Supplement to Defeasible Reasoning

Models of Higher-Order Probability

A model of higher-order probability consists of \(W\), a set of possible worlds, together with a function that assigns to each world \(w\) a probability function \(\mu_w\). Let’s assume that these probability functions are non-standard, that is, they may assign infinitesimal probabilities to some sets of worlds. Let \([W]\) be the partition of \(W\) in terms of probabilistic agreement: worlds \(w\) and \(w'\) belong to the same cell of \([W]\) just in case they are assigned exactly the same probability function.

Let \(A\) be a subset of \([W]\). The set-theoretic union of \(A\), \(\bigcup A\), is a proposition expressible entirely in terms of probabilities (that is, entirely in terms of Boolean combinations of \(\Rightarrow\) conditionals). In the finite case, Miller’s principle states that, for all worlds \(w\) and all propositions \(B\) and \(C\):

\(\mu_w (C / B \cap \bigcup A) = \Sigma_{w' \in \cup A}\, \mu_{w'}(C / B) \times \mu_w (\{w\})\)

The logic of extreme higher-order probabilities consists of Lewis’s \(VC\) conditional logic, minus Strong Centering, and plus the following two axiom schemata, which I call Skyrms’s axioms (Koons 2000, Appendix B):

\((p \Rightarrow(q \Rightarrow r)) \leftrightarrow((p \amp q) \Rightarrow r)\)

\([(p \Rightarrow \neg(q \Rightarrow r)) \amp \neg((p \amp q) \Rightarrow \bot)] \leftrightarrow \neg((p \amp q) \Rightarrow r)\)

In both cases, “\(p\)” must be a Boolean combination of \(\Rightarrow\)-conditionals. The variables “\(q\)” and “\(r\)” may be replaced by any two formulas. The formula \(\neg((p \amp q) \Rightarrow \bot)\) expresses the joint possibility of \(p\) and \(q\) (in the sense that they don’t defeasibly imply a logical absurdity, \(\bot)\).

Copyright © 2021 by
Robert Koons <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free