Supplement to Defeasible Reasoning

John Pollock’s System

In defining what beliefs are warranted, given a directed graph representing a cognitive state, Pollock first defines a partial status assignment that assigns the statuses “defeated” or “undefeated” to some of the nodes of the graph.

An assignment \(\sigma\) is a partial status assignment iff:

  1. \(\sigma\) assigns “undefeated” to all nodes that are such that neither they nor any of their ancestors are defeated by any nodes in the graph.
  2. \(\sigma\) assigns “undefeated” to \(\alpha\) iff \(\sigma\) assigns “undefeated” to all the immediate ancestors of \(\alpha\), and all nodes defeating \(\alpha\) are assigned “defeated”.
  3. \(\sigma\) assigns “defeated” to a node \(\alpha\) iff either \(\alpha\) has an immediate ancester that is assigned “defeated”, or there is a node \(\beta\) that defeats \(\alpha\) and that is assigned “undefeated”.

An assignment \(\sigma\) is a status assignment iff \(\sigma\) is a maximal partial status assignment. A node is defeated outright iff no status assignment assigns “undefeated” to it. If some status assignments assign “defeated” to it, and some assign “undefeated” to it, then it is provisionally defeated. A node is warranted if it is neither defeated outright nor provisionally defeated; that is, if every status assignment assigns “undefeated” to it. Here are some of the consequences of Pollock’s definitions:

  • A node \(\alpha\) is undefeated iff all its immediate ancestors are undefeated and all nodes defeating \(\alpha\) are defeated.
  • If some immediate ancestor of \(\alpha\) is defeated outright, then \(\alpha\) is defeated outright.
  • If some node defeating \(\alpha\) is undefeated, then \(\alpha\) is defeated outright.
  • If \(\alpha\) is self-defeating, then \(\alpha\) is defeated outright.

Copyright © 2021 by
Robert Koons <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free