the person. Ian Hacking (1995a, chs 16–18), on the other hand, is sceptical of any claims that MPD/DID is evidence for positions in the philosophy of mind. It may illustrate positions—if you believe Dennett and Humphrey's theory of the self then you can see how their view makes sense of the phenomenon of MPD/DID. But the philosophical theory has to be confirmed elsewhere. This is partly because the understanding of the syndrome the theory rests on is so recent: Hacking argues that people “have been diagnosed with double consciousness or multiple personality for two centuries `now. But they began to talk the way they do now—using the symptom language described by Dennett—only very recently. Today they all say such things, or at least suspect that they ought to say them. That is how they learn to describe themselves in therapy” (226). Dissociation may be a genuine psychological condition, but the details of dissociative identity disturbances are too contentious to bear much philosophical weight. Hacking doubts that there is any stable condition to have knowledge about, because the very act of being classified alters human behaviour via what he calls the “looping effect” (1995b, 2007. For discussion, see Cooper 2004, Murphy 2001, 2006 (ch 7), Tsou 2007). The looping effect comes about when individuals change their behaviour in response to classification. Such a feedback loop could, in principle, keep behaviour stable, but Hacking is interested in those cases in which the behaviour is rendered unstable. He has also (1998) examined the case of transient mental illnesses, which appear to flare up and then go out of existence.

5. Delusions

Of all psychiatric concepts, it is probably delusions that have received the most extensive recent treatment from philosophers. Here the issues straddle philosophy of mind and philosophy of science. Some theorists have raised conceptual difficulties for accounts of delusions, others have sought to frame scientific hypotheses that can explain delusions in terms of information-processing deficits or other subpersonal problems. And some philosophers have looked for a distinctively philosophical explanation of delusions, which draws on concepts previously formulated in the philosophy of mind.

Like many other psychological concepts, the concept of delusion has a fairly explicit and self-conscious scientific use and a variety of commonsense uses. There is considerable overlap between some psychiatric uses and some casual employments of “delusion”. But there are clearly everyday occasions when “delusion” merely refers to a belief that seems obviously false or unwarranted to the speaker. I might call you delusional when you announce that you expect to buy a four bedroom house in your neighbourhood for what you can afford to pay, without meaning that your reasoning is symptomatic of a psychotic illness; it is just wishful thinking. But delusions in a technical sense are manifestations of psychosis. DSM-5 (819) defines a delusion as ‘A false belief based on incorrect inference about external reality that is firmly sustained despite what almost everyone else believes and despite what constitutes incontrovertible and obvious proof or evidence to the contrary ….’. Furthermore, the delusion must be inexplicable in cultural terms, so that religious beliefs are not counted as delusional, no matter how bizarre. The fact that the patient belongs to a culture or community in which the relevant belief is treated as a religious claim means that it does not count as a delusion. This proviso has seemed odd to many people. It may just testify to the disinclination of psychiatrists to take sides in religious disputes, but perhaps the best way to view it is as an acknowledgment of the importance of testimony or social context in the normal acquisition of our beliefs. We expect people to acquire religious, or otherwise culturally specific, beliefs that might strike outsiders to the culture as odd. But the weirdness of the belief does not impugn the normality of the process of culturally specific belief transmission, so the products of such cultural transmission should not be treated as pathological, no matter how strange we may think they are.

Other aspects of the definition of delusion have also come under attack. Gipps and Fulford 2004 ably summarize some standard objections. These include the idea that a delusion has to be false. Jaspers (1997, 106), for instance, argues that someone who is pathologically jealous and suffers from delusional beliefs about their partner's infidelity (“the Othello Syndrome”) might in fact be correct. The partner could actually be unfaithful. In this case the truthfulness of the belief is beside the point, since we can recognise pathological jealousy without regard to truth. Ryan (2009, 24) notes that someone with Ekbom's syndrome (the belief that one is infested with bugs) might coincidentally suffer scabies. Fulford (1989, 204–5) also mentions a patient whose only symptom of psychopathology was the delusion that he was mentally ill—if he really was mentally ill, then that couldn't have been a delusion. On the other hand, as Graham and Stephens (2007, 194) note, many theorists have doubted that delusions are really beliefs at all. Delusions often lack properties that beliefs have been thought to possess. In particular, delusions often seem poorly integrated with the rest of the subject's beliefs, and they can lack the affect associated with firmly-held beliefs. These objections are rebutted by Bortolotti (2009). The boundaries between delusion and other states, like self-deception, have also been discussed (Bayne and Fernandez 2009. For general philosophical accounts of delusion see Bortolotti 2009, Radden 2010.)

Analyses of delusion can look like inversions of the attempts made by analytic epistemologists to define knowledge. We may agree that a delusion is a false belief, just as knowledge is true belief, but, as with knowledge, we do not rest there. Knowledge is true belief plus something that ties the true belief to the world in the right way. So too, we try to find that extra property of the false belief that converts it from a false belief into a delusion. This conceptual program is seen as the prelude to the development of empirical theories of delusion, in which philosophers work alongside cognitive scientists (Davies and Coltheart 2000).

These theories have tended to assume that when ‘delusion’ is used in the technical sense it denotes a psychological natural kind (Samuels 2009) whose basic psychological structure can be worked out via attention to paradigmatic cases. Call this the explanatory project. We can distinguish two versions; one involves explaining delusions as caused by failures of normal relations among components of our cognitive architecture, or at least those parts of it that have to do with the fixation of belief. Another way of proceeding is more philosophical. It is less bothered with causal theories of cognitive architecture and more concerned to find resources in the philosophy of mind that characterise delusions in an illuminating way.

Neuropsychological theories of the origin of monothematic delusions (Those characterised by one dominant delusional belief about one specific matter) have come to fall into two camps: one factor and two factor theories. According to one familiar version of the two-factor theory (Davies and Coltheart 2000), an unusual experience is the first factor in the aetiology of a delusion, but there must also be a second factor. The first factor can be seen as an impairment that effects the reception of information about the world. The delusion belief explains that input—your spouse seems odd, so you conclude that he has been replaced by a robot. That explains the oddness, but in order for you to form that belief there has to be a second impairment, in some system that forms or evaluates beliefs. This will typically be some neurocognitive deficit that interacts with the experience. The impairment in your reasoning system prevents you from rejecting the explanatory belief, despite its lack of warrant. The disagreement with one factor theories (Davies et al. 2005) turns on whether the first deficit suffices to cause the delusion.

The more purely philosophical approach to explaining delusions concentrates on the role the delusion plays in the subject's mental life, as understood in terms of some theories in philosophy of mind. Arguably, these attempts at philosophical understanding of delusions originate with Jaspers' (1997) concept of a primary delusion, which is a subjectively meaningful transformation in the patient's experience of the world. Recent work in this tradition includes the delusional stance idea of Graham and Stephens (2007). In a similar vein to their explanation of thought disorder in terms of identifying with one's own thoughts or being alienated from them, they suggest (194) that delusions are constituted by a higher-order stance towards lower- order intentional states. This stance involves an identification with the lower order states, which become seen as an expression of one's own agency or mental nature. As in Jaspers' treatment, it is the role of the delusion in the subjective mental life of the deluded person that is critical.

These two approaches represent two ways of doing philosophical psychopathology, as a foundational contribution to a scientific inquiry or as a piece of philosophy of mind. They are not incompatible; the philosophical projects may help us to better describe the phenomena psychiatrists care about and make the explanatory project easier. On the other hand a two-factor explanation, or some other neuropsychological account, does not have to falsify a philosophical description of delusions. It may be that philosophical accounts make unwarranted empirical assumptions, but they may simply illuminate the condition as it is experienced by those who suffer from it, or guide us towards a philosophical account of the mind that is informed by real cases rather than armchair ones. The last decade has seen a great increase in work on the epistemology and philosophical significance of psychiatry, which is becoming a recognisable philosophical field. The full implications of this development, both intellectually and professionally, are still a long way off.

Copyright © 2020 by
Dominic Murphy <>

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