Qing Philosophy

First published Tue Apr 16, 2019

Qing philosophy refers to the topography of the intellectual terrain of seventeenth- and eighteenth-century China, which sported coherent patterns and modes of intellection and argumentation among the texts and writings of the scholars in the period. In accordance with the current historiographical convention, the time-span fell within the so-called “late imperial” era that encompassed the transition from the Ming dynasty (1368–1644) to the Qing (1644–1911), as well as the first half of the Qing imperium. That Qing philosophy is distinguished as an independent subject and entity, with its presumed boundaries and prominent features, is not merely a function of chronology. Rather, it points to a substantial departure from the preceding intellectual traditions, which in their aggregate form, amounted to Neo-Confucianism of the Song (960–1279) and Ming times. While Neo-Confucianism was not a monolith to be sure, to the extent that it argued robustly on behalf of individual moral introspection via one’s nature (xing) and mind-heart (xin) as the realization of ultimate metaphysical truths—variously construed as heaven (tian), principle (li), the great ultimate (taiji), and the Way (dao)—it represented the foremost unfolding and predictive reality-principle that was Song-Ming thought in its totality. Qing philosophy, being in many ways a negative reaction to it, was a rupture to begin with, even though in terms of intellectual history, multifarious aspects of continuity, apart from discontinuity, must be taken into account.

It is important to note that the coherent patterns and modes identified with Qing philosophy are my own narrative and interpretive constructions for the purpose of limning the lineaments of the intellectual landscape of a time. They are analytical categories that result from my hermeneutic intervention within the intellectual history of late imperial China, the coherent features of which might not have been evident to contemporary scholars in the Qing. In short, Qing philosophy is a constructed period concept that denotes a distinct worldview with a specific temporal location.

The present essay begins, in section 1, with a synthetic conceptualization of Qing philosophy as a period concept that conveys both substantive intellectual contents and a particular temporal position. From historiographical and historical vantage points, it argues on behalf of the distinctiveness of the modes and patterns of philosophical intellection in Qing times, identifying their departure from antecedent Song-Ming thoughts while paying due attention to aspects of continuity. These dominant manners of intellection that characterize Qing philosophy are represented by four ideal-types of thinking—vitalism, historicism, utilitarianism, and intellectualism. Together, they furnished the fundamental orientations and standards by which learning was pursued, adjudicated, and evaluated in the Qing period.

Accordingly, the rest of the essay is organized around the individual and respective examinations of the four ideal-types of philosophical thinking, and hence the quadripartite structure. Section 2 explores vitalism as the philosophical emphasis on qi (material force or psycho-physical force) as the metaphysical fulcrum on which the world turns. Section 3 reveals the ways in which historicism engendered the tendency to seek meaning in human agency by appreciating particular contingencies in changing contexts. Utilitarianism, elucidated in section 4, is my hermeneutic rendering of the Confucian activist ideal of ordering the world by extending utility and function to the fullest (jingshi). Intellectualism, also discussed in section 4, is a representation of the Confucian quest for external, discursive knowledge, most vividly and concertedly manifested in the intellectual movement of evidentiary research (kaozheng).

1. Qing Philosophy: a Period Concept

To assert and describe the newness of Qing philosophical thinking about the manifold dimensions of reality in late imperial China is to highlight a sense of departure from the immediate past, that is, to trace the transition from the Song-Ming mode of thinking to the Qing one by pinpointing the disjunction and continuity. In other words, it begs the question of the relationship between late imperial thought and the preceding intellectual traditions. Inquiries into the Ming-Qing intellectual transition have tended to adopt two narrative and analytical strategies: first, the comparative approach that creates paradigms of adjoining intellectual movements and then points out their stark contrasts and vast differences; second, the developmental approach based on the assumption of continuity, governed by notions of tradition, influence, and evolution. The comparative approach that stresses rupture was in fact adopted by the some of the towering late Ming-early Qing intellectual figures, such as Gu Yanwu (1613–82) and Wang Fuzhi (1619–92), who created an archetype of Ming thought and Song-Ming Confucianism as abstract, abstruse, feckless, and feeble, such that they became a monolithic type of thinking represented by finicky metaphysical speculation and passive moral introspection. By Qing times, such a mode of intellection became collectively known as “Song learning” (Songxue), with its overt focus on moral principles (yili zhi xue), as opposed to “Han learning” (Hanxue), scholarship anchored on the deep philological probing of texts and words, and their literal meanings (wenzi xungu). The modern restatement of this position was made by Liang Qichao (1873–1929), a most influential late Qing and Republican intellectual figure, who criticized the futility of Song-Ming thought as “vague”, “intangible”, and “abstract”. Because of the wide circulation and common usage of the English translation by Immanuel Hsu of one of Liang’s book on Qing intellectual history (Liang 1921 [1959]), Liang’s view became for a long time the basic interpretive reference point for the study of late imperial intellectual trends, creating a dominant historiography that interprets the Ming-Qing intellectual transition as a cataclysmic event that ushered in a new spirit of thought. Another giant intellectual figure, a stalwart of the New Culture (or May-Fourth) movement, Hu Shi (1891–1962), held similar views, going so far as to advance the influential thesis of Qing philosophy as scientific and progressive (Hu 1967: 104–131).

Chinese Marxist scholarship in general likewise endorses this cataclysmic interpretation of the emergence of “progressive” thought in the late imperial period. Such thesis of discontinuity also found echoes in older western scholarship, such as that of the late Joseph Levenson, which contends that it was only in the seventeenth century that voices began to be raised against Song-Ming idealism and subjective idealism (1964). In sum, according to the thesis of rupture between Song-Ming learning and late imperial thought, seventeenth-century scholars begrudged the corruption of learning by indulgent moral introspection and arcane metaphysical speculation. As a result, there emerged the study of practical statecraft for the ordering of the workaday world of institutions and administrations, which realized the time-honored ideal of jingshi zhiyong (ordering the world and extending utility). Moreover, in order to rectify the abuses of the Song-Ming empty talk (kongtan), evidential research (kaozheng or kaoju) arose, especially in the area of philology, otherwise known as Han learning, in contradistinction to Song learning that pursued speculative introspection.

The developmental approach to the question of the Ming-Qing intellectual transition based on the notion of continuity appears in Feng Youlan’s (1895–1990) classic survey of Chinese philosophy (1934 [1952–1953]), ably translated into English by the late Derk Bodde (1909–2003). Feng regarded Han learning in the Qing as innovative and creative thinking, but he also insisted that it was a continuation of Song-Ming Neo-Confucianism because it produced no new metaphysical categories. More thoroughgoing in arguing on behalf of the linkage between Qing learning and Song learning was the eminent Qian Mu (1895–1990). To Qian (1937), the early Qing savants did actually uphold the Song cultural ideals, but he pointed out that the dominant scholastic Han learning and evidential scholarship of the later Qianjia period (the period of the reigns of the Qianlong and Jiaqing emperors, 1736–1820) strayed from the true moral way and political commitments of the late Ming and early Qing. The most sustained effort to interpret the intimate nexus between Song-Ming Confucianism and Qing thought is found in the seminal trilogy of volumes (Bary 1970, 1975; Bary & Bloom 1979) on Ming and Qing thought, edited by the late dean of Neo-Confucian Studies, Wm. Theodore de Bary (1919–2017), which examine the roots and nature of the intellectual transformation in the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries in terms of its intimate ties with Song-Ming antecedents. This thesis of continuity is eloquently restated by Qian Mu’s eminent student Yü Ying-shih, who interprets the novelty of late imperial Chinese learning with reference to its organic relation with Song-Ming Confucianism by delineating the inner logic of Confucian thinking. As Yü claims, “Intellectualism”, or the ideal of “following the way of inquiry and learning” (dao wenxue), took center stage in late imperial thought, whereas in Song-Ming times, “anti-intellectualism”, or the ideal of “honoring one’s heaven-endowed moral nature” (zun dexing) predominated (Yü 1975: 105–136).

The theme of intellectual continuity was also evident in much of Japanese scholarship which generally regards Wang Yangming’s idea of liangzhi (innately spontaneous moral knowing) as a major spiritual resource for fundamental change. It credits the left wing of the Wang Yangming school for further unleashing the potentials of this liberating precept by espousing individualism and voluntarism that signified moral autonomy. Furthermore, it argues that the Qing belief in the possibility of “objective” investigations of the classics should be examined in the context of the “subjectivism” that unified the Song, Yuan, and Ming philosophical views. This scholarship also explores the import of late imperial Chinese thought in terms of the idea of multiple early modernities in world history, to the extent that the late Ming and Qing witnessed the workings of the particular historical dynamics of “early modern” (sen kindai) China, manifested in the new conceptions of self and society that were reformulations of some central leitmotifs and polarities in traditional Confucian thinking (Shimada 1970; Mizoguchi 1980).

Be it the comparative or developmental approach, the contention is that Chinese thought experienced notable changes in the late imperial period, roughly from the late Ming through the mid Qing. While scholars argue over the genesis, content, nature, and significance of the new developments, most acknowledge and recognize the patterned fundamental shifts in intellectual trends and directions. Some of the interrelated traits of the intellectual redirection included the following: fungibility and syncretism in thinking that tended to mitigate the authority of received opinions; palpable impulse to reorder and manage the world, invoking the ideal of ordering the world through practical statecraft and statesmanship (jingshi); general aversion toward metaphysical speculation and moral introspection, and the corresponding interest in the pursuit of solid and practical learning (puxue and shixue), giving rise to utilitarian and instrumental notions of scholarship; valuing personal practical experience, academic, political, social and otherwise, such that one’s actions in the phenomenal and external worlds loomed large; historicization of the classics (jing) that had hitherto been revered as sources of timeless authority, rendering them into objects of scholarly scrutiny, thereby breeding in time the meticulous scholarship of evidential research and learning, which came to dominate the intellectual world in the so-called Qianjia period; preference for limpidity, clarity, and simplicity in writing style and language; and finally, new and broadening horizons of the meaning of community, as the literati’s place in state and society was redefined and reconceptualized. To be sure, these interlarded strains of thoughts were by no means new in the Chinese intellectual universe. Yet, from the late Ming on, there seemed to be an unmistakable convergence of the various traits that fostered conceptual commonalities and intellectual confluences out of a socio-intellectual environ that was nevertheless characterized by manifold sectarian affiliations and polemics. Various modes of learning and thinking cohered to forge a new orientation that seemed to give conscious life in the late imperial period an identifiable stamp and identity.

Thus, late imperial Chinese philosophy, or Qing philosophy, is a period concept, that is, a substantive designation of an independent historico-intellectual epoch with a distinct physiognomy, an internal coherence, identifiable mental habit, and autonomous scholarly style, distinguished from the preceding Song-Ming philosophical style and content, as represented by Neo-Confucianism. The construction of this period concept is an exercise in intellectual cartography by selecting and representing the significant ideational landmarks of an intellectual landscape, thereby providing a perspective and knowledge of the terrain. The major landmarks are the dominant modes, or ideal-types, of intellectual articulation, and Qing philosophy sported four—vitalism, historicism, utilitarianism, and intellectualism. They functioned as the basic criteria of intelligibility and importance, offering the fundamental points of view according to which learning was described, measured, valuated, and adjudicated. In the process, they dislodged and supplanted the moral metaphysics and inward ethical introspection of Song-Ming thought, which was premised on the idea of realizing the totalizing dao (the Way), li (principle), and tian (heaven) through self-cultivation of the mind-heart (xin). To the extent that humanity’s moral nature (dexing) was endowed by heaven, moral-ethico perfection was the realization of the mandate of heaven (tianming), manifested as the ritual order established by the ancient sages. In Song-Ming thought, apprehending dao/li/tian was not merely an epistemological process, in that knowledge of dao/tian/ti was a metapraxis in which virtue, reason, knowing, and action converged.

Qing philosophy, with vitalism, historicism, utilitarianism and intellectualism as its contextual and thematic patterns of thinking and articulation, heralded a new phase in Chinese intellectual history, interrogating antecedent concepts and ushering in new approaches. I use these “isms” advisedly as terms of art, not technical ones. Vitalism in this context smacks not of the Bergsonian metaphysical postulation of an élan vital, and historicism does not appeal to the ancestral nomenclature of Hegelian dialectics. Utilitarianism appeals not to Bentham’s consequentialist philosophy, and intellectualism elides the Socratic or Thomistic reference to rationality and ratiocination. Vitalism, in the context of Qing thought, is a reference to the Neo-Confucian philosophy of qi, commonly rendered into English as material force or psycho-physical force. It denotes a view of reality that focuses attention in large part to the evidence provided by life grasped from within a body, the self, or external thing. This evidence revealed embodied experience to be composed of concrete tendencies and occurrences not readily reduced to or dissolved in metaphysical speculation or conception, such as the ontological notion of principle (li) or heaven (tian). Historicism describes the mental habit and endeavor to find and establish meaning in history as it was made by human agents, shunning supra-temporal principles and transcendent norms of universal validity, such as the idea of the constant Way (dao), and savoring instead the contingent and particular in varying and changing contexts. Utilitarianism takes its cue from the Confucian activist ideal of “ordering the world by extending utility and function to the fullest” (jingshi zhiyong), privileging the functional component of yong (utility) over ti (the essential substance of things) in the ti-yong polarity that represented the interacting inner and outer realms of reality. Just as it gave priority to outer efforts of acting as opposed to the inner quiddity of being, so it presumed an intimate relation between knowledge and action in the experiential world. Intellectualism is an abstraction from the Confucian external cultivational goal of “following the way of inquiry and learning” (dao wenxue), which placed a premium on discursive knowledge and scholarly pursuit as the means to comprehend the classics, understood as the textual encasement and manifestations of the profound principles of the ancient sages. In time, it bred the critical evidentiary research (kaozheng) that sought to thoroughly reveal the sages’ teachings and messages via philology.

To be sure, these modes of intellectual articulation were not entirely new, but it was in the Qing that they coalesced, and they were emphasized and valued at the expense of other approaches. Hence the emergence of Qing philosophy as a coherent and integrated system of ideas in terms of which reality and the world were understood.

2. Vitalism: Metaphysical Reorientation

Vitalism as an expression of Qing philosophy focused on evidence provided by the self, the body, and external things. Opposed to the mysticism of an eternal and transcendent creative power such as principle (li), heaven (tian) or the Way (dao) that represented the essence of being, vitalism was in favor of a view of life grasped from within the actualities of the individual self and the external world. It stressed the immediate and ultimate completion of a concrete and dynamic life expressed in terms of qi (material force/psycho-physical force) and qi (concrete implements). It may be conceived as a dynamic monism: dynamic in the sense that it rejected an immutable dao in favor of a relativized way of contingent and finite truths; and monistic in that it dissolved the li-qi dichotomy, subsuming li, which had been considered to be the prior metaphysical and spiritual realm, under qi, the perceptual and experiential realm that had been regarded as secondary. Life within the vitalist framework was dependent on circumstances, particularized, and individualized by the external signs of the self’s contingency and finitude, including the senses, feelings, desires, and emotions. Scholars of late imperial Chinese thought, such as Theodore be Bary, Irene Bloom, and Yamanoi Yū , have pointed to the growing preponderance of this qi-based vitalist philosophy since the late Ming period, which offered a new sense of coherence in the thinking about individuals and the world. But it would be misleading to characterize Qing philosophy as entirely grounded in some sort of formalized qi-oriented metaphysics, to the extent that philosophical lucubration in terms of the Confucian categories of li and qi had ceased to hold the imagination of the thinkers. While qi, representing the material and experiential domain of life, did become ascendant in intellectual discourse, the Qing posture was distinctly averse to metaphysical pondering. Vitalism, with qi as its predicate, was a pervasive attitude that attached foremost importance to concrete realities and actions, inverting the Neo-Confucian metaphysical tendency to reduce humanity and things to an attribute, manifestation, and appearance of li and dao. Qi now reigned supreme.

In the early Qing, the most systematic articulation of the vitalist philosophy can be found in the writings of Wang Fuzhi (1619–1692), who expanded the qi-based metaphysics of the celebrated Song master, Zhang Zai (1020–1077). Wang asserted that qi was what li followed. He claimed:

In actuality, li exists within qi. Qi is nothing but li. When [qi] agglomerates and produces humanity and things, forms (xing) appear. When [qi] disperses into the supreme void (taixu), it is then formless. (Wang QSYS: 1:5b)

While li and qi were one, it was the latter that gave reality its form. In fact, qi was the basic stuff of the ultimate supreme void, as Wang averred:

To say that humanity is born without the nourishment of qi, that li could be sought outside of qi, that forms are illusions, and that the nature (xing) is real, is to degenerate into heterodoxy. (QSYS: 1:6b)

It is important to note that even though Wang followed Zhang, he rejected the latter’s philosophical anthropology, which separated humanity’s so-called “heaven-nature” stemming from li from its “physical nature” derived from qi. Wang told us:

When one speaks of the physical nature, it is like saying that the nature lies within the matter of qi (qizhi). This matter (zhi) is humanity’s material form (qizhi zhi xing), within the confines of which the principle of life (sheng zhi li) is manifested. Since it [i.e., the principle of life] lies within this matter, qi permeates it, and just as what fills the universe both inside and outside the human body is nothing but qi, so it is nothing but principle. Principle operates within qi, where it controls and apportions qi. Thus the matter [of individual things] envelops qi, and qi envelops principle. It is because this matter envelops qi that a given individual possesses a nature. For this reason, before one’s development has taken place, there can only be the li and qi of the universe but not the individual person. Once, however, there is the matter incorporating qi, this qi then inevitably possesses principle. As far as humanity is concerned…, this nature as found in the matter of qi [i.e., physical nature] is still the original nature. (quoted in McMorran 1975: 443)

In short, Wang contended that our so-called physical nature was the original nature, by no means secondary to our heaven-nature. He, unlike Zhang, did not attribute our aggressiveness and aggrandizement to the inferior qi of the physical nature. Wang saw both principle and human desires (yu) as natural (ziran). The tradition of ritual-propriety (li) expressed our desires:

Although ritual propriety is purely the external adornment of the principle of heaven, it must reside in human desires for it to be seen. That being the case, in the final analysis, there cannot be a heaven that is separate from humanity, or principle separate from desires…. Hence in sounds, colors, smells, and flavors, one can clearly see the communal desires (gongyu) of all beings and their communal principle (gongli). (Wang QSYS: 8:10b-11a)

To Wang, the way of kingship (wangdao) was also intimately related to human sentiments (renqing):

The way of kingship is based on human sentiments. Human sentiments are the same sentiments shared by both the profound person (junzi) and petty person (xiaoren)…. Mencius, understanding thoroughly the origin of the oneness of heaven’s principle (tianli) and human sentiments, recognized the possibility of the way of kingship. After seeing the beginning, it could then be extended and expanded…. Heaven’s principle resides in private desires (siyu). (Wang QSYS: 26:2a-3b)

Thus, Wang connected values—ritual-propriety, the way of kingship, communal principle—with private feelings, as the body and its affections became a locus of ethical experience, li-principle. In explicating the idea of “fully realizing our nature” (jinxing), he argued that everything in the world was of the same origin as oneself. Therefore, the individual was the fulcrum on which the world moved, and this mandated an active life. Practice, or xi, was the key to exhaustively realizing and fulfilling our nature, which was the nurturing of our very qi:

As for changing the bad to the good, it is a matter of nurturing one’s qi well. In time, one’s substance (zhi) is altered accordingly…. This is human ability, which is practice precisely. Thus, qi changes with practice, and nature is realized with practice. Substance is the residence of nature, nature is the regulating of qi, and qi is the substantiation of substance. [Qi] is what practice can control. (Wang QSYS: 7:11a-b)

In short, Wang not only collapsed the li-qi dyad into the monism of qi but he also understood qi, the basic stuff of the universe, in terms of human agency and action.

Gu Yanwu (1613–1682), also saw qi as the generative force in the cosmos:

Replete in heaven-and-earth is qi. When qi prospers, it becomes shen (spirit). Shen is the qi of heaven-and-earth and the human mind. (Gu RZL: 1:20)

He continue to say,

Coalescing to form a body is called wu (things/affairs); dispersal in a shapeless manner is called bian (change)…. Coalescing is the coalescing of qi; dispersal is the dispersing of qi. (RZL: 1:20)

Qi was self-sufficient and all-pervasive, identified with things, objects, events, and affairs, without which “the dao has nowhere to reside” (RZL: 1:20). Similarly, Huang Zongxi (1610–1695), a polymath who was Gu Yanwu’s and Wang Fuzhi’s contemporary, saw the inextricable conflation of li and qi as a foremost ontological fact: “Li is the li of qi. If there is no qi, then there is no li” (Huang MRXA: 140). Their difference rests merely on semantics:

The terms li and qi are made up by people. In speaking of the phenomena of floating, submerging, rising, and falling, there is qi. In speaking of the unmistakable laws of floating, submerging, rising, and falling, there is li. In the end, they are the two names of one entity, not two entities in one being. (Huang MRXA: 1064)

He further explained,

Within heaven-and-earth, there is only one qi. Its rise and fall, and comings and goings, are the li. Apprehended by a person… [li] becomes the mind-heart, which is also qi. If qi is not self-governed, why is it that after spring, there inevitably come summer, autumn, and winter? What controls the blossoming and withering of plans, the mildness and ruggedness of the topography, the good and the bad movements of astrological portents, and the birth and growth of humanity and things? All are governed by qi. Since it is self-governed, it is called li. (Huang MRXA: 46)

Huang dissolved the li-qi duality by arguing that li by itself did not exist, insofar as it was an abstraction of the material and the experiential.

In anthropological terms, Huang remarked that

what in heaven is qi is the mind-heart in humanity. What in heaven is li is the nature in humanity. Just as li and qi are the same, so too are the mind-heart and nature. (Huang MRXA: 1109)

Here, Huang critiqued Zhu Xi’s (1130–1200) tendency to separate the original human nature from the mind-heart, which was the site of sentiments and feelings of “pleasure, anger, sorrow, and joy”. To Huang, these emotions and affections, in their state of “equilibrium and harmony”, are the nature. Therefore,

to seek the nature outside of this cognitively natural and self-regulating mind-heart is like abandoning the flexible and changing qi in order to seek a separate li. (Huang MRXA: 1109–1110)

Huang thus invested human feelings with the steadfast solidity of the ontological substance of qi, which was the source of the cardinal virtues of ren (benevolence), yi (rightness), li (propriety) and zhi (wisdom):

Replete in heaven-and-earth is qi. Movement of this one qi in the human mind-heart… naturally separates into pleasure, anger, sorrow, and joy. Accordingly, the names of benevolence, rightness, propriety, and wisdom arise. Separate from qi, there is no li; separate from the mind-heart, there is no nature. (Huang MRXA: 1512)

The early Qing vitalist philosophy of qi found full expression in the eighteenth century, which witnessed a strong affirmation of the primacy of materiality. In particular, Dai Zhen (1723–1777) systematically developed a philosophy based on the presupposition that the dao was constituted by things:

Dao is the name that refers to actual bodies and actual affairs…. Speaking of the dao in terms of heaven-and-earth, it can readily be seen with reference to its actual bodies and actual affairs…. Speaking of the dao in terms of humanity, it is the concrete affairs of quotidian practicality in human relations that pervade the dao…. None that arise from the body are not the dao…. The dao is living, drinking, eating, talking, and moving. One’s self and what surround oneself are all appropriately [regarded as the dao]. (Dai MZZYSZ: 69–72)

Dai criticized the Song Neo-Confucians for artificially separating moral values from everyday social relations and activities, insofar as they identified the moral virtues of benevolence, rightness, propriety, and wisdom with the “empty, boundless, and subtle” principle, which, being prior and primary, was “above the realm of corporeal forms” (xing er shang), as opposed to diurnal actions and pursuits, which was seen to be “amidst the realm of corporeal forms” (xing er xia) and therefore, posterior and secondary. As far as Dai was concerned, such axiology could find no corroboration in the classics:

[The Song Confucians claimed that] with respect to heaven-and-earth, yin-yang cannot be called the dao; with respect to humanity, the physical endowment (qibing) cannot be called the nature (xing), and affairs and things of daily practicality in human relations cannot be called the Way (dao). There is nothing in the texts of the Six Classics, Confucius, and Mencius that agrees with them. (Dai MZZYSZ: 71–72)

To Dai, principle was not abstract and transcendent: “With regard to heaven-and-earth, humanity and things, and affairs and actions, I have not heard of a principle that cannot be verbally articulated” (Dai MZZYSZ: 38). Li, as the inner texture of things (tiaoli), did not exist in the mind-heart as a metaphysical entity and was found in the midst of all things. Indeed, it could not be severed from human feelings (qing) and desires (yu). Dai differentiated between what was naturally (ziran) and what was necessarily so (biran):

The desires of the nature are the signs of the natural. The virtue of the nature is conducive to the attainment of what was necessarily so. What is conducive to the attainment of what was necessarily so conforms to and perfects what is natural about heaven-and-earth. This is called the utmost attainment of that which is naturally so. (quoted in Yü Ying-shih 1982: 386)

What were naturally so were the desires and daily activities of human beings; that which was necessarily so was the inner texture of the natural, that is, principle. The natural was the foundation on which the necessitarian principle rested:

The ears, the eyes, and all the other bodily organs desire those things on which our physical nature (qizhi zhi xing) depends for nourishment. The so-called human desires of human nature originate from the Way of the formation and transformation of heaven-and-earth (tiandao). In the case of humanity, they are rooted in human nature and expressed in daily affairs. In this sense, they constitute the Way of humanity (rendao). (Chung-ying Cheng 1971: 76).

Since desires, as integral parts of the physical nature, constituted both the Way of humanity and the Way of heaven, human nature could not be, as the Song masters had contended, bifurcated into its moral-heavenly manifestation and material-earthly disclosure. Dai asserted that the nature, xing, was whole, comprising both blood and breath (xueqi)—the psycho-physiological—and the mind-heart and wisdom (xinzhi)—the cognitive-spiritual. Both, as a whole, were derived from “yin-yang and the five agents”, and “originated from the process of the production and transformation of heaven-and-earth” (yuan yu tiandi zhi hua). He waxed rhetorical,

As for the fact that a person is a person, if physical endowment (qibing) and physical constitution (qizhi) are cast aside, in what way can a person be described as a person? (Dai MZZYSZ: 51)

Dai’s arguments struck at the heart of the Neo-Confucian metaphysical conception of principle, the Way of heaven, and moral nature as prior and fundamentally substantive. Instead, he construed qi as the basic stuff out of which all things and the nature were wrought, and in the process, he stressed the materiality and concreteness of all beings.

In sum, a vitalist sensibility animated the philosophical thoughts of many a Qing thinker, placing qi and its manifestations at the center of life and the world. But we must bear in mind the caveat that such thinking amounted to no materialism or naturalism in the western philosophical sense of the words. Material human desires in themselves were never considered to be a principle, even though they were conceived as integral and authentic components of a holistic nature. Nevertheless, if it was not full-fledged formal philosophy, the qi-based worldview was a fundamental attitude and disposition that located life’s meanings, possibilities, and motives in the actualities of the corporeal world. As qi dislodged the importance of li, knowledge acquired through the senses’ commerce with the workaday world (wenjian zhi zhi), as opposed to moral knowledge attained through intuitive knowing of the virtuous nature (dexing zhi zhi), claimed priority. In an a-metaphysical age that was the Qing, there was no triumph of qi-oriented thinking qua philosophy, but a vitalist ontology did furnish a criterion of intelligibility that undergirded the other modes of intellection—historicism, utilitarianism, intellectualism.

3. Historicism: Contingency and Constancy

Neo-Confucian thought in the Song-Ming times bore a strong dimension of ontological ultimacy, such that its criteria of intelligibility may be considered as essentially metaphysical in nature. As the vitalist sensibility began to take center stage in the late Ming and early Qing, there was a shift from the ontological (the essential and transcendent) to the ontic (the contingent and experiential), and the latter came to be expressed as a historicism—a prevailing worldview that appreciated changing particulars rather than a foundational metaphysics of eternal universals. Thus, the term “historicism”, as it is used in the context of Qing philosophy, is interchangeable with descriptions such as “the sense of history”, “the historical” and “historical-mindedness”. Indeed, a permeating sense of history seemed to have formed a common thread that ran through the learning of the intellectual stalwarts who personified the Ming-Qing intellectual transition, such as the aforementioned Wang Fuzhi, Gu Yanwu, and Huang Zongxi. They pursued their subject-matters, such as the classics, institutions, statecraft, and phonology, by coming to grips with their patterns of development and growth, taking into account their diversity and particularity. They were inclined to eschew totalizing metaphysical views that conferred on things and affairs an underpinning unity. Instead, they embraced a historicist perspective that shunned supra-historical principles and transcendent norms, subjecting the investigation of phenomena to a logic of becoming, not being. Lest we exaggerate the extent and influence of this time-bound and relativist historicist perspective, a note of reservation and qualification is needed. While the Qing philosophical mode of intellection no doubt diverged from the ahistoricist Neo-Confucianism that saw history as a function of some ultimate truth such as li, tian, ordao, it was not entirely freed from the belief in some transhistorical and universal reality. The historicism in Qing philosophy was fraught with tension, to the extent that the appreciation for the particularity was tempered by a transhistorical sense of abiding universal order.

Our ideal-typical historicism found expression in Huang Zongxi’s and Wang Fuzhi’s efforts to reformulate the Neo-Confucian ontology. Huang’s historicist sensibility can be seen in the very first lines of his masterpiece, the Mingru xue’an (Intellectual Records of Ming Scholars), in which he lay out a metaphysical predicate:

Throughout heaven and earth is the mind-heart (xin), whose changes are unpredictable. It is inexorably manifested in myriad different forms. The mind-heart has no fundamental substance. Fundamental substance is that which is achieved by its efficacious effort. Therefore, to plumb the principle (li) is to probe the myriad different forms of this mind-heart, not the myriad different forms of the myriad things. (Huang MRXA: preface 9)

While Huang asserted the mind-heart as the point of departure, he moved away from the orientations of the so-called learning of the mind-heart (xinxue) in Neo-Confucianism. Instead of focusing on “fundamental substance”, Huang emphasized “efforts”. Rather than moving inward toward the mind-heart, Huang’s position drifted outward into the outer physical phenomenal world, in which there were the ever-changing “myriad different forms”, differences perceived through the one mind notwithstanding. In other words, although there was the overarching universal mind-heart, this mind-heart was no incorporeal original substance hovering above the concrete variegated world of particularities and efforts. There was no immutable fundamental substance as such, as the mind-heart was developmental in nature, manifested in the external myriad differences.

Huang also had a dynamic view of institutional evolution. Upon examining the historical origins and evolutions of the various specific institutions, he concluded that imitation of the institutions described in the ancient classics was impractical, stating that “under heaven… there have not been laws and institutions that could not be overthrown” (quoted in Gu Qingmei 1978: 146). Huang saw his own time as one bound to a long historical series, as one segment contiguous with the preceding and succeeding epoch. There were the ancient Three Dynasties with their magnificent order, followed by two thousand years of disorder after the death of Confucius. Now, the time for change had again come.

Wang Fuzhi reordered the Neo-Confucian ontology through his historico-philosophical theory of shi (conditions) vis-à-vis li (principle). Wang accorded principle priority as the immanent pattern of all things and affairs, that is, as that which is “the certain” (guran), “the necessary” (biran), “the self-evident” (dangran), “the why and wherefore” (suoyiran) and “the natural” (ziran). But principle was embedded in concrete psycho-physical force (qi) and manifested in actual conditions:

Therefore, originally, there is principle which can be readily seen in material force. Accordingly, this obtained principle naturally becomes conditions. Thus principle can be seen in these necessary conditions. (Wang QSYS: 48:9.5a)

Principle and conditions should always “be discussed syncretically as a whole” (Wang QSYS: 48:9.5a-b). This relational integrity presumed that the primacy of principle was predicated on the immediacy of differentiation: “Conditions become different when times are different; principle also becomes different when conditions are different” (Wang QSYS: 58:15.3b). Li-qi as a totality represented the universe as complex phenomena of perpetually appearing contingencies, subject to the workings of human agency: “When one accords with the times, one complies with that which the time makes inevitable in order to save oneself, and so escape from disaster” (quoted in McMorran 1975: 457).

As with Huang Zongxi, Wang Fu-chih saw the development of institutions through a historicist perspective. The institutions of each age were compositely the shi, or conditions sui generis. They were the Way of that age, which human beings with volitions and transformative leverage followed. Every age had its own appropriate institutions:

The rule of every epoch should be in accordance with its own time, establishing [the particular] institutions of an epoch…. Never has there been the successful establishment of governance as a result of imitating the one merit of just the one thing of the ancients, or championing one ancient thing, obtrusively injected into the present. (Wang QSYS: 21:5b-6a)

Even the Classics prescribed no unchanging models:

As to setting up schemes or arranging for details, neither the Book of History nor Confucius said anything about them…. Because the ancient institutions were meant to govern the ancient world and cannot be followed today, the superior man does not base his activities on them, and because what is suitable today can govern the world of today but will not necessarily for the future, the superior man does not hand it down to posterity as a model. (quoted in Chan 1963: 701)

Gu Yanwu, unlike Huang and Wang, eschewed metaphysical pondering altogether. He advanced the view that dynamic historical change was the rule of the day with regard to institutional development. The value of institutions was determined by the contexts of both their origins and their subsequent functional uses. He, for instance, hammered home this message in his proposal to reform the weisuo (guard and battalion) military system of the late Ming dynasty:

Without the change of institutions, current problems cannot be rectified. If in a circumstance where change is inevitable, one still conceals the actuality of [the need for] change and obstinately clings to the position of not changing, it will certainly lead to the gravest of calamities. (Gu GTLSWJ: 128)

There must be periodic reforms to forestall calamities:

If we understand that the feudal system changed into the prefectural system, we also understand that as the prefectural system in turn falls into decay, it too must change. Does it mean that there will be a return to feudalism? No, this is impossible. But if some sage who could invest the prefectural system with the essential meaning of feudalism were to appear, then the world would attain order…. Now, the defects of the prefectural [system] have developed to their utmost…. But still, it was followed in all its details. That is why the livelihood of people is diminishing daily; that is why China is growing weaker daily. (GTLSWJ: 12)

But it is noteworthy that while Huang, Wang, and Gu argued for expedient change relative to the time and its particular conditions, they all subscribed to the universal values ensconced in the ancient Classics. Huang embraced the enduring principles bequeathed by the ancient Three Dynasties. In his famous Mingyi daifang lu (A Plan for the Prince), he affirmed the constancy of the ancient principle of governance which was, in brief, unswerving devotion to promoting the interests and benefits of the people:

When the sagely rulers appeared, they did not treat their own profits as profits, but would seek to benefit the world. [They did] not regard harm to themselves as the only harm, but would seek to release the world from harm. They had to work thousands of times harder than other people in the world. (Huang MYDFL: 2)

Wang Fuzhi also posited timeless principle in the historical process of governance. He balanced the particularities of the dynasties against the constant principles of the Classics:

For the best way of government, there is nothing better than to examine the Classic of Documents and modify it with the words of Confucius. But the central point is whether the ruler’s heart is serious or dissolute…. The great function of government is to make use of worthy men and promote education. In dealing with people, it should bestow humanity and love to the highest degree. Whether in the government of Yao and Shun, in the Three Dynasties, or [in the period] from the Qin and Han down to the present, in no case can these principles not be extended and applied. (quoted in Chan 1963: 701)

Wang saw excellence in the ancient sage-rulers’ achievements and thus regarded historical changes as divergence from the Golden Past. Gu Yanwu also enjoined rulers to uphold the Confucian “four bonds” (siwei) as the overarching principles that guided history:

Propriety (li) and righteousness (i) are the supreme ways in ruling people. Integrity (lian) and the sense of shame (chi) are the great principles in cultivating humanity. Without integrity, there is nothing that is not coveted; without the sense of shame, there is no [wicked] deed that is not committed. If people are like that, catastrophe, failure, disorder, and death will come. (Gu RZL: 5:53)

In his Records of Daily Knowledge (Rizhi lu), Gu surveyed the entire course of Chinese history, from the Zhou to his own time, and concluded that only when ethics and morals were championed that peace and prosperity could be attained.

Thus, Huang, Wang, and Gu’s admiration of the ancient past imbued their historicism with a sense of ultimacy achieved once upon a time. While they might not be seeking literal return to the past, they betrayed their yearning for the constant and the transhistorical. Their goal of encrusting measures apposite to current needs with ancient principles suggested that there was more to history than the contingencies and expediencies of any one time.

The mid-Qing witnessed the predominance of the intellectualist pursuit of evidential research (kaozheng), with particular regard to the exegetical and philological investigations of the classics, driven by the fundamentalist goal to retrieve the antique Way enshrined in the classical texts. Nevertheless, when the classics and antiquity were subjected to meticulous scrutiny and rigorous examination, the ancient past came to be interrogated and problematized. Which were the authentic classics? Which part of antiquity was to be restored? How should we go about apprehending the past? Therefore, what began as a classicization of antiquity aimed at cutting through the Neo-Confucian metaphysical babel ended as a partial historicization of the classics. The ancient past and the classics became objects in time to be studied, thereby given their historicity. The works and thoughts of Dai Zhen (1724–77) and Zhang Xuecheng (1738–1801) exemplified the historicist temper of the time.

Dai Zhen, as we have seen, contended that everything had its principle, which varied in accordance with the thing itself. Universality was broken into particularities, such that principle (li) was the “inner texture of things” (tiaoli), the organizational pattern and textural configuration of the psycho-physical force (qi), manifested as “living, drinking, eating, talking and acting” (Dai MZZYSZ: 110–113). Dai questioned the notion of an essential principle invariant through time through his idea of “expedient weighing of circumstances” (quan), associated with the idea of change (bian):

With quan, the insignificant and important can be distinguished…. Constancy refers to the obvious insignificant and important [things], observed by all throughout time. As for the important becoming insignificant, or insignificant becoming important, it is change (bian). Change cannot be fully known without the correct measure resulting from intelligent exhaustive observations and investigations. (MZZYSZ: 125)

Consequently, right and wrong (shifei) should be gauged in relationship to expediency:

Obstinately adhering to the apparently important and insignificant as seen by all, [many people] affirm what is right, and criticize what is wrong. In fact, [they] do not realize that timely expediency renders the important into the insignificant, the insignificant important. (MZZYSZ: 128)

In his masterly essay, “Probing the Original Goodness” (Yuanshan), Dai identified expediency as one of the characteristics of the pervading common virtue of “goodness” (shan): “Because of its coherence with changes, it is called the norm of expediency” (Chung-ying Cheng 1971: 68). This appreciation for change was transposed epistemologically into Dai’s preoccupation with meticulous examination of the origins and developments of multifarious things in history: ancient pronunciations of characters, attire and costumes, changes in place names, implements of the artisans, nomenclature and categories of fauna and flora, mathematics, musical instruments, and the like. The principles and meanings of the sages, and indeed the Way itself, had to be found in the actual “statutes, laws, institutions and measures” (Dai DZWJ: 145), that is, things in the historical records.

Yet, there was no consistent historicism in Dai’s philosophy. His conception of change was ultimately constrained by his abiding sense of the ultimacy of “the necessary” (biran):

The Odes says, “Where there is a thing, there is a rule”. “Thing” is the name for an actual body and an actual matter. “Rule” is the name for its primary fundamental quintessence. All actual bodies and actual matters are natural, which ultimately return to the necessary. (Dai MZZYSZ: 60)

The “primary fundamental quintessence” and “the necessary”, in space and time respectively, denoted the totality of all beings. Individuality was simply a variation or expression of the totalizing Way, or common goodness:

[G]oodness is used to mean what is inherent in humanity [and things.]… The so-called goodness is nothing other than the formation and transformation of heaven-and-earth and the function and capacities of nature. (Chung-ying Cheng 1971: 33–34)

Individual nature was the result of the “allotment” (fen) by the “dao of heaven”. One’s destiny, as mandated by the Way of heaven, accounted for one’s individual nature: “The limit set by [Heaven’s] allotment is called destiny which, in producing a kind of constitution, is called nature” (1971: 2) This foundational perspective of inexorability became in Dai’s classical learning the confirmation of the universality of the sages’ ancient values:

If we do not seek to understand the utterances and deeds of the ancient sages, there is no way we can investigate their mind [which pervades] the ensuing thousands of years. Therefore, it is through [the study of] the Classics, mathematics, institutions and categories of things that [the meaning of their] language can be comprehended, thereby meeting them with one mind. (Dai DZWJ: 177)

Dai Zhen’s philosophy was inspired by faith in the eternality of the ancient Way, concerned with effecting the return of a moral system already established in antiquity. Yet, this return was enabled only by the examination of the historical records, which yielded a keen awareness of differentness, particularity, individuality and contingency—a historicist sensibility. Dai juxtaposed the classics (the Way/dao) and history (expediency/quan), such that historical pursuits were complementary with fundamentalist classical studies aimed at restoring ancient truths.

A testimonial of the synthesis of history and classics was Zhang Xuecheng’s famous statement in his Wenshi tongyi (General principles of literature and history): “The Six Classics are all histories”. He further said, “The ancients never did talk of principles separated from affairs. The Six Classics are the statutes and records of the government of the ancient rulers” (Zhang WSTY: 2). These claims formed the foundation of Zhang’s view of history: history referred to the history of the institutions and laws of antiquity, and principles could only be discussed with reference to actual events—history. If the classics were time-bound, that is, within antiquity, then the dao resided therein was temporally circumscribed:

The meanings concealed in what had occurred once upon a time [in antiquity] can be adequately explained through glossing and etymological study of the [classical] texts. As to the development of events which occurred thereafter, the classics could not have anything to say. (WSTY: 42)

The classics recorded only the laws and institutions of the ancient rulers, the material realities of the ancient Way:

The learning of the Three Dynasties recognized only history and not the classics. [It was because it] was intimately related to human affairs…. [O]ne who talks about human nature and heaven’s mandate must study history. (WSTY: 52)

In order to know the dao-in-history, one had to examine the entire course of history. Recent history revealed the recent Way, and ancient history shed light on the ancient one. Consequently, Zhang promoted the study of current history and the development of an awareness of “valuing the institutions of the current ruler”. Learning involved investigations of the existing institutions closely connected to human relations and daily utility. No matter how advanced scholarship on the ancient past was, without knowing the present, it would be “inappropriate for practical application” (WSTY: 53).

But Zhang did not see the past simply as successive parades of relative spatial forms and temporal segments. Instead of particularizing the ancient past and the classics once and for all, Zhang often sought in them the universally normative. The dao-in-history pertained to the pattern of change of the political, social and institutional polity, things such as “government, pedagogy, marking out boundaries, delimiting prefectures, well-field system, feudalism and education” (WSTY: 34). These were changing forms of life relative to their own place and time, embodying their own Way. But overarching these particular Ways was the transhistorical dao of the ancient sages, enshrined in the classics, which Zhang called the “the essential Way” (daoti):

The essential Way leaves nothing unembodied. It is exhaustively explicated in the Six Classics. The various other philosophers were able to write at all, maintaining their well-reasoned viewpoints and making logical sense, because [they] invariably had attained [understanding] of one aspect of the essential dao. (WSTY: 16–17)

This transhistorical Way was thus the provenance of all learning and philosophy. Elsewhere, Zhang regarded this Way as “moral-ritual teachings” (mingjiao):

What the ancient sage-rulers showed the world to enlighten the people were nothing but [their] moral-ritual teachings. Since ancient times, none have achieved peace without moral-ritual teachings. (WSTY: 95)

Moral-ritual teachings were the very stuff and source of governance. When Zhang urged that post-antiquity history be examined independently of the Six Classics, he did not aim at demolishing the classics’ sacral authority. He only cautioned against any literal usage of them in historical endeavors, which could swamp all sense of change after the Three Dynasties. Zhang enjoined us to “value summing up the essence of the principles of the Six Classics and narrate events in time in order to probe the great dao” (WSTY: 42). History, in a sense, was the unfurling of this authoritative “great Way” (dadao), the meanings and messages of which were expounded in the classics:

The great meaning of the Six Classics is brilliant as the sun and moon. [The lessons of] losses and gains in the Three Dynasties can be projected [as guides for the subsequent] hundred ages. (WSTY: 50)

Thus, in the “essential dao”, the “great dao” or the essential and great “moral-ritual teachings”, Zhang’s historicism was dissolved.

As the cases of Dai Zhen and Zhang Xuecheng show, Qing thought involved the rethinking of the individual as a historical being who verified the validity of institutions and laws through the authority of history, resisting values and norms that were conceived as the formulaic good applied to all times and cases. Yet, it dislodged no telos of the ancient Way, as a mainspring of Qing philosophy was surely the retrieval of the dao of the classics. Historicism as a means of evaluating the past achieved no hegemony. What occurred was a critical hermeneutical exploration of the ancient classics and writings. Within the boundaries of the inherited intellectual tradition, the classicist endeavors bred a historicist sensibility, problematizing the nature of the Way as the embodiment of truth-in/above-history. This historicism signified a discursive tension that placed a strain on an intellectual field, but one nevertheless circumscribed by age-old Confucian values.

4. Utilitarianism: Thought and Action

In traditional China, the Confucian literati did not consider thought and learning to be separate from action in the public world at large. They were, in fact, much inspired by a beatific vision of a public space in which social and political actions yielded a world of peace and order. In the classic text, Doctrine of the Mean (Zhongyong), the profound paradigmatic person (junzi) is described as one who reverently realizes one’s virtuous, heaven-conferred nature, and pursues inquiry and learning. The Great Learning (Daxue) further tells us that these efforts have a three-pronged end: cultivating the self (xiuxin), ordering the state (zhiguo), and bringing peace to the world (ping tianxia). Thus, the individuated internal goal of achieving sagehood (neisheng) is inextricably bound to the outer concerns of implementing the Way of kingship (waiwang). In contradistinction to Plato’s or even Hegel’s otherworldly philosophy—Plato saw the philosopher as one whose body (not mind) inhabited the city of his fellow human beings, and Hegel viewed philosophy as a world stood on its head, from the vantage point of commonsense—Confucianism regarded the world of workaday affairs as coterminous with the world of ideas in which thinkers dwelled. The abiding ideal of “ordering the world and extending utility” (jingshi zhiyong) demanded the conjugation of private moral cultivation and its public realization. In Qing philosophy, there was this palpable intellectual purport based on the utilitarian ideal of ordering the world, which bred a moral seriousness about the everyday realities of society and state. This utilitarianism posited an intimate relation between thought and action, regarding as insignificant or irrelevant metaphysical concepts that resisted translation into some form of effort leading to concrete outcomes. The corollaries of xue (learning) and zhi (knowing) were yong (utility) and xing (action).

To be sure, this utilitarianism was not devoid of moral and normative imperatives, to the extent that actions had to be inspired and guided by values such as moral rulership (wang), rightness and integrity (yi), and public-mindedness (gong). At the same time, it embraced an ethical perspective that invested value in the utility and function of secular, institutional amelioration. From the late Ming onward, thought did gravitate far more toward actualities and practicalities, as the ideal and slogan of jingshi, ordering the world, took center stage. Gu Yanwu loathed what he considered to be the “empty and vacuous learning” (kongxu zhi xue) in the Ming times, which

disposed of and refrained from talking about the ills and deprivations within the four seas, and spoke always about lofty imperceptible subtlety and absolute holistic purity. (Gu GTLSWJ: 43)

Following the examples of the sages who never severed the ties between learning and socio-political concerns, Gu proclaimed that

he would not pursue any learning that does not relate to the central principle of the Six Classics and the affairs and responsibilities in the current world.

Just as

all the books written by them [the sages] were for the purpose of discarding the wrong and returning to the right, and of changing customs and practices so as to attain order and harmony, (GTLSWJ: 142)

so “a profound person pursues learning to illuminate the Way and save the world” (GTLSWJ: 103). Gu wrote his masterwork, Records of Daily Knowledge (Rizhi lu), to urge participation in society, a life-long endeavor that “did not end until death” (si er hou yi). The book formulated practical views that would be useful for the rulers:

I wrote…the Records of Daily Knowledge, the first part of which is on classical studies, the middle part on the way of governance, and the final part on general experience and general knowledge, altogether over thirty fascicles. In the event a prince appears, he would discern in it actual practices and affairs. With it, he could elevate this current age to the prosperity of the ancient age of order. (GTLSWJ: 103)

A similar utilitarian thread ran through Huang Zongxi’s thought. He defined the existential mission of a Confucian profound person, junzi, to which everyone should aspire: “To bring peace to the country and to preserve society are the obligations of a junzi” (Huang MYDFL: 32). His learning was meant to form “the warp and the woof of heaven-and-earth” (jingwei tiandi), and so he criticized scholars for

trying futilely to manage the world by lavish and high-sounding ideas of establishing the ultimate in order to regenerate the masses, of establishing the mind-heart of the universe, and of following the everlasting peace of the thousand ages.

Arrogantly, they

view those who manage finances and taxation as engaging in hoarding profit and wealth… and those who carefully supervise administration and government as tawdry officials.


when the day to serve the country comes, they are bemused and befuddled, as though they are sitting within a cloud. Therefore, the ways of the world (shidao) have become corrupt and rotten. (Huang NLWDHJ: vol. 6, p. 549)

The practical ways of the world could be found in the classics and histories: “The Six Classics are all books that recorded the Way…, the actual rulership (shizhi)…, the actual practices (shixing)” (Huang NLWDHJ: vol. 6, p. 442–443). “All that was recorded in the Twenty-one Histories was the enterprise of ordering the world” (Huang NLWY: vol. 6, p. 351).

Wang Fuzhi also castigated the late Ming literati for embracing empty intuitionism, “becoming lax about maintaining clear distinctions in social relations (minglun) and investigating things”, such that they no longer cared about “whether or not names correspond to realities” (quoted in McMorran 1975: 434). Learning, to Wang, must have a practical intellectual purport:

Every paragraph, every title, every work, and every sentence should lead one back to one’s body and mind-heart. They should cohere with one’s grand purpose,

which is

to distinguish its grand meaning in order to establish the basis for cultivating oneself and governance. (quoted in Ji Wenfu 1978: 1–3)

Wang privileged the study of history precisely because of its practical utility: “What is valuable about history is its account of the past as the teacher of the future”. History would be ill written if “the general framework of ordering the world (jingshi) is not illuminated” (quoted in 1978: 1). In short, historical learning, in the end, was statecraft.

While it seemed evident that utilitarian thinking that actively combatted moral intuitionism predominated in the early Qing in the seventeenth century, its edges might have been dulled in the eighteenth century. The conventional explanation is that scholars channeled their energy into the sort of pedantic studies of philology and classical texts, as represented by the so-called movement of evidential learning (kaozheng xue) that received the court’s approval and encouragement. But it is a very partial view that fails to convey the whole picture, as utilitarian thinking was in fact alive and well among the kaozheng practitioners and partisans, many of whom continued to see the classics as guides to ordering the world. Qian Daxin (1728–1804), a towering figure in the kaozheng movement, touted the practical value of these ancient texts:

[The Five Classics] were employed by the sages to make the warps and woofs of the world. The ultimate goal was to render the world good. The secondary function was to rule oneself. (Qian QYTWJ: 310)

Qian referred to the classics specifically in terms of the ideals of jingshi and zhiyong—ordering the world and extending utility:

Confucian learning rests with the illumination of the substance in order to extend utility. The Odes, Documents, and Rites are all writings for the ordering of the world. In the Analects with twenty fascicles and Mencius with seven fascicles, more than half are discussions on administration and government. What the masters and students discussed and sought at the time were the principles of sustaining oneself, of living in the world, of refusal, of acceptance, of receiving, and of giving. As for [the philosophical questions of] nature and the Way of heaven, even those who were eminently upright did not hear of them. In this manner, the Confucians worked on practicality and utility, and did not value empty talks. (QYTWJ: 373)

In short, wen, literary expressions and writings, must seek to realize the following practical goals: illuminating the Way (mingdao), ordering the world (jingshi), revealing the subtle (chanyu), and rectifying customs (zhengsu).

Zhang Xuecheng’s historiographic thinking was anchored on the goal and ideal of ordering the world. Because the classics “outlined the ordering of the world by the kings and the emperors”, they were histories indeed. Zhang proclaimed that “historical learning is for the ordering of the world” (shixue suoyi jingshi):

I say, “historical learning is for the ordering of the world. It is surely not writings of empty words”. For instance, the Six Classics all came from Confucius. The early Confucians thought that his greatest achievement was the Spring and Autumn Annals. It was precisely because it was intimately related to the social realities of the time. Those of the later ages who spoke about writings disregarded social realities, and discussed in an abstract manner the nature and heaven. Thus, I know they achieved nothing. Scholars who do not know such purport [of learning] are not qualified to talk about historical learning.

Zhang criticized the Han learning scholars for dwelling on the trivial ceremonial details (quli) while neglecting and ignoring the basic political institutions (jingli). Practical learning meant understanding “the essential substance of the ancients in order to enlarge the mind-heart”, so that one could “determine what is right for the present” (Zhang WSTY: 53).

The discursive production of Qing philosophy was empowered and powered by the utilitarian impulse to engender and yield utility, seeking emancipation from the moral introspection of Song-Ming thought. As Qing philosophical thought abjured abstract pondering of metaphysical matters and questions, it turned to advocacy for ameliorative actions that directly bettered the state and society.

5. Intellectualism: External Knowledge and Inquiry

A protuberant ideational strand that made up the Qing philosophical universe was the affirmative outlook regarding discursive knowledge and intellectual pursuit of the dao as the Way of the exterior world, supplanting the introspective endeavor and spiritual contemplation aimed at internal enlightenment and realization. A word here about the socio-political context of this shift is necessary. The intellectualist reorientation that characterized the Ming-Qing transition owed much to the literati’s conception of the palpable political, social, and economic problems of dynastic decline, which eventuated in the fall of the Ming and the establishment of a conquest dynasty. As they saw it, the root cause of dynastic declension and demise was the pervasive moral and spiritual degeneration brought on by the intellectual bankruptcy of the late Ming, as learning and thinking fell under the pernicious sway of empty intuitionism and internal introspection. A moribund culture and a weak state could only be reinvigorated with the right kind of learning that was concrete, practical, and substantive. This culture of criticism as a result placed a premium on the classics, the actual words of the ancient sages as the substantive source of authority. Antiquity itself, personified by the efficacious virtuous deeds of the sages, served as the exemplar of order and amelioration. As particular attention was lavished on the thorough, literal understanding of these texts and words, an intellectualist philosophical outlook emerged in the world of thought and learning. Yü Ying-shih has famously labeled this outlook “intellectualism”, which is an ideal-type thinking abstracted from the Confucian quest for “the way of inquiry and learning” (dao wenxue), in contradistinction to the anti-intellectualist enterprise of “honoring the heaven-endowed moral virtuous nature” (zun dexing). The former sought data and corroborations of realities in the external realm of myriad phenomena and things, whereas the latter appealed intuitively to the internal realm of one’s very nature, whose quiddity was morally good, insofar as it was endowed by heaven. If Song-Ming philosophical thought was characterized by its identification with inner moral reckoning and awakening, then the Qing counterpart was marked by its special focusing on external, objective knowledge, whose basis and point of departure were the classical texts as objects of cognitive inquiries.

Yet, the point must be made that embedded in this rupture was continuity in some important ways. The entire Song-Ming tradition of thought was no doubt subjected to wholesale reexamination, but to begin with, the basis of their criticism and construction stemmed from a well-established preexisting strand of learning. One famous Song definition of the quintessence of the Confucian tradition by Liu Yi (1017–1086) identified the three principal components of ti (substance, essence, spirit, principle, core, and soul), yong (function, utility, practicality, application, action, and effort) and wen (literature, writings, philology, belles-lettres, textual learning, classical studies). Together, they constituted the goals and contents of Confucian learning. Qing intellectualism focused on the primacy of wen as a central manifestation of yong. Moreover, the scholars, despite their general discontent with what they perceived to be empty and recondite Song-Ming learning and their desire to reform it, continued to delineate their scholarly and philosophical allegiance in terms of association with the two schools of Neo-Confucianism: the so-called Cheng-Zhu school and Lu-Wang school. In fact, many of them engaged in intellectualist enterprises precisely for the purpose of wielding philology as a weapon to defend their philosophical views while at the same time seeking to weaken and demolish those of their opponents.

Nevertheless, even though Qing intellectualism was an outgrowth of the Confucian tradition with a time-worn pedigree, it was also new in the sense that the kaozheng (evidential research) movement and methodology, the utmost expression of the intellectualist spirit, by virtue of its intellectual scale and density, wrought an epochal breakthrough. It came to be inescapably and unmistakably identified with the special Qing way of construing reality and the world. Kaozheng scholarship opened up hermeneutic issues of interpretation. As Benjamin Elman has pointed out, the classics as a whole were unproblematically recognized as assent-eliciting cultural and textual capital, but once they were subjected to interrogation as individual separate texts, dissent and disquiet arose. The authenticity of some texts came to be questioned; their places in the heterogeneous commentarial came to be debated; their authority came to be reassessed; and the manner of retrieving the antique messages came to be argued. In short, the classics were historicized. Moreover, what began as studies of the classics spilled over into other areas of inquiry—bronze artifacts, pre-Qin thinkers and texts, history, geography, cosmology, science, and so on.

Gu Yanwu, in the early Qing, asserted that the study of principle (lixue) was irredeemably contracted to the study of the classics (jingxue). According to him, in ancient times, any study of principle was perforce an investigation of the classics, in which the basis and operation of principle could be discerned and understood. Hence his research of ancient phonology:

I think that the study of the Nine Classics should begin with textual analysis, and the study of textual analysis should begin with a knowledge of phonology. It is the same with the study of all the various philosophers and the hundred schools. (Gu GTLSWJ: 76)

Gu criticized his contemporaries for pursuing what was to him empty and abstract “Chan Buddhist learning” (Chanxue), since they relied on the “records of dialogues” (yulu) of the Song-Ming scholars and ignored the classics, which were the ben of learning, that is, the root, substance, and basis. He rejected the totalizing methodology of yiguan zhi fa (the way of connecting everything), which was the epistemological orientation of Song-Ming learning that eschewed and swamped concrete particulars. Instead, Gu called for “duoxue er shi (to get to know through multifarious learning)” and “duojian er shi (to get to know through multifarious observation)”, such that one achieved “boxue yu wen (erudition in all writings)” (Gu GTLSWJ: 43–44). To him, the classics recorded and consisted of nothing but “what the sages had heard and seen (shengren suowen suojian)” (Gu RZL: 37–38). His intellectualist stance was a classic expression of “following the way of learning and inquiry” (dao wenxue), involving empirical observations and painstaking accumulation of broad knowledge.

Huang Zongxi, as a self-touted follower of the Lu-Wang tradition, made a point to reinterpret Wang Yangming’s central idea of “zhi liangzhi” (extending spontaneous moral knowing to the utmost) in intellectualist terms. While Wang tended to think that knowledge must be grasped in terms of the ultimate substance of one’s own mind-heart and could not be made clear in words, thereby casting doubt on the efficacy of words and discursive practices, Huang spoke on behalf of the Ming master by claiming that the act of “extending” (zhi) innate moral knowing was practice, that is, the very act of “broad learning, examining and inquiring, deliberation with utmost care, and identifying differences clearly are all practices” (Huang MRXA: v.2, p. 53). Later, Quan Zuwang (1705–1755), an admirer of Huang’s scholarship, would offer this encomium by citing Huang’s words:

[Huang] once said, “The profession of [studying] the classics is for the ordering of the world (ordering the world).” Therefore, he did not pursue the learning of the petty Confucians but commanded [himself] to study the classics and history. He also said, “Without [such] study, the changes and transformations of principle (i) cannot be verified”. (quoted in Gu Qingmei 1978: 118)

Wang Fuzhi also repudiated the Neo-Confucian epistemological assertions of the possibility of mingjie (esoteric understanding) and miaowu (mysterious enlightenment), both which were anti-intellectualist in conception, in that they referred to direct intuitive apprehension of the truth without the intervention of actual study. He insisted that “the principles of the multitudinous things cannot be known without learning and cannot be distinguished without erudition”. Knowledge, for Wang, came from our direct engagement with and experience of the “changing external forms” (kexing) in the universe, such as

the rising, setting, waning, and waxing of the sun and moon, and the succession of the seasons, the birth and death of the myriad things, and wind, rain, dew, and thunder. (quoted in Hou Wailu 1958, 108)

He claimed that

when a thing is known, then its name is known. When its name is known, then its significance is known. Without contact with things, even if the mind-heart is imbued with its innate ability, [it] cannot name the names, and things cannot be accomplished. (ibid., 108***see previous*)

Wang thus argued strongly in favor of “investigation of things” (gewu), which employed both the mind-heart, and our senses of hearing and seeing, that is, empirical observation. He defined their inexorable interrelation and interaction in the quest for knowledge:

The effort of the investigation of things employs both the faculty of the mind-heart, and hearing and seeing. Study and inquiry are the mainstay, aided by thinking and distinguishing between differences…. Hearing and seeing are the resources for the functioning of the mind-heart, setting the direction for it to follow. (quoted in Ji Wenfu 1978: 45)

Wang’s theory of knowledge affirmed the irreducibility of discursive knowledge gained thorough investigating things—study and inquiry—to morality spontaneously apprehended by the mind-heart.

In the eighteenth century, when the kaozheng (evidential research) movement held sway, the common consensus was that learning must be concrete and empirical. The ultimate goal was to retrieve and restore, via philological explications (xungu), the pristine and unadulterated meanings of the sages’ words, so that their moral meanings (yili) could come to the fore, crystal clear. Qian Daxin said it well:

There are first writings and words (wenzi) and then there are philological explications of the classics. There are first philological explications and then there are moral principles. Philological explications of the classics are the sources from which moral meanings are derived. (Qian QYTWJ: 349)

He asked,

Under heaven, is there any endeavor that abandons study and inquiry and specifically pursues the reverent realization of one’s moral nature? (QYTWJ: 245)

Here, he explicitly affirmed the importance of following the way of inquiry and learning, warning against exclusive focus on the realization of our putatively moral nature. This intellectualist stance was shared by Dai Zhen, who also waxed rhetorical:

But if the pursuit of study and inquiry was abandoned, would it then be possible to lead a life for the reverent realization of one’s moral nature? (Dai DZWJ: 140)

For Dai, to study and inquire was to “hear the dao (wendao)” (DZWJ: 145). Thus, the intellectualist quest was antecedent to any attempt to apprehend principle and the nature:

To seek the most appropriate [principles] means that knowledge comes first. In no way does sagely learning ever call for eliminating selfishness without also seeking to remove befuddlement, or emphasizing action without first emphasizing knowledge. (quoted in Yü Ying-shih 1982: 389)

To put it plainly, “moral nature… feeds on learning and inquiry in order to develop sagely intelligence” (quoted in 1982: 390).

Zhang Xuecheng shared the kaozheng scholars’ enthusiasm for concrete and critical study of the classics (which he regarded as histories) and their aversion toward esoteric moral speculation. He stated, “The ancients never did talk about principle removed from things and affairs”, and “those who talk about nature and heaven’s mandate must study history” (quoted in Yü Ying-shih 1976: 46). Like Huang Zongxi, he redefined, in intellectualist terms, what Wang Yangming’s notion of zhi liangzhi (extending spontaneous moral knowing to the utmost) meant. Wang’s liangzhi was innate, spontaneous, ineffable, and intuitive, realizable through internal introspection. By contrast, Zhang’s version referred to “what a learner considered to be closest to his talents (cai) [and]… affective and emotive predispositions (xingqing)”, both of which were natural predispositions “to learn” (xue). On the other hand, Zhang explained the notion of “extending” zhi as “the learner’s effort to search for knowledge” (xuezhe qiuzhi zhi gong) (quoted in Yü Ying-shih 1976: 79–80).

In sum, intellectualism, as a leitmotif in the constellation of Qing philosophy, expresses itself in two ways. As a methodology, it referred to the pursuit of inferential and empirical knowledge, most prominently manifested in textual philological research. As a philosophical outlook, it reevaluated and revised the central Neo-Confucian notion of internal self-cultivation aimed at spontaneous realization of the heaven-endowed moral nature, arguing instead in favor of the quest for external knowledge mediated by the noetic senses. Intellectual cognitive faculties would take precedence over the intuitive power of the mind-heart.


A. Primary Sources Quoted

  • Dai Zhen 戴震 (1723–1777)
    • [DZWJ] Dai Zhen wenji戴震文集, Xianggang: Zhonghua shuju, 1974.
    • [MZZYSZ] Mengzi ziyi shuzheng孟子字义疏证, Beijing: Zhonghua shuju, 1982.
  • Gu Yanwu 顧炎武 (1613–82)
    • [RZL] Rizhi lu 日知錄, Shanghai: Shangwu yinshuguan, 1934.
    • [GTLSWJ] Gu Tinglin shiwenji 顾亭林詩文集, Beijing: Zhonghua shuju, 1959.
  • Huang Zongxi 黃宗羲 (1610–1695)
    • [MYDFL] Mingyi daigfanglu 明夷待访录, Taibei: Shijie shuju, 1959.
    • [NLWDHJ] Nanlei wending houji 南雷文定后集, in Shen Yunlong, ed. Ming Qing shiliao huibian. Taibei: Wenhai chubanshe, 1969.
    • [NLWDQJ] Nanlei wending qianji南雷文定前集, in Shen Yunlong, ed. Ming Qing shiliao huibian. Taibei: Wenhai chubanshe, 1969.
    • [NLWY] Nanlei wenyue南雷文约, in Shen Yunlong, ed. Ming Qing shiliao huibian. Taibei: Wenhai chubanshe, 1969.
    • [MRXA] Mingru xue’an 明儒學案, Beijing: Zhonghua shuju, 1985.
  • Qian Daxin 钱大盺 (1895–1990)
    • [QYTWJ] Qian Yantang wenji 潜研堂文集, Shanghai: Shangwu yinshuguan, 1935.
  • Wang Fuzhi 王夫之 (1619–92)
    • [QSYS] Quanshan yishu 船山遗书, Shanghai: Shangwu yinshuguan, 1935.
  • Zhang Xuecheng 章学诚 (1738–1801)
    • [WSTY] Wenshi tongyi 文史通义, Xianggang: Zhonghua shuju, 1973.

B. Overview: General Surveys and Studies

  • Chan, Wing-tsit (ed.), 1963, A Source Book in Chinese Philosophy, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Chen Lai 陈来, 2003, Zhongguo jinshi sixiangshi yanjiu 中国近世思想史研究, Beijing: Shangwuyin shuguan.
  • De Bary, Wm Theodore, 1989, The Message of the Mind in Neo-Confucianism, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • –––, 1991, Learning for One’s Self: Essays on the Individual in Neo-Confucian Thought, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Fung Yu-Lan [Feng Youlan], 1934 [1952–1953], History of Chinese Philosophy, two volumes, Derk Bodde (trans.), Princeton, NY: Princeton University Press.
  • Gong shuduo 龚书铎 et al., 2007, Qingdai lixueshi 清代理学史, 3 volumes, Guangzhou: Guangdong jiaoyu chubanshe.
  • Hou Wailu 侯外庐, 1980, Zhongguo sixiang tongshi 中国思想通史, Volume 5, Beijing: Renmin chubanshe.
  • Hu Chusheng 胡楚生, 1993, Qingdai xueshushi yanjiu 清代学术史研究, Taibei: Xuesheng shuju.
  • Lu Baoqian 陆宝千, 1978, Qingdai sixiangshi 清代思想史, Taibei: Guangwen shuju.
  • Smith, Richard J and D. W. Y Kwok, 1993, Cosmology, Ontology, and Human Efficacy: Essays in Chinese Thought, Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press.
  • Wang Junyi 王俊义, 2002, Qingdai xueshu tanyanlu 清代学术探研录, Beijing: Zhongguo shehuikexue chubanshe.
  • Wang Mou 王茂 et al., 1992, Qingdai zhexue 清代哲学, Anhui: Renmin chubanshe.
  • Wang Xuequn 汪学群, 2010, Zhongguo ruxueshi: Qingdai juan 中国儒學史: 清代卷, Beijing: Beijing dauxue chubanshe.
  • Wang Yu 王煜, 1981, Ming Qing sixiangjia lunji 明清思想家论集, Taibei: Lianjing chubanshe.
  • Yamanoi Yū 山井湧, 1980, Min Shin shishō shi kenkyū 明清思想史の研究, Tokyo: Tōkyō Daigaku Shuppankai.
  • Zhan Haiyun 詹海云, 1992, Qingchu xueshu lunwenji 清初学术论文集, Taibei: Wenjin chubanshe.
  • Zheng Jixiong 郑吉雄, 2001, Qingru ming zhu shuping 清儒名著述評, Taibei: Da’an chubanshe.

C. The Ming-Qing Intellectual Transition

  • De Bary, Wm. Theodore (ed.), 1975, Self and Society in Ming Thought, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • De Bary, Wm Theodore (ed.), 1975, The Unfolding of Neo-Confucianism (Studies in Oriental Culture 10), New York: Columbia University Press.
  • De Bary, Wm Theodore and Irene Bloom (eds.), 1979, Principle and Practicality: Essays in Neo-Confucianism and Practical Learning, (Neo-Confucian Studies), New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Elman, Benjamin A., 1979, “Japanese Scholarship and the Ming–Ch’ing Intellectual Transition”, Ch’ing-Shih Wen-t’i (Late Imperial China), 4(1): 1–22.
  • Hou Wailu 侯外庐, 1947, Jindai Zhongguo sixiang xueshuoshi 近代中国思想学说史, 2 volumes. Shanghai: Shenghuo shudian.
  • –––, 1958, Zhongguo zaoqi qimeng sixiang shi 中国早期启蒙思想史, Beijing: Renmin chubanshe.
  • Hu Shi, 1967, “The Scientific Spirit and Method in Chinese Philosophy”, in Charles A. Moore (ed.), The Chinese Mind: Essentials of the Chinese Philosophy and Culture, Honolulu: University of Hawaii Press, 104–131.
  • Levenson, Joseph Richmond, 1964, Confucian China and Its Modern Fate: Volume 2, The Problem of Monarchical Decay, Berkeley: University of California Press.
  • Liang Ch’i-ch’ao, 1921 [1959], Intellectual Trends in the Ch’ing Period (Ch’ing-tai hsüeh-shu kai-lun), Immanuel C. Y. Hsü (trans.), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1959. Original published in 1921, translation from the seventh edition, 1927. doi:10.4159/harvard.9780674184732
  • Metzger, Thomas A., 1976, Escape from Predicament: Neo-Confucianism and China’s Evolving Political Culture, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Mizoguchi Yūzō 溝口雄三, 1980, Chūgoku sen kindai shisō no kussetsu to tenkai 中国前近代思想の屈折と展開. Tokyo: Tokyo University Press.
  • Qian Mu 钱穆, 1937, Zhongguo jin sanbainian xueshushi 中国近三百年学术史, Taibei: Shangwu yinshuguan.
  • Shimada Kenji 岛田虔次, 1970, Chūgoku ni okeru kindai shii no zazetsu 中国における近代思想の挫折, Tokyo: Chikuma shobo.
  • Tao Qing 陶清, 1997, Ming yinmin jiu dajia zhexue 明遗民九大家, Taibei: Hongye chubanshe.
  • Wang Fansen 王汎森, 2004, WanMing Qingchu sixiang shilun 晚明清初思想十论, Shanghai: Fudan daxue shubanshe.
  • Yü Ying-shih 余英时, 1970, “Cong Song Ming ruxue de fanzhan lun Qingdai sixiangshi 从宋明儒学的发展论清代思想史”, Zhongguo xueren 中国学人, 2(September):19–41.
  • –––, 1975, “Some Preliminary Observations on the Rise of Ch’ing Confucian Intellectualism”, Tsing-hua Journal of Chinese Studies, 10(1-2): 105–136.
  • –––, 1976, “Qingdai sixiangshi de yige xinjieshi 清代思想史的一个新解释”, in Yü Ying-shih, Lishi yu sixiang 历史与思想, Taibei: Lianjing chubanshe, pp. 121–156.
  • –––, 1980, “Toward an Interpretation of the Intellectual Transition in Seventeenth-Century China”, Journal of the American Oriental Society, 100(2): 115–125. doi:10.2307/601037
  • –––, 1987, “Qingdai sixiangshi zhongyao guannian tongshi 清代思想史重要观念通释”, in Yü Ying-shih, Zhongguo sixiang chuantong de xiandai quanshi 中国思想传统的现代诠释, Taibei: Lianjing chubanshe, pp. 418–431.
  • Zhang Xun 张循, 2010, “Ming Qing zhi ji lianxuzhuode jichu gouzao 明清之际连续着的基础构造”, Ershiyi shiji, 117.
  • Zhao Yuan 赵园, 1999, Ming Qing zhi ji shidafu yanjiu (明清之际士大夫研究 A study of the literati during the Ming-Qing transition), Beijing: Beijing daxue chubanshe.

D. Intellectual Movements, Issues, and Traditions

D.1 Practical Learning (shixue/puxue/jingshi)

  • Chang Hao (Zhang, Hao) 张顥, 1974, “On the Ching-Shih Ideal in Neo-Confucianism”, Ch’ing-Shih Wen-t’i, 3(1): 36–61.
  • –––, 1984, “Song Ming yilai rujia jingshi sixiang shishi 宋明以来儒家思想试释”, in Zhongyang yanjiuyuan jindaishi yanjiusuo 中央研究院近代史研究所, (ed.) Jinshi Zhongguo jingshi sixiang yantaohui lunwenji 近世中国经世思想研讨会论文集, Taibei: Zhongyang yanjiuyuan.
  • Chow Kai-wing, 1994, The Rise of Confucian Ritualism in Late Imperial China: Ethics, Classics, and Lineage Discourse, Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.
  • Ge Rongjin 葛荣晋 (ed.), 1994, Zhongguo shi xue sixiangshi zhongjuan 中国实学思想史中卷, Beijing: Shoudu shifandaixue chubanshe.
  • Henderson, John B., 1984, The Development and Decline of Chinese Cosmology, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Zhang Shou’an 张寿安, 2001, Shiba shiji lixue kaozheng de sixiang huoli, 十八世纪礼学考证的思想活力, Taibei: Zhongyang yanjiuyuan jindaishi yanjiusuo.
  • Zhang Xun 张循, 2013, “’Junzi xingli buqiu biansu:’ Qingdai kaojuxue de shehui xingge ‘君子行礼,不求变俗:’ 清代考据学的社会性格”, Qingshi yanjiu 清史研究 1(February): 24–32.

D.2 Evidential Learning (kaozheng)

  • Elman, Benjamin A., 1984 [2001], From Philosophy to Philology: Intellectual and Social Aspects of Change in Late Imperial China. Cambridge, MA: Council on East Asian Studies, Harvard University. Second edition, Los Angeles: UCLA Asian Pacific Monograph series, 2001.
  • –––, 1979, “The Hsueh-hai T’ang and the Rise of New Text Scholarship in Canton”, Ch’ing-shih wen-t’i (Late imperial China), 4(2): 51–82.
  • He Yousen 何佑森, 2009, Qingdai xueshu sichao 清代学术思潮, Taibei: Taida chuban zhongxin.
  • Lin Qingzhang 林庆彰, 1983 [1986], Mingdai kaojuxue yanjiu 明代考据学研究, Taibei: Xuesheng shuju, 1983, second edition 1986.
  • –––, 2002, Qingdai jingxueyanjiu lunji 清代经学研究论集, Taibei: Zhongyangyanjiuyuan Zhongguowenzhesuo.
  • Lin Qingzhang 林庆彰 and Jiang Qiuhua 蒋秋华, 2000, Zhu Yizun Jingyikao yanjiu lunji 朱彝尊经义考研究论集, Taibei: Zhongyangyanjiuyuan Zhongguowenzhesuo choubeichu.
  • Lin Qingzhang 林庆彰 and Zhang Shou’an 张寿安 (eds), 2003, Qianjia xuezhe de yilixue 乾嘉学者的义理学, two volumes, Taibei: Zhongyangyanjiuyuan Zhongguowenzhesuo.
  • Liu Zhonghua 刘仲华, 2004, Qingdai zhuzixue yanjiu 清代諸子学研究, Beijing: Zhongguo Renmin daxue chubanshe.
  • Wang Xuequn 汪学群, 2004, Qingchu Yixue 清初易学, Beijing: Shangwu yinshuguan.
  • Zhang Xun 张循, 2007, “Qingdai Han Song xue guanxi yanjiu rogan wenti de fanxi 清代汉、宋学关系研究中若干问题的反思”, Sichuan daxue xuebao 四川大学学报, 4(July): 43–53.
  • –––, “Hanxue de neizai jinzhang: Qingdai sixiangshi shang ‘Han Song zhi zheng’ de yi ge jieshi 汉学的内在紧张:清代思想史上“汉宋之争”的一个新解释”, Zhongyang yanjiuyuan jindaishi yanjiusuo jikan中央研究院近代史研究所集刊63(March 2009):49–96.
  • –––, 2009, “Haxue neibude ‘Han Song zhi zheng:’ cong Chen Li de ‘Han Song tiaohe’ kan Qingdai sixiangshi shang de shencheng hanyi 汉学内部的’汉宋之争:’ 从陈澧的’汉宋调和’看清代思想史上’汉宋之争’的深层涵义”, Hanxue yanjiu 汉学研究 27(4): 295–328.
  • –––, 2010, “Budu Han Song shu ye zheng Han Song xue: Qingdai Han Song zhi zheng ‘fengqi’ de xingcheng 不读汉宋书,也争汉宋学:清代汉宋之争“风气”的形成”, Zhonghua wenshi luncong 中华文史论丛, 4(December): 275–314.
  • Zhang Lizhu 张丽珠, 1999, Qingdai yilixue xinmao 清代义理学新貌, Taibei: Liren shuju.
  • –––, 2003, Qingdai xin yilixue:Chuantong yu xiandai de jiaohui 清代新义理学: 传统与现代的交会, Taibei: Liren shuju.
  • Zhongyang yanjiuyuan Zhongguo wenzhesuo 中央研究院中国文哲研究所 (ed.), 1994, Qingdai jingxue guoji yantaohui lunwenji 清代经学国际研讨会论文集, Taibei: Zhongyang yanjiuyuan Zhongguo wenzhesuo.

D.3 Historical Scholarship

  • Du Weiyun 杜维运, 1988, Qingdai shixue yu shixia 清代史学与史家, Beijing: Zhonghua shuju.
  • Elman, Benjamin A., 2002, “The Historicization of Classical Learning in Ming-Ch’ing China”, In Q. Edward Wang and George Iggers (eds), Turning Points in Historiography: A Cross-Cultural Perspective, Rochester, NY: The University of Rochester Press, 101–144.
  • Ivanhoe, Philip. J., 2009, On Ethics and History: Essays and Letters of Zhang Xuecheng, Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.
  • –––, 2014, “Historical Understanding in China and the West: Zhang, Collingwood and Mink”, Journal of the Philosophy of History, 8(1): 78–95. doi:10.1163/18722636-12341266
  • Kan Hongliu 阚红柳, 2008, Qingchu sijia xiushi yanjiu: yi shijia qunti wei yanjiu duixiang 清初私家修史研究:以史家群体为研究对象, Beijing: Renmin chubanshe.
  • Nivison, David S., 1966 The Life and Thought of Chang Hsueh-ch’eng (1738–1801), Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.

D.4 Intellectual Sects and Lineages

  • Elman, Benjamin A., 1981, “Ch’ing Dynasty ‘Schools’ of Scholarship”, Ch’ing-shih wen-t’i (Late imperial China), 4(6): 1–45.
  • –––, 1990, Classicism, Politics and Kinship: the Chang-chou School of New Text Confucianism in Late Imperial China, Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press.
  • Ong, Chang Woei, 2008, Men of Letters Within the Passes: Guanzhong Literati in Chinese History, 907–1911, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Asia Center.
  • Tan, Tian Yuan, 2010, Songs of Contentment and Transgression: Discharged Officials and Literati Communities in Sixteenth-Century North China, (Harvard-Yenching Institute Monograph Series, 75), Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Asia Center.
  • Wilson, Thomas A., 1995, The Genealogy of the Way: The Construction and Uses of the Confucian Tradition in Late Imperial China, Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.
  • Wu, Jiang, 2011, Enlightenment in Dispute: The Reinvention of Chan Buddhism in Seventeenth-Century China, New York: Oxford University Press. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780195333572.001.0001

D.5 Individual Intellectual Personage

  • Berling, Judith A., 1980, The Syncretic Religion of Lin Chao-en, New York: Columiba University Press.
  • Birdwhistell, Anne, 1996, Li Yong (1627–1705) and Epistemological Dimensions of Confucian Philosophy, Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.
  • Black, Allison Harley, 1989, Man and Nature in the Philosophical Thought of Wang Fu-chih, Seattle, WA: University of Washington Press.
  • Chang, Chun-shu and Shelly Hsueh-lun Chang, 1998, Crisis and Transformation in Seventeenth-Century China, Ann Arbor, MI: University of Michigan Press.
  • Cheng, Chung-ying, 1971, Tai Chen’s Inquiry into Goodness: A translation of the Yuan Shan with an Introductory Essay, Honolulu: East-West Center Press.
  • Ch’ien, Edward T., 1986, Chiao Hung and the Restructuring of Neo-Confucianism in the Late Ming, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Chin, Ann-ping and Mansfield Freeman, 1990, Tai Chen on Mencius: Explorations in words and Meanings: A translation of the Meng-tzu tzu-I shu-cheng, New Haven and London: Yale University Press.
  • De Bary, Wm. Theodore, 1993, Waiting for the Dawn: A Plan for the Prince, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Ge Rongjin 葛荣晋 and Wang Juncai 王俊才, 1996, Lu Shiyi pingzhuan 陆世仪评传, Nanjing: Nanjingdaxue chubanshe.
  • Gu Qingmei 古清美, 1978, Huang Lizhou zhi shengping ji qi xueshu sixiang 黄梨洲之生平及其学术思想, Taibei: Guoli Taiwan daxie chubanshe.
  • Handler-Spitz, Rivi, 2017, Symptoms of an Unruly Age: Li Zhi and Cultures of Early Modernity, Seattle and London: University of Washington Press.
  • Handlin, Joanna F., 1983, Action in Late Ming Thought: The Reorientation of Lü K'un and Other Scholar-Officials, Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press.
  • He Guangru 贺广如, 1999, Wei Moshen sixiang tanjiu: yi chuantong jingdian wei taolun zhongxin 魏默深思想探究: 以传统经典的诠说为讨论中心, Taibei: Taida chuban weiyuanhui.
  • Huang, Chin-Shing, 1995, Philosophy, Philology, and Politics in Eighteenth-Century China: Li Fu and the Lu-Wang School under the Ch’ing, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. doi:10.1017/CBO9780511529115
  • Jami, Catherine, Peter M. Engelfriet, and Gregory Blue (eds), 2001, Statecraft and Intellectual Renewal in Late Ming China: The Cross-Cultural Synthesis of Xu Guangqi (1562–1633), Leiden: Brill.
  • Ji Wenfu 稽文甫, 1978, Wang Quanshan xueshu luncong 王船山学术论丛, Beijing: Sanlian shuju.
  • Lee, Pauline C., 2014, Li Zhi, Confucianism, and the Virtue of Desire, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • McMorran, Ian, 1975, “Wang Fu-chih and the Neo-Confucian Tradition”, in Wm. Theodore de Bary, ed. The Unfolding of Neo-Confucianism, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Ng, On-cho, 2001, Cheng-Zhu Confucianism in the Early Qing: Li Guangdi (1642–1718) and Qing thought, Albany, NY: State University of New York Press.
  • Peterson, Willard J., 1969, “The Life of Ku Yen-Wu (1613–1682)”, Harvard Journal of Asiatic Studies, 29: 201–247. doi:10.2307/2718835
  • –––, 1979, Bitter Gourd: Fang I-chih and the Impetus for Intellectual Change, New Haven and London: Yale University Press
  • Rowe, William T., 2002, Saving the World: Chen Hongmou and Elite Consciousness in Eighteenth-Century China, Stanford, CA: Stanford University Press.
  • Sela, Ori, 2018, China’s Philological Turn: Scholars, Textualism, and the Dao in the Eighteenth Century, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Struve, Lynn A., 1988a, “Huang Zongxi in Context: A Reappraisal of His Major Writings”, The Journal of Asian Studies, 47(3): 474–502. doi:10.2307/2056971
  • Struve, Lynn A., 1988b, “The Early Ch’ing Legacy of Huang Tsung-hsi: A Reexamination”, Asia Major, new series, 1: 83–122.
  • Yü, Chün-Fang, 1981, The Renewal of Buddhism in China: Chu-hung and the late Ming Synthesis, New York: Columbia University Press.
  • Yü Ying-shi 余英时, 1976, Lun Dai Zhen yu Zhang Xuecheng 论戴震与章学诚, Xianggang: Longmen shudian.
  • Yü, Ying-Shih, 1982, “Tai Chen and the Chu Hsi Tradition”, in Chan Ping-leung et al. (eds) Essays in Commemoration of the Golden Jubilee of the Fung Ping Shan Library, Hong Kong: University of Hong Kong Press.
  • Zhang, Ying, 2017, Confucian Image Politics: Masculine Morality in Seventeenth-Century China, Seattle and London: University of Washington Press.
  • Zheng Jixiong 郑吉雄, 2008, Dai Dongyuan jingdian quanshi de sixiashi tansuo 戴东原经典诠释的思想史探索, Taibei: Guoli Taiwan daxue chubanshe.

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On-cho Ng <oxn1@psu.edu>

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