Notes to Qualia: The Knowledge Argument

1. Thought experiments such as Broad’s and indeed Jackson’s are descendants of Leibniz’s famous mill argument against materialism in his Monadology (1998, 270; originally published 1714).

2. Some writers who defend the knowledge intuition (e.g., Russell and Dunne) do not use it to argue against physicalism. Therefore, their discussions are best thought of as precursors to the Knowledge Argument rather than early versions of it. Stoljar & Nagasawa suggest that it is not clear that Maxwell offers a version of the Knowledge Argument, since he does not use the knowledge intuition to argue that physicalism is false (2004, 25–26 n13). However, Maxwell certainly comes very close to claiming just this, e.g., when he concludes “‘X is experiencing the visual sensation of P’ is a fact about what is happening to X which cannot be described or understood in terms of any physical theory” (1968, 135; compare with the conclusions of the different versions of the Knowledge Argument outlined below in Section 3.1).

3. The example involving Marianna (see Section 3.3) arguably undermines the ability account as well. Unlike Mary, Marianna is acquainted with color by visual contact with arbitrarily colored objects before she is freed. At this stage, she has those abilities that have been proposed in order to account for Mary’s epistemic progress after her release (for instance, she can imagine and remember colors and she can sort objects according to color just by looking). But Marianna still lacks the relevant phenomenal knowledge.

4. Because this version of the Ability Hypothesis appeals to different modes of presentation under which Mary can know the same proposition, it is also a version of the New Knowledge / Old Facts View (see 4.6 below). This point is acknowledge by Cath (2009, 148; see also Howell 2007, 157).

5. The crucial role of phenomenal concepts means that the New Knowledge/Old Fact View can be seen as a specific version of a more general physicalist strategy for dealing with a number of different challenges, the Phenomenal Concept Strategy. For discussion of how this strategy applies to different anti-physicalist arguments, see, e.g., Sundström 2011; Balog 2012b.

6. Ball also argues that Mary can possess such concepts even if she lacks a linguistic community (2009, 954–957).

7. This line of thought fits with the suggestion that the Knowledge Argument works against certain forms of dualism as well as certain forms of physicalism – see Section 5. This point is acknowledged by Howell (2007, 148–149).

Copyright © 2019 by
Martine Nida-Rümelin <>
Donnchadh O Conaill <>

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