Notes to Inverted Qualia

1. For example, in Purple Haze (2001) Levine clearly assumes that experiences can have both \(Q_{R}\) and \(Q_{G}\)—can be both “reddish” and “greenish”, in his terminology (see, e.g., 102, 111).

2. For the view that an extensive range of states/events have qualia, see Horgan and Tienson 2002; for the view that episodes of conscious thought have qualia, see Strawson 1994, Ch. 1.

3. Notice that a subject \(S\) may undergo an experience with \(Q_{R}\) even if there is no object that looks red to \(S\). For example, a visual hallucination of a ripe tomato has \(Q_{R}\), as does the having of a red afterimage. (At least, this is the usual way qualia terminology like ‘\(Q_{R}\)’ is understood.) So, if the identification of \(Q_{R}\) with the property of being an experience of something’s looking red is to be sustained, it must be possible for \(S\) to undergo “an experience of something’s looking red” even though there is no object that looks red to \(S\). This might be thought unproblematic, but “disjunctivism” about perception raises some complications. According to disjunctivists, a hallucination of a ripe tomato and a phenomenologically matching veridical experience of a ripe tomato are not events of a common mental kind. Hence, if “an experience of something’s looking red” is supposed to be a distinctive kind of mental event, then disjunctivists will deny that one can undergo an experience of something’s looking red when there is no object that looks red. Relatedly, disjunctivists will deny that events/states with \(Q_{R}\) thereby have something mental in common, which is tantamount to saying that \(Q_{R}\) is not a “natural” mental property (in the sense of Lewis 1986, 60–1). See the entry on the disjunctive theory of perception.

4. Of course, it might be objected that the explanation of qualia terminology just given is too vague, and so fails to convey a unique meaning. For the expository purposes of this article it will be assumed (not uncontroversially) that this objection is mistaken. The explanation will be disputed on other grounds by a proponent of the “Frege-Schlick” view (see subsection 2.3.2); another complaint against the explanation is discussed in subsection 3.8.

5. In fact, this is also the opening characterization of qualia in Dennett 1988 (“‘Qualia’ is an unfamiliar term for something that could not be more familiar to each of us: the ways things seem to us” (1988, 226)).

6. Crane 2000, 177–8, points out that C. S. Pierce used qualia “in something like its modern sense” in 1866.

7. For other uses of ‘qualia’, see Lycan 1996, 176–7, and Crane 2000.

8. There are other color spaces besides the NCS, one of which (the Munsell space) is mentioned below; different spaces have different advantages and limitations. Some spaces that are sometimes called ‘color spaces’ are in fact spaces of a narrow range of physically characterized stimuli (e.g., lights), rather than a space of colors. It should not be assumed without argument that exactly one of the many genuine color spaces is the “real” color space; Westphal 1991, 118–22, and Hardin 1999b have some some relevant cautionary remarks. For a brief introduction to color spaces, see Hardin 1993, 113–20, and Kaiser and Boynton 1996, 492–8; Kuehni 2003 is a comprehensive survey.

10. An early appearance of the phrase ‘inverted spectrum’ is in Block and Fodor 1972. For ‘spectrum inversion’, see Shoemaker 1975a, b. Lewis 1929 invites us to “[s]uppose that in the matter of immediate sense qualities my whole spectrum should be exactly the reverse of yours” (75).

11. On typical versions of the relativist view discussed in subsection 3.5, if overnight we all underwent the simple sort of spectrum inversion just described, then this would “invert the colors” in the following metalinguistic sense: after the change, the word ‘red’ would correctly apply to emeralds (etc.), and the word ‘green’ would correctly apply to rubies (etc.).

12. In The Search After Truth, Malebranche writes:

There are some people who see certain objects yellow with one eye and as green or blue with the other. Yet if these people be supposed born one-eyed, or with two eyes disposed to see as blue what we call green, they would think they saw objects as having the same color that we see them as having because they would always have heard called green what they would see as blue. (1674–5/1997, I, 13, VI)

This does not correspond to a rotation of the hue circle, though. See also Allen 2010, 246 and fn. 26.

13. See Robinson 1994, Ch. 1; Jacovides 1999. For the view that Locke was not so committal, see Allen 2010.

14. This choice and number of dimensions is not unproblematic. For discussion and references, see Mausfeld 2003.

15. Munsell image adapted from

16. Note that a “behaviorally detectable” inversion scenario is merely one in which the inversion is “in principle” detectable. In such a scenario, subjects who are inverted with respect to each other differ in relevant behavioral dispositions (e.g., dispositions to apply color terms, dispositions to sort colored chips, etc.). But these differences might be extremely subtle. If red-green inversion is behaviorally detectable in the sense used in this article, it does not follow that we can know whether or not it occurs.

17. Harrison (1967, 1973) first raised this sort of problem for behaviorally undetectable spectrum inversion. See also Clark 1985; 1993, 199–205; Casati 1990; Hardin 1993, 139–42; 1997; 1999a; Kay 1999; MacLaury 1999; Palmer 1999b, 984; Campbell 2000; and Broackes 2007.

18. See also Kirk 1994, 188.

19. See also Sacks 1997.

20. See also Putnam 1981, 80.

21. Shoemaker credits the point to Taylor 1966. For other attempts to argue that a behaviorally undetectable interpersonal inversion scenario is coherent, see Gert 1965, Lycan 1973, and Harvey 1979. For Wittgensteinian responses see Canfield 2009 (a reply to Block 2007), and Brenner 2015.

22. Block credits the example to Harman 1982.

23. Suppose, in addition to a chromatic inversion, that black objects on Earth are white on Inverted Earth and vice versa—so the (blackish) blueberries in the center of the melon (figure 6, top left) are white on Inverted Earth. A photograph of the inverted scene of fruits would not look like either the bottom left or right parts of figure 6, which is why Block specifies only a chromatic inversion. Setting aside the fact that the white blueberries would look more distinct (and not luminous), the space in shadow between the pepper, the banana, and the lime would look black, and the specular (“mirror-like”) highlights (see, for instance, the red pepper on the left) would look white. For discussion of other problems with a black-white inversion on Inverted Earth, see Broackes 2007.

24. Block’s official description of Inverted Earth (“fire hydrants are green”, etc.) raises complications. Return to the description of the inverted qualia scenario in subsection 2.1, and in particular to scene \(S\) as depicted in the left-hand part of figure 4. Suppose an “inverted scene” \(S_{I}^*\) is created as follows: if an object in the old scene has hue \(h\), in \(S_{I}^*\) the object has \(I (h)\) (compare the recipe given in subsection 2.1, in terms of apparent hues). Take Invert as described in subsection 2.1: is her experience when she looks at \(S\) phenomenologically the same as yours when you look at \(S_{I}^*\)? Not necessarily. Even with the stipulation that the illumination and viewing position are exactly the same in \(S\) and \(S_{I}^*\), the situation is underdescribed. Suppose that: (i) \(y\) and \(b\) are, respectively, determinate shades of yellow and blue; (ii) a banana in the original scene \(S\) looks to you to have \(y\); and (iii) \(I(y) = b\). So the banana in \(S_{I}^*\) will have hue \(b\). If your experience when looking at \(S_{I}^*\) is phenomenologically the same as Invert’s when she looks at \(S\), the banana in the new scene must look to you to have hue \(b\). But for a variety of reasons this is not guaranteed by the fact that the banana has hue \(b\), that you have “normal” color vision, and that the lighting is (as we may assume) “standard”. For example, variation within the class of those with normal color vision (see subsection 2.4 below), or variation within the class of standard illuminants (different kinds of daylight, say), can by themselves account for a difference in color appearance.

Further problems are posed by contrast effects (Hardin 1993, Ch. 1), and “interreflections”—illumination reflected from one colored object that is incident on another and then reflected into the eye. In addition, if on Inverted Earth you see an Earth-style variety of scenes in an Earth-style variety of illuminants, then you would soon notice a difference. For example, green objects in reddish light tend to look darker, so in reddish light green peppers (say) would look darker on Inverted Earth than their red counterparts would look in similar conditions on Earth (see Myin 2001, 69–70). This is relevant to Block’s argument against functionalism, but it might not matter much for his argument against representationalism.

25. It has been suggested that, due to the genetic basis of certain color vision deficiencies, there will be (rare) actual cases of red-green inversion (Piantanida 1974); that now seems unlikely (for references and discussion, see Byrne and Hilbert 2003a, 19). Still, the mere fact that this possibility was taken seriously by vision scientists should give some philosophers pause for thought (see Nida-Rümelin 1996; for further discussion see Ross 1999a, Nida-Rümelin 1999, Ross 1999b, Meyer 2000).

26. A spectral light is one composed of a very narrow band of wavelengths from the visible spectrum, which runs from approximately 400nm to 700nm.

27. For the complicated disputes over the best way to understand the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction, see the entry on intrinsic vs. extrinsic properties.

28. A qualification: these implications are supposed to hold if we restrict attention to creatures found in worlds with the same basic laws as ours.

29. ‘Absent qualia’ was coined by Shoemaker (1975a).

30. Invert and Nonvert do not need to be behavioral duplicates simpliciter — just duplicates with respect to the behavioral dispositions that are supposed to determine that one has an experience with \(Q_{R}\). Similar remarks go for Arguments Ab and Ac below.

31. (a) and (b) hold just as much for “conceptual” (or “analytic”) functionalists as for “psychofunctionalists” (for the distinction, see Block 1980, 1996b).

32. For attempts to remove the separation between conceptual coherence and possibility, see Chalmers 1996, 131–4, and Jackson 1998; see also Section 5 of the entry on zombies (“Does conceivability entail possibility?”).

33. The actual quotation has ‘the intentional content of looking red’ in place of ‘\(Q_{R}\)’, and expresses a thesis that Block accepts: “my brand of qualia-realism is quasi-functional; here is why it is quasi-functional: the qualitative content of experience [i.e., qualia like \(Q_{R}\)] is not functionally characterizable” (1990, 58). See the following subsection.

34. Discussions of inverted spectrum arguments against functionalism include: Shoemaker 1975a, 1984; Block 1980, 1990; Lewis 1980; Putnam 1981, 79–82; Horgan 1984; Johnsen 1986; Levine 1988; Cole 1990; Harman 1990; Lycan 1987, 59–61, 1996, 118–121; Rey 1992; Chalmers 1996, 263–6; Carruthers 2000, 76–87; and Thau 2002, 17–21.

35. P1c is an instance of Peacocke’s “most extreme form of the inverted spectrum hypothesis…[that] asserts that another subject’s visual experience can be qualitatively different from your own when you are both seeing the same object, even though your relevant brain states are physically identical and so are your environmental conditions” (1988, 464). Peacocke argues, on grounds connected with the individuation of thoughts, that “the hypothesis of extreme inversion is spurious”(464). For a reply, see Johnsen 1993. Schoettle argues that “a person can be physically identical on two occasions (and in a physically identical environment) and yet the representational content of the person’s perceptions of color can be different on the two occasions” (2009, 111–2), which he takes to support the positivist view that “philosophical questions about what constitutes the identity of our experience of color are cognitively meaningless” (113).

36. The exposition of representationalism here is greatly simplified. For further discussion of the varieties of representationalism see the entry on representational theories of consciousness, Byrne 2001, and Chalmers 2004.

37. Cf. Chalmers 1995; 1996, 256–7.

38. Other discussions of the inverted spectrum argument against representationalism include White 1994; Tye 1995, 201–7, 2000, 104–113, 2002, 450–2; Lycan 1996, 77–82; Byrne and Hilbert 1997b, 267–72; Rey 1998; Carruthers 2000, 109–112; Cohen 2001; Thau 2002, 21–35; Chalmers 2004; Macpherson 2005; Marcus 2006; Thompson 2008; Speaks 2011; Ford 2011; Speaks 2015, ch. 35; Ren 2016; Gert 2017, ch. 8.

39. For an argument that it should be classified as a form of representationalism, see Byrne 2001, 224–7. Nothing will turn on this here.

40. This difficulty for the orthodox phenomenist is related to the “many property objection” to adverbialism (Jackson 1977, Ch. 3). See also Clark 2000, Ch. 2.

41. This terminology is from Shoemaker 2002; in Shoemaker 1994a, b, these are called phenomenal properties.

42. On another view, the propositional content of belief is a set of possible worlds (see Lewis 1986 and Stalnaker 1987).

43. For criticisms of relativism, see Byrne and Hilbert 2003b, 57–8, and Hardin 2003.

44. A related issue concerns the experiences of people with various defects of color vision (see, e.g., Mollon et al. 2003), which unfortunately is a topic largely unexamined by philosophers.

45. Compare Palmer’s thesis that “Objective behavioral methods can determine the nature of experiences up to, but not beyond, the criterion of isomorphism”(1999a, 934), by which he means (roughly) that science can discover the relations between qualia but not their intrinsic nature. (A related view is the “structural realism” of Russell 1927.)

46. Tye (1994, 177–8) denies P1.

47. One reply to this objection links understanding ‘Q\(_{R}\)’ with knowing that ‘Q\(_{R}\)’ refers to \(Q_{R}\), and then appeals to the skeptical argument of subsection 3.6 to argue that we have no such knowledge, and so no such understanding. For more on ineffability and the inverted spectrum, see Lewis 1929, 74–6; Gert 1965; Taylor 1966; Strawson 1989; and Block 2007. Related discussions of ineffability are in Lycan 1996, 9, 11, 101–8; Byrne 2002; Thau 2002, Ch. 5; and Hellie 2004. See also the entry on private language.

48. This conforms to the official account of “representational properties” in Chalmers 2004; for convenience in subsection 3.2 representational properties were taken to be properties of mental events/states, not subjects.

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