Notes to Reasons for Action: Agent-Neutral vs. Agent-Relative

1. Thanks to David Copp for useful discussion of how best to read Nagel on this point.

2. Thanks to an anonymous referee for highlighting the importance of being clear about this from the outset.

3. McNaughton and Rawling also draw a distinction between object agent-relativity and author agent-relativity and mutatis mutandis for agent-neutrality. This distinction is somewhat idiosyncratic, though, and exploring it here would be a distraction from the main ways in which the basic distinction has historically been deployed. Those intrigued by this idea should see McNaughton and Rawling 1991. For an interesting critique of McNaughton and Rawling’s influential account, see Hammerton 2018. Hammerton defends a different version of the principle-based approach which distinguishes two different kinds of rules – rules couched in terms of ‘acting such that’, which are direct rules for conduct, and rules couched in terms of ‘bringing it about that’, which are indirect rules for conduct. Hammerton argues that this distinction provides a more plausible sorting of examples than McNaughton and Rawling’s approach.

4. What follows draws heavily on material in McKeever and Ridge 2006.

5. McKeever and I defend this assumption at length in McKeever and Ridge 2006.

6. There are tricky issues concerning freedom of the will raised here that I must put to one side.

7. See, for example, Cummiskey 1996, Hurley 1997, Kagan 1989, McNaughton and Rawling 1991, McNaughton and Rawling 1993, Nagel 1986, and Scheffler 1994. For a dissenting view, see Mack 1998.

8. For further discussion, see PEA Soup, a blog dedicated to philosophy, ethics, and academia (the posts at the bottom of the page).

9. Thanks to a referee for pressing me on this point.

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Michael Ridge <>

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