## Notes to Frank Ramsey

1. Wittgenstein’s recollection is apparently mistaken, since he went back to Cambridge in January 1929 and could only have met Ramsey during the last year of his life.

2. The derivation of the ‘equal difference in utility’ definition proceeds as follows. Where \(p\) is ethically neutral and the subject not indifferent between \(\omega_1\) and \(\omega_2\), \(bel(p) = 0.5\) whenever the subject is indifferent between ‘\(\omega_1\) if \(p\), \(\omega_2\) otherwise’ and ‘\(\omega_2\) if \(p\), \(\omega_1\) otherwise’. To see this, note that under Ramsey's assumed 'general psychological theory', the indifference holds iff

\(bel(p)des(\omega_1 \,\&\, p) + (1 - bel(p))des(\omega_2 \,\&\, \neg{}p) =\)

\( bel(p)des(\omega_2 \,\&\, p) + (1 - bel(p))des(\omega_1 \,\&\, \neg{}p)\)

Assuming that \(p\) is ethically neutral, this can be re-written:

\(bel(p)des(\omega_1) + (1 - bel(p))des(\omega_2) =\)

\(bel(p)des(\omega_2) + (1 - bel(p))des(\omega_1)\)

where \(des(\omega_1) \neq des(\omega_2)\). From there we can derive by that \(bel(p) = 0.5\). Now suppose that \(p\) is an ethically neutral proposition of probability 0.5, and that the subject is indifferent between ‘\(\omega_1\) if \(p\), \(\omega_4\) if \(\neg{p}\)’ and ‘\(\omega_2\) if \(p\), \(\omega_3\) if \(\neg{p}\)’. This holds iff

\(bel(p)des(\omega_1 \,\&\, p) + (1 - bel(p))des(\omega_4 \,\&\, \neg{}p) =\)

\(bel(p)des(\omega_2 \,\&\, p) + (1 - bel(p))des(\omega_3 \,\&\, \neg{}p)\)

which we can now reduce to

\(bel(p)des(\omega_1) + (1 - bel(p))des(\omega_4) =\)

\(bel(p)des(\omega_2) + (1 - bel(p))des(\omega_3)\)

Since \(bel(p) = 1 - bel(p)\), we can drop out the constant factor, leaving us with

\(des(\omega_1) + des(\omega_4) = des(\omega_2) + des(\omega_3)\)

which holds just in case

\(des(\omega_1) - des(\omega_2) = des(\omega_3) - des(\omega_4)\)

Since it is assumed that \(des\) represents the subject’s utilities, it follows that the difference in utility between \(\omega_1\) and \(\omega_2\) is equal to that between \(\omega_3\) and \(\omega_4\) when the subject is indifferent between the gambles ‘\(\omega_1\) if \(p\), \(\omega_4\) otherwise’ and ‘\(\omega_2\) if \(p\), \(\omega_3\) otherwise’, for some ethically neutral proposition \(p\) of probability half.