Notes to Frank Ramsey

1. Wittgenstein’s recollection is apparently mistaken, since he went back to Cambridge in January 1929 and could only have met Ramsey during the last year of his life.

2. An interval scale is a numerical scale in which intervals of differences are meaningful. For instance, if \(\mathcal{U}(p) - \mathcal{U}(q) = \mathcal{U}(r) - \mathcal{U}(s)\), then the difference in utility between \(p\) and \(q\) is equal to the difference between \(r\) and \(s\). It doesn’t follow, on the other hand, that if \(\mathcal{U}(p) = 2\cdot\mathcal{U}(q)\), then \(p\) has twice as much utility as \(q\); this is because the ‘zero’ point in an interval scale is arbitrary. Examples of interval scales include temperatures as measured in degrees Celsius or Fahrenheit, and yearly dates as measured in the A.D. and Buddhist or Hindu systems.

3. Specifically, Ramsey’s definition of unconditional probabilities presupposes that \(\mathcal{P}\) satisfies \(\mathcal{P}(p) = 1 - \mathcal{P}(\neg{p})\). (See note 4 for more details.) Furthermore, his definition of conditional probabilities presupposes that

\[ \mathcal{P}(p \text{ given } q) = \frac{\mathcal{P}(p \amp q)}{\mathcal{P}(q)} \]

whenever \(\mathcal{P}(p) \gt 0\), and \(\mathcal{P}(p \text{ given } q) = 1 - \mathcal{P}(\neg{p} \text{ given } q\)).

4. The derivation of the definition proceeds as follows. Where \(p\) is ethically neutral and the subject not indifferent between \(\omega_1\) and \(\omega_2\), \(\mathcal{P}(p) = 0.5\) whenever the subject is indifferent between ‘\(\omega_1\) if \(p\), \(\omega_2\) otherwise’ and ‘\(\omega_2\) if \(p\), \(\omega_1\) otherwise’. To see this, note that under (6.1)–(6.3), the indifference holds iff

\[\begin{align} \mathcal{U}(\omega_1 \amp p){\cdot}\mathcal{P}(p) &+ \mathcal{U}(\omega_2 \amp \neg{p}){\cdot}\mathcal{P}(\neg{p}) = \\ &\mathcal{U}(\omega_2 \amp p){\cdot}\mathcal{P}(p) + \mathcal{U}(\omega_1 \amp \neg{p}){\cdot}\mathcal{P}(\neg{p}). \end{align}\]

Assuming that \(p\) is ethically neutral, this can be re-written:

\[\begin{align} \mathcal{U}(\omega_1){\cdot}\mathcal{P}(p) &+ \mathcal{U}(\omega_2){\cdot}\mathcal{P}(\neg{p}) = \\ &\mathcal{U}(\omega_2){\cdot}\mathcal{P}(p) + \mathcal{U}(\omega_1){\cdot}\mathcal{P}(\neg{p}), \end{align}\]

where \(\mathcal{U}(\omega_1) \neq \mathcal{U}(\omega_2)\). Given (6.2), we can then further reduce the equality:

\[\begin{align} \mathcal{U}(\omega_1){\cdot}\mathcal{P}(p) &+ \mathcal{U}(\omega_2){\cdot}(1 - \mathcal{P}(p)) = \\ &\mathcal{U}(\omega_2){\cdot}\mathcal{P}(p) + \mathcal{U}(\omega_1){\cdot}(1 - \mathcal{P}(p)). \end{align}\]

From there we can derive by that \(\mathcal{P}(p) = 0.5\).

Now suppose \(p\) is an ethically neutral proposition of probability \(0.5\), and that the subject is indifferent between ‘\(\omega_1\) if \(p\), \(\omega_4\) if \(\neg{p}\)’ and ‘\(\omega_2\) if \(p\), \(\omega_3\) if \(\neg{p}\)’. This holds iff

\[\begin{align} \mathcal{U}(\omega_1 \amp p){\cdot}\mathcal{P}(p) &+ \mathcal{U}(\omega_4 \amp \neg{p}){\cdot}\mathcal{P}(\neg{p}) = \\ &\mathcal{U}(\omega_2 \amp p){\cdot}\mathcal{P}(p) + \mathcal{U}(\omega_3 \amp \neg{p}){\cdot}\mathcal{P}(\neg{p}), \end{align}\]

which we can now quickly reduce to

\[\begin{align} \mathcal{U}(\omega_1){\cdot}\mathcal{P}(p) &+ \mathcal{U}(\omega_4){\cdot}(1 - \mathcal{P}(p)) = \\ &\mathcal{U}(\omega_2){\cdot}\mathcal{P}(p) + \mathcal{U}(\omega_3){\cdot}(1 - \mathcal{P}(p)). \end{align}\]

Since \(\mathcal{P}(p) = 1 - \mathcal{P}(p) = 0.5\), we can drop out the constant factor, leaving us with

\[ \mathcal{U}(\omega_1) + \mathcal{U}(\omega_4) = \mathcal{U}(\omega_2) + \mathcal{U}(\omega_3), \]

which holds just in case

\[\mathcal{U}(\omega_1) - \mathcal{U}(\omega_2) = \mathcal{U}(\omega_3) - \mathcal{U}(\omega_4). \]

Since we’ve assumed that \(\mathcal{U}\) represents the subject’s utilities on an interval scale, it follows that the difference in utility between \(\omega_1\) and \(\omega_2\) is equal to that between \(\omega_3\) and \(\omega_4\) whenever (i) assumptions (6.1)–(6.3) hold, and (ii) the subject is indifferent between the gambles ‘\(\omega_1\) if \(p\), \(\omega_4\) otherwise’ and ‘\(\omega_2\) if \(p\), \(\omega_3\) otherwise’, for some ethically neutral proposition \(p\) of probability \(0.5\).

Copyright © 2019 by
Fraser MacBride <fraser.macbride@manchester.ac.uk>
Mathieu Marion <marion.mathieu@uqam.ca>
María José Frápolli <frapolli@ugr.es>
Dorothy Edgington <dorothy.edgington@philosophy.ox.ac.uk>
Edward Elliott <e.j.r.elliott@leeds.ac.uk>
Sebastian Lutz <sebastian.lutz@gmx.net>
Jeffrey Paris

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