Notes to Defeasible Reasoning

1. Gärdernfors proved that no non-trivial belief revision system satisfies the following five conditions:

  1. The set of belief states is closed under expansions.
  2. Success: \(A\) belongs to \(K*A\).
  3. Consistency: if \(K\) and \(A\) are both consistent, then so is \(K*A\).
  4. Ramsey test: \((A \Rightarrow B) \in K\) iff \(B \in K*A\).
  5. Preservation: if \(\neg A \not\in K\), then \(K \subseteq K*A\).

2. There is another desirable property that is independent of the ones discussed here: infinite conditionalization: \(C(\Gamma \cup \Delta) \subseteq Cn(\Gamma \cup C(\Delta))\). The study of nonmonotonic Tarski relations (in which the set of premises can be infinite) is still relatively undeveloped (although see Makinson 1994 and Freund, Lehmann, and Makinson 1990).

3. Karl Schlechta (Schlechta 1997) has proved that the restriction of these theorem to finite models is a necessary one. In order to cover the case of infinite theories, it is necessary to add yet another condition to the preferential models: a condition Schlechta calls “definability preservation” (Schlechta 1997, 76).

4. Adams’s logic of high conditional probability also corresponds closely to the logic of subjunctive or counterfactual conditionals developed by Robert Stalnaker and David K. Lewis (Lewis 1973). By deleting both weak centering and the CV axiom (which corresponds to Rational Montonoty) from Lewis’s favored logic, VC, Adams’s logic results. Adding axiom CV produces a logic corresponding to the Lehmann-Magidor-Pearl 1-entailment (see below). The correspondence between counterfactual logics and preferential logics was first noted by Adam Grove (Grove 1988).

5. Admissibility has also known as “\(p\)-consistency” (Adams 1975) and “\(\varepsilon\)-consistency” (Pearl 1988). A preferential consequence relation is admissible if and only if, for every \(\varepsilon \gt 0\), there exists a probability function \(P\) such that, for all propositions \(p\) and \(q, p \dproves q\) iff \(P(q \mid p) \ge 1 - \varepsilon\).

6. The entropy of a probability function is a measure of the expectation of information. To simplify, suppose that there are finitely many models. The entropy of a function \(P\) is the sum, over all the models \(\mathcal{M}\) of the product of the probability of \(\mathcal{M}\) and the negative logarithm (base 2) of that probability.

7. Wayne Wobcke’s (Wobcke 1995) system is an alternative to Commonsense Entailment that allows a limited amount of nesting. Both Delgrande and Asher use conditional logics that are significantly weaker than either Ernest Adam’s or David Lewis’s \(VC\) (minus Centering).

8. Under an extension of 1-entailment or the maximum entropy approach, we could defeasibly infer that \(\neg q\) is not exceptional, that is, that \(\neg(\top \Rightarrow q)\), unless the exceptional character of \(\neg q\) follows monotonically from our theory. (The symbol \(\top\) represents any logical tautology.) From \((p \Rightarrow q)\) and \(\neg(\top \Rightarrow q)\), the contraposed conditional \((\neg q \Rightarrow \neg p)\) follows monotonically (in \(VC\) minus centering), as the following derivation shows:

\((p \Rightarrow q)\) [Assumption]
\(\neg(\top \Rightarrow q)\) [Assumption]
\((p \Rightarrow(\neg p \vee q))\) [1, right weakening]
\((\neg p \Rightarrow \neg p)\) [Reflexivity]
\((\neg p \Rightarrow(\neg p \vee q))\) [4, right weakening]
\(((p \vee \neg p) \Rightarrow(\neg p \vee q))\) [3, 5, Or]
\((\top \Rightarrow (\neg p \vee q))\) [6, Left equivalence]
\(((\top \amp \neg q) \Rightarrow(\neg p \vee q))\) [2, 7, CV]
\((\neg q \Rightarrow(\neg p \vee q))\) [8, Left equivalence]
\((\neg q \Rightarrow \neg q)\) [Reflexivity]
\((\neg q \Rightarrow \neg p)\) [9, 10, right conjunction, right weakening]

9. Morgan also gives us good reason to reject the principle of absorption for conditionals:

\((p \Rightarrow(q \Rightarrow r)) \leftrightarrow((p \amp q) \Rightarrow r)\)

This principle of absorption holds in the logic of extreme higher-order probabilities only in the special case where \(p\) consists entirely of Boolean combinations of \(\Rightarrow\)-conditionals.

10. Andrew Baker (Baker 1988) offers a solution to the Yale shooting problem with the resources of circumscription, by altering which predicates are allowed to vary and which are held fixed. Baker’s solution is not an exception to my claim, however, since his solution involves making a critical distinction between the role of causal and non-causal information.

Copyright © 2021 by
Robert Koons <>

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