First published Mon May 11, 2015; substantive revision Fri Aug 2, 2019

Among the things commonly described as reconciled are ideas, narratives, persons, groups, and God. To reconcile theories with one another is to render them mutually consistent. To reconcile yourself to the fact that you have cancer is to live better with the belief that you do. Reconciliation of the divine-human relationship is linked in the Christian tradition to the notion of salvation. This essay concentrates on the uses to which the concept of reconciliation has been put in the treatment of moral and political issues that arise in the aftermath of wrongdoing and conflict between persons and groups.

The term ‘reconciliation’ is used to refer either to a process or to an outcome or goal. Reconciliation, as an outcome, is an improvement in the relations among parties formerly at odds with one another. The nature and degree of improvement required to qualify as reconciliation for any particular context is a matter of disagreement among theorists. So too, the reasons why relations have improved may play a role in determining whether reconciliation has genuinely taken place. That is, on some accounts, two parties will count as reconciled only if their better future relations result from their having satisfactorily dealt with the emotional, epistemic, and/or material legacy of the past. While the outcome of reconciliation is oriented toward a future marked by peaceful and just relations, the processes of reconciliation are typically oriented towards the continuing bad feelings, suspicions, or harms that were created by the conflicts and injustices of the past.

Philosophical interest in reconciliation as a moral and political value grew in the 1990s in response to its invocation during South Africa’s dramatic transition from apartheid to democracy (National Unity and Reconciliation Act, No. 34 of 1995; South African Truth and Reconciliation Commission Final Report 1998). The South African case, as well as the difficult issues left in the wake of other civil conflicts and periods of repression of the era, including the transitions from military juntas in South America and the wars in the former Yugoslavia, led political and legal thinkers to define the topic of transitional justice (see the entry on transitional justice). The question of transitional justice is: how can post-conflict and/or post-repression societies justly make the transition to stable and (it is usually stipulated) democratic government given the reality of past wrongs and harms (Minow 1998, Teitel 2002, C. Murphy 2017)? Of overriding importance is establishing the conditions that will ensure that such abuses happen “Never Again.” In South Africa in the 1990s, ‘reconciliation’ seemed to be of crucial importance to a just transition. It was in the name of this value that the Truth and Reconciliation Commission (TRC) offered amnesty from prosecution to those guilty of politically motivated human rights abuses in return for their full and truthful testimony. Theorists and political analysts debate the extent to which the TRC contributed to reconciliation in South Africa, as well as whether its Commissioners properly conceived of reconciliation (Tutu 1999, Rotberg and Thompson 2000, Gibson 2004, Hamber 2009, Allais 2012, Bates et al. 2020).

Increasingly, theorists and philosophers apply the language and theories of reconciliation, which were originally developed to deal with transitional contexts, to stable, non-transitional democracies. Discussions of how white settler states such as the United States, Canada, and Australia deal with their own historical legacies of injustice are now often posed as debates about reconciliation (Thompson 2002, Brooks 2004, Barkan and Karn 2006, Kymlicka and Bashir 2010, Coulthard 2014, Jung 2018). The value of reconciliation is also sometimes appealed to within discussions of criminal law, especially among those who are interested in investigating alternative sentencing procedures and sanctions. “Restorative justice” advocates conceptualize crime as a problem in the relationship among the offender, the victim, and the local community, and look to measures such as restitution payments and face-to-face dialogue in order to restore that relationship (Braithwaite 2000, van Ness and Strong 2002). Whether civil law, too, is amenable to interpretations that emphasize broken and repaired relationships is an open question (Radzik 2014). Meierhenrich (2008) notes connections between the value of reconciliation and practices in civil law traditions of “conciliation,” where the emphasis is on the accommodation of competing claims

Finally, reconciliation has emerged as a topic among moral theorists who discuss the ethical issues that arise in the aftermath of everyday forms of wrongdoing, such as transgressions within friendships or family relationships (Walker 2006, Griswold 2007, Radzik 2009). Much of this discussion takes place in the literature on forgiveness (see the entry on forgiveness). Here, theorists ask whether one may reconcile with a wrongdoer without also forgiving him, or forgive a person without reconciling. Such questions arise as well in the literature on reconciliation in political and legal contexts, where there are often strong objections to forgiving the wrongdoers (who may, after all, remain unrepentant for committing atrocities) or to placing other people under pressure to forgive them. For some, a conception of reconciliation that does not require forgiveness offers a positive way forward in these difficult cases (e.g., Eisikovits 2009, Verdeja 2009, C. Murphy 2010).

Discussion of the value of reconciliation, especially in political contexts, often has a skeptical orientation. Dictators and war-makers pay lip-service to the value of reconciliation while aggression continues. Such appeals reinforce skepticism about the value of reconciliation. In transitional contexts, reconciliation is claimed to put unjustifiable demands on victims of wrongdoing and to sacrifice justice for peace (Rotberg and Thompson 2000). In non-transitional contexts, fundamental political change is rarely on the table. So, for example, when the governments of white settler states call on indigenous peoples to reconcile, the politics of reconciliation may simply look like a demand that indigenous peoples ‘reconcile themselves to’ the status quo (Coulthard 2014).

Other critics charge that the language of reconciliation lends itself to misuse because it is essentially empty. Given that the concept has no widely recognized, determinate content or clear normative standards, almost anyone can claim to be pursuing reconciliation (Schaap 2008). As this essay will indicate, defenders of the concept of reconciliation do believe that it is amenable to further articulation. However, while the concept of reconciliation is not empty, it defies easy or definitive analysis.

This entry treats the topic of reconciliation in a manner that respects its significance across moral (viz. interpersonal and private), legal and political contexts. Many of the issues and debates that arise in the literature on reconciliation are relevant to each of these contexts. However, issues that are specific to political contexts, where the philosophical literature on reconciliation is most extensive, will receive special attention.

Particular conceptions of reconciliation vary across a number of dimensions. As section 1 explains, the kind of relationship at issue in a specific context affects the type of improvement in relations that might be necessary in order to qualify as reconciliation. Reconciliation is widely taken to be a scalar concept. Section 2 discusses the spectrum of intensity along which kinds of improvement in relationships fall, and indicates why, in particular contexts, theorists often disagree about the point along this spectrum that is morally or politically most significant. Section 3 provides an overview of the processes commonly cited as contributing to reconciliation. These processes are often controversial; those praised by some commentators as appropriate and constructive responses to past conflict are dismissed by others as undermining the moral or political conditions for just and peaceful relations. Section 4 concentrates on the relationship between reconciliation and justice. While some see these values as compatible and mutually supporting, others argue that, especially in the immediate wake of conflict, parties must often choose between reconciliation and justice.

1. Types of Improvement

At the most abstract level, reconciliation can be characterized as an improvement in the relationship between two or more parties who were previously in conflict. A relationship with another party consists of patterns of interaction, the attitudes one tends to take toward that party, and the expectations of and beliefs about the other that one makes. Five rough categories of improvement in relationships emerge from the literature:

  1. Changes in institutional structures: examples include policies for police reform, for building the rule of law, for overcoming alienation from the existing institutional order, and for renewed participation in shared institutions or practices (C. Murphy 2010, Lu 2017);
  2. Changes in external behaviors: examples include a cessation of aggressive or insulting behaviors, increased ability to function in close proximity to the other party, and increased ability to cooperate with the other party;
  3. Changes in belief: for example, loss of the belief that the other party is inherently evil or of lower moral value compared to others, acceptance of a narrative of the past wrong according to which the other party once again seems predictable and coherent (Dwyer 1999), and belief that the other party is no longer likely to pose an unreasonable danger to oneself;
  4. Resolving negative emotions and attitudes: in this category, examples include merely accepting what cannot be changed; overcoming resentment, fear, hate or anger toward the wrongdoing party; as well as managing shame or guilt (Mihai 2016, Lu 2017).
  5. Adopting or resuming positive emotions and attitudes: e.g., mutual respect, compassion, love, a shared sense of identity (Hirsch 2011b) or solidarity, mutual recommitment to a shared set of moral or communal norms, or mutual trust.

The term ‘forgiveness’ does not appear on this list, though the substance of forgiveness may be broken down into these categories. As section 3.8 explains, theorists disagree about how to analyze forgiveness. While some see it as primarily a change in attitudes and emotions, others take forbearance from certain behaviors to be definitive of forgiveness.

Different kinds of relationships (friends, employer/employee, fellow citizens, citizen/official) are marked by distinct sets of interactions, attitudes, and expectations. Different kinds of relationships can also be distinguished by the norms to which they should adhere. The legitimate expectations we have of our friends differ from those we have of our employees, strangers who are nevertheless fellow citizens, or those who are acting in official state capacities. Some critics find the images of damaged and repaired relationships rather strained, given that many of the cases of criminal or political wrongdoing that are spoken of in these terms involve people who are strangers to one another (Sher 2013). In response, those who favor the language of relationships argue either that the conflict itself creates a problematic relationship, which then must be reshaped or repaired (Govier 2002), or that even strangers hold attitudes and expectations of one another, as is revealed by the resentful or indignant reactions we have when those strangers violate our expectations (Scanlon 2008).

In speaking of reconciliation, it is important for theorists to specify which of the relationships between two parties is being reconciled. For example, two individuals may be friends, co-workers, co-religionists, fellow citizens, and fellow members of the Kantian Kingdom of Ends, among many other connections. After a dispute at work, two people may reconcile their working relationship but not their friendship. On the other hand, they may decide that the only way to save their friendship is by not working together anymore. One cannot say whether they have reconciled without specifying which relationship is in question.

Most theorists of reconciliation allow that, not only pairs of individuals, but also groups can be reconciled. Indeed, all of the following combinations appear within the literature: the reconciliation of an individual with a small group (such as a family); an individual to a large group (such as a state); two smaller groups with one another (such as two ethnic groups within a state); a smaller group with a large group (such as a minority group to a state); and one group with a collection of groups (such as the international community) (Govier and Verwoerd 2002a, Fabre 2016). Given that changes in beliefs and attitudes play a role in most accounts of reconciliation, these views put pressure on theorists to explain in what sense groups can be described as having beliefs and attitudes (cf. Griswold 2007).

Theorists disagree about whether there is a general theory of reconciliation that can cover all kinds and types of relationship. Some theorists offer accounts of reconciliation designed to cover the repair of a wide range of interpersonal and political relationships, including those among friends, co-workers, and fellow citizens (Govier 2006). Such accounts recognize the above variations in relationships, but present a general characterization of categories that can be further specified for relationships of different types. Other theorists restrict their focus to a particular kind of relationship (C. Murphy 2010, May 2011).

2. Defining Normative Standards

Reconciliation has as its goal improved relationships. Reconciliation often denotes restoration, which suggests a return to the status quo ante, that is, the state of affairs before the wrong or conflict in question. This connotation has led some scholars to urge the use of ‘conciliation’ rather than ‘reconciliation’ in contexts where groups or individuals have never lived according to good, just relations, such as the white and black populations of South Africa at the moment the apartheid regime fell (Krog 2008, Moon 2009). But given the importance of the South Africa’s post-apartheid experiences to the literature on reconciliation, other scholars choose to brook the linguistic infelicity of defining the term ‘reconciliation’ so that it includes the pursuit of good relations for the first time, and not merely the reestablishment of formerly good relations (Govier 2006, C. Murphy 2010, Philpott 2012). Here, the task is to articulate an account of improved relationships that satisfies a normative standard for the relationship in question, a standard that may not have been previously realized in practice.

Theorists of reconciliation generally recognize that reconciliation is a “scalar” concept, which allows for minimal and maximal versions of improved relationships (Crocker 1999, Griswold 2007). Each of the categories along which relationships might improve (institutions, behavior, beliefs, attitudes or emotions) admits of degree. For example, in the aftermath of a dispute between friends, the resumption of basic respect is a lower degree of emotional restoration than the resumption of love and trust. In the aftermath of bloody civil war, the resumption of cooperation between two parties may be described as a greater change in behavior than their mere peaceful coexistence. Maximal forms of political reconciliation are typically identified as either civic friendship (May 2011), forgiveness (Tutu 1999), or political or national unity (for an overview of such conceptions see Allen 1999).

Though the term ‘reconciliation’ can be used to pick out an entire range of phenomena, theorists will often make an argument for somehow privileging one point on the scale. Some scholars attempt to fix the definition of reconciliation for a particular relational context by looking to the nature of the relationship in question. For example, it may not make sense to talk about spouses as reconciled unless there is a reestablishment of trust, love and intimacy. Spouses may get over their anger and resentment. They may cooperate successfully in raising their children together. But if trust, love and intimacy are not restored they have not reconciled as spouses. Similarly, in order to define what is necessary for the reconciliation of parties as members of a moral community (Radzik 2009), a political community (C. Murphy 2010), or the international community (Barry 1980), we might look to the ideals that appropriately define those relationships. In the South African debate, some commentators linked their conception of reconciliation to the moral value of ubuntu (Tutu 1999, Krog 2008). Ubuntu is frequently summarized through the Zulu saying, “umuntu ngumuntu ngabantu,” which can be translated as “a person depends on others to be a person” (see, for example, Matolino and Kwindingwi 2013, who are more critical of the relevance of ubuntu in post-apartheid South Africa).

The debate about the nature of political reconciliation reflects a concern, not only with ideals of political relationship, but also with non-ideal facts about societies torn apart by injustice or violence. For example, Bhargava (2012) defends a weak conception of reconciliation by emphasizing how significant an achievement peaceful coexistence can be in the aftermath of atrocities. He worries that advocating the pursuit of stronger forms of reconciliation will require that the past be forgotten, leaving the victims to absorb the costs of that past without protest. In contrast, C. Murphy (2010) argues that minimal versions should be rejected, for they suggest that relationships have been repaired and reconciliation achieved too quickly. A more robust notion of political reconciliation highlights the profound impact of conflict and repression on political interaction, and draws attention to the long-term and complex changes the establishment of a just peace among those formerly in conflict demands. Tutu (1999) suggests that forgiveness may be necessary for achieving a peaceful and stable political community. Others argue that efforts at reconciliation should aim somewhere between the extremes of a mere cessation of aggression and full-fledged forgiveness. Moellendorf (2007), for example, claims that reconciliation involves former enemies coming to see each other as fellow citizens, who should be treated as equals. Gutmann and Thompson (2000) argue political reconciliation is oriented towards the cultivation of democratic reciprocity in interaction, which is a willingness to seek common ground with fellow citizens on matters of public policy.

Another view, which emerges specifically out of the literature on political reconciliation, insists that reconciliation cannot be defined pre-politically (Schaap 2005) or in a non-context specific manner (Kofi Annan Foundation 2018). That is, the proper standards for reconciliation within a particular post-conflict society can only be determined through the free, deliberative and democratic processes of that society (Crocker 2008). It follows that what counts as reconciliation in one context will not count in another.

Some critics charge that even to pose the problem that faces conflict-ridden societies as an issue of reconciliation improperly assumes that the project of political unity is legitimate and thereby undermines calls for decolonization, secession or other forms of greater political autonomy for disempowered groups (Woolford 2004, Alfred 2009, Jung 2018). Critics further argue that adopting the frame of a unifying rhetoric of reconciliation can blind the parties to roles that racial or ethnic identity, gender, colonization or oppression played in bringing the atrocities about in the first place, as well as the lopsided distribution of harms that they have caused (Corntassel and Holder 2008, Grey and James 2016). Theorists in the “agonistic” tradition are also asking whether the concept of reconciliation can remain useful within a framework that assumes that politics is and will properly remain confrontational (Hirsch 2011a, Bohle 2017).

3. Processes of Reconciliation

Processes of reconciliation are designed to contribute to the improvement of relationships damaged as a result of wrongdoing. A wide range of such processes is examined in the literature. One that is brought up, more often in the context of objections to reconciliation rather than defenses, is forgetting (Hughes 2001, Bhargava 2012). Since the past cannot be changed, wrongdoing cannot be undone. Therefore, one might argue, the only way to overcome a painful past is to suppress the memory of it. Policies of forgetting in the name of reconciliation have been pursued by some states, including Cambodia, whose prime minister advised his fellow citizens in 1999 “to dig a hole and bury the past,” while granting amnesty from prosecution to Khmer Rouge leaders (Chandler 2003, 310).

However, those theorists who defend the political and moral value of reconciliation more often reject the claim that reconciliation requires forgetting. Instead, these defenders generally claim that knowledge and acknowledgement of wrongdoing, as well as recognition of the victims, are crucial to successful reconciliation. Especially in political contexts, knowledge of basic facts is critical because often victims and the broader political community do not know who was responsible for the wrong suffered, nor the extent of violations committed. Acknowledgement refers to the official, public recognition of what happened. This is often needed to counter official denial of wrongdoing or responsibility for wrongdoing (Weschler 1998). The unspoken, Freudian assumption is that suppressed traumas will inevitably reemerge in destructive ways. The more explicit arguments are that the acknowledgement of wrongs and of victims helps heal psychic wounds (van Ness and Strong 2002), enable trust (Gibson 2004), reestablish normative standards for behavior (Walker 2006), and reassert that the victims are indeed members of the moral or political community (Llewellyn and Howse 1999, du Toit 2000).

As will be discussed below, while there is wide agreement that the processes of reconciliation must acknowledge the wrongs of the past and the proper standing of victims, theorists debate precisely how such acknowledgements are best communicated, so that they will be sufficiently credible and effective in improving future relations. More broadly, theorists debate how effective past processes of reconciliation have proven to be, and how to measure effectiveness (Bates et al. 2020)

There is also ongoing debate in the political realm about which wrongs must be acknowledged and redressed. Violations of civil and political rights have historically been the focus of both theory and practice, but scholars also argue for the importance of addressing violations of economic and cultural rights (Mamdani 2000, Arbour 2007, Sharp 2015). Theorists also disagree about what else, besides acknowledgement, must be achieved in order for reconciliation to be either likely or warranted. Must material forms of harm be redressed? Must retributive justice be achieved? Must the parties forgive? Disagreements about identifying necessary or appropriate processes are typically connected to the issue of the last section: disagreements about what degree of improvement in relations can reasonably be pursued in the aftermath of wrongdoing. Finally, there is debate about who should decide which process of reconciliation is adopted in a given context. In the political context, this is in response to calls for greater local agency and decision-making (McEvoy 2007).

3.1 Apologies

Apologizing is perhaps the most explicit way in which wrongdoing can be acknowledged. A well-formed apology requires at least acknowledgement of both the fact of wrongdoing and responsibility by the wrongdoer, as well as an expression of regret or remorse (Tavuchis 1991). Ideally, the wrongdoer directly addresses the victim. This is not possible in all cases, of course, as when victims have passed away. However, apologies made to indirect victims, such as the families of the deceased, as well as apologies performed before broader, interested communities are well established in practice. In recent decades, official apologies, delivered by state entities or corporations, have become more common, raising questions about the validity and significance of apologetic statements made by representatives on behalf of groups (Harvey 1995, Gibney et al 2008), especially when the events in question lie in the distant past (Pettigrove 2003).

Apologies are frequently valued, not merely as acknowledgements of past wrongdoing and gestures of respect to victims, but also as providing evidence of a positive change in the wrongdoer or in the wrongdoers’ group. Parties who have come to take responsibility for and repudiate past wrongful actions are better candidates for renewed relationships of cooperation and trust (de Greiff 2008). This potential is undermined, however, where apologies are overly vague, incomplete, or appear insincere. One may reasonably question whether mere admissions that “mistakes were made” (which do not own up to responsibility or specify what the mistakes themselves were) or that the speaker “regrets if anyone took offense” (which leaves open the question of whether the action was really wrong) qualify as apologies at all (Smith 2008). The importance of being sensitive to the gendered aspects of apology has also been highlighted (MacLachlan 2013).

While apologies are considered by some to make a significant contribution to reconciliation (Brooks 2004, M. Murphy 2011), others worry that, in political cases, apologies may be used as a substitute for more substantive forms of redress (Corntassel and Holder 2008). Official state apologies for systematic or historic injustices often result only after protracted and heated debate, leaving little political will to move on to other forms of redress that may be more significant to the victimized group. Such dynamics give credence to the view that apology may amount to a “politics of distraction” (Corntassel and Holder 2008).

3.2 Memorials

Memorials take a number of different forms, such as monuments, preserved sites of important or tragic events, museums, archives, ceremonies or educational activities (Barsalou and Baxter 2007, Zembylas 2011). They may be officially or privately sponsored. Yet all provide a shared focus for memory. Scholars argue that memorials of past wrongdoing have the potential to play a number of different roles in the process of reconciliation. First and foremost, they help preserve the memory of the past event, which counters any who would deny or forget the past. They help consolidate a communal understanding of history and provide a shared focus for emotions, such as grief or remorse. By helping to forge a collective memory of the past, memorials may also help rebuild or reshape a sense of collective identity (Harjes 2005). Commemorations provided by groups responsible for wrongdoing may demonstrate a willingness to acknowledge responsibility for such wrongs, (renewed) respect for the victims, and commitment never to repeat such misdeeds (Barsalou and Baxter 2007, Blustein 2014). For the victimized group, a memorial can encourage self-respect, show fidelity to the dead, and help preserve their sense of themselves as a people (Blustein 2014).

On the other hand, memorials are frequently surrounded by controversy, as parties disagree over the version of history put forward or the manner in which it is displayed (Minow 1998). Attempts to aestheticize past horrors may be offensive to some viewers (Young 2008). Memorials may cynically divert attention from ongoing problems (Blustein 2014) or serve as a rallying point for those who would like to renew the conflict (Barsalou and Baxter 2007). Furthermore, the meanings of memorials change over time, as they are continually reinterpreted by later audiences inhabiting different political circumstances. There is thus no guarantee that a memorial that contributes to reconciliation at one point in time will continue to do so (Blustein 2014).

3.3 Truth Telling

Both apologies and memorials combine an acknowledgment of a troublesome past with the suggestion of an emotional reaction to that past, such as remorse, regret or grief. Yet, even without such emotional content, the communication of the facts of the past can play a role in reconciliation. Individual victims and survivors often find themselves unable to move on when they are uncertain about crucial facts of the past. What precisely happened to their loved one? Did she suffer? Who exactly committed the violent act? Who gave the order? Where is the body buried? Moreover, in political contexts wrongdoing is frequently officially denied, either in the refusal to acknowledge that violations of rights occurred or that a particular agent such as the state was responsible for the violations that are known.

Truth telling, some scholars claim, can ameliorate ongoing suffering of victims and survivors who lack information about what happened and who was (or was not) responsible for abuses (Zalaquett 1995). It can counter certain forms of denial (Zalaquett 1995, Dyzenhaus 2000) and help combat the social structures that cultivate ignorance among more privileged populations (Regan 2010, Steyn 2012). Truth telling may also serve as a way of making reparation for those not actually implicated in crimes. Efforts to record and archive this information, as well as to distribute it in the form of educational materials, aim at ensuring that future generations will not repeat the past.

In restorative justice processes, criminals are often required to give a narrative of the crime (Llewellyn and Howse 1999). In the political sphere, one formal mechanism for uncovering and documenting the past is a truth commission. Truth commissions are temporary official institutions established to examine patterns of specified human rights abuses over a given time period (Hayner 2010). Dozens of truth commissions have been established in communities around the globe, including Chile, Chad, and Canada. Commission reports provide a summary of such findings and typically issue recommendations on how to prevent such abuses in the future. These reports vary in the degree to which the proceedings and findings are made public. Some name individual perpetrators and some do not. The South African Truth and Reconciliation Commission, which was marked by a high degree of openness, televised the testimony of many victims and perpetrators.

In the literature, a variety of claims are advanced regarding how truth commissions can contribute to reconciliation, both among individual perpetrators and victims as well as within national communities. At the individual level, talking through the past is often represented as a form of catharsis, wherein the trauma of the past can be re-experienced, dealt with, and let go. The South African TRC appeared to offer several examples of such a process, including spontaneous requests for forgiveness by perpetrators and offers of forgiveness by victims (Tutu 1999, South African Truth and Reconciliation Commission Final Report 1998).

In terms of societal reconciliation, it is claimed that truth commissions reintegrate victims in a number of ways. The very fact that victims state publicly what happened to them contributes to re-establishing their civic and political dignity as well as participatory standing (Kiss 2000). Officially recording the wrongs done to victims, which were typically officially denied in the past, reinforces the equal moral standing of victims (du Toit 2000). The report produced by a commission, especially when made public, can cultivate collective reconciliation by aiding a community to alter its self-understanding. A narrative must be produced of how a community could at once have a past full of abuses as well as a present and ideal future in which those abuses are rejected (Dwyer 1999). It can also challenge stereotypes that dehumanized members of the community in the past (C. Murphy 2010) and foster sympathy (Eisikovits 2009). The proceedings and report of a truth commission can foster trust in institutions (Gibson 2004). By condemning actions of the past, truth commissions reassert the force of normative standards that have been violated, or establish new normative standards for conduct when the extant terms for a relationship are unjust or immoral (Walker 2010). Telling the truth is taken to be a form of reparation for victims (Zalaquett 1995, Walker 2010). Finally, the recommendations issued by commissions can contribute to the prevention of future wrongdoing.

Truth commissions remain controversial. Many of the criticisms target, not the value of establishing the truth itself, but the means used to encourage perpetrators to testify, such as amnesty from prosecution. Others object to the ways in which truth commissions (sometimes subtly) pressure victims toward a forgiveness or reconciliation they may want to resist (Dyzenhaus 2000, Gutmann and Thompson 2000, C. Murphy 2010), or question the psychological benefits of giving testimony for victims (Hamber 2009). Still other critics of truth commissions charge that the pursuit of narrative self-understanding is objectionable, insofar as it tries to establish a single authoritative interpretation of the past (Gutmann and Thompson 2000, Regan 2010). Finally, there are doubts about the reconciliatory effects of commissions that uncover the truth, but fail to take action against those implicated in wrongs (Hamber 2009).

3.4 Amnesties

Amnesties, which grant legal protection from civil and/or criminal liability, are a particularly controversial form of reconciliation process. Amnesty can be granted to individuals or classes of persons. It can be granted unconditionally or conditionally. If conditional, the granting of amnesty occurs only if certain provisions are met. For example, in South Africa, perpetrators had to make a complete disclosure of the rights violations for which they were responsible and demonstrate that such violations were committed for political reasons (Dyzenhaus 2000). Amnesties may also be conditional on nonrecidivism (Freeman 2011). Finally, amnesties vary in the extent to which they preclude other negative consequences (e.g., being fired) (Greenawalt 2000).

A number of moral objections to amnesties have been raised. Amnesties seem at least prima facie unjust; specifically, amnesty prevents retributive and/or corrective justice from being done (Greenawalt 2000). Granting amnesty is claimed to be inimical to countering historical impunity for political leaders and government agents responsible for egregious violations of human rights. And achieving the aspiration of “Never Again” seems intuitively less likely if future political leaders and actors believe they will not be held accountable for their actions. The danger posed by amnesty policies is that, in failing to hold wrongdoers accountable and undermining the ability of victims to seek legal recourse for their harms, they may (inadvertently) send the message that the abuses of the past were not wrong or that the victims did not deserve better treatment (Pensky 2008). Justified anger against the perpetrators will not be exorcised, and may instead find expression in acts of revenge.

Amnesties continue to be used by states and in fact have increased in frequency (Mallinder 2008). Communities adopt amnesties for a variety of reasons. Amnesties may encourage perpetrators to give full and truthful testimony to truth commissions. Here, the value of remembering the past is emphasized. In contrast, as in Cambodia, amnesties can be used as part of a strategy to forget the past. Amnesties also may be used to incentivize an end to conflict, as was the case in South Africa (Dyzenhaus 2000).

Arguments for the moral permissibility of amnesty challenge the idea that granting amnesty reinforces impunity or undermines stability and justice (Mallinder 2008). Freeman (2011) claims that amnesties can be justified as a measure of last resort, so long as victims are included in the process of deciding to pass an amnesty and amnesties are used for the sake of facilitating an end to conflict or reconciliation. Greenawalt (2000) argues that amnesties can be justified when necessary to prevent even greater injustice from occurring, such as violations of human rights as part of an ongoing conflict. By demonstrating mercy to perpetrators, amnesties might help end a cycle of violence (O’Shea 2002).

3.5 Trials and Punishment

Punishment is the intentional infliction of harm or suffering on a wrongdoer in response to a wrong committed. Although transitional societies are sometimes portrayed as having to choose between reconciliation and punishment, these responses are not necessarily opposed (Bennett 2008, Verdeja 2009). As is often clear in interpersonal or criminal cases, the punishment of a wrongdoer (and especially the wrongdoer’s acceptance of that punishment) can be a process by which the wrongs of the past are redressed. The power of punishment to put the past to rest has been explained in a number of different ways, such as repaying a debt, removing an unfair advantage (Morris 1968), satisfying the victim’s anger (Hershenov 1999), or reaffirming the equal moral status of victims (Hampton 1992). Implicit in this last analysis is the assumption that wrongdoing is fundamentally expressive, and what is expressed is the inferior moral standing of the victim, which permits the infliction of harm. Criminal prosecutions help victims re-gain sense of status as rights holder and so enhance dignity (Nino 1998, Bennett 2008).

In the context of transitions to democracy, some scholars concentrate specifically on the significance of trials in response to collective and politically significant crimes, such as those involving human rights abuses by officials. Criminal trials mark a clear break from the past (Malamud-Goti 1990). Trials signal the official disapproval of the actions for which an individual is being prosecuted, actions that may not have been officially condemned before. Criminal trials and punishment are also claimed to make a crucial contribution to societal reconciliation by reaffirming the normative standards that should govern interaction. Punishment can signify or cultivate a commitment to the rule of law, as well as the faith in law and decency among officials upon which the rule of law depends (C. Murphy 2010).

On the other hand, a number of scholars are skeptical about the reconciliatory impact of criminal trials, especially in response to widespread wrongdoing. Judith Shklar (1964) and Hannah Arendt (1977) argue trials do little to heal victims wounded by wrongdoing and have little pedagogical role regarding the normative standards that should govern relations. Trials fundamentally are oriented towards the establishment of the guilt of individual perpetrators, not the pursuit of the truth about the past. This can lead to a very limited understanding of the collective character of the injustices perpetrated, their impact on victims and the broader context that made such wrongdoing possible, all of which may be important for reconciliation (Llewellyn and Howse 1999, Isaacs 2016). Moreover, the ability of domestic criminal justice systems in transitional societies to adhere to internationally recognized procedural standards has been questioned, as has the justifiability of selectively prosecuting only a fraction of the perpetrators involved in collective crimes (van Zyl 2000).

3.6 Lustration

Lustration refers to legal measures that permit or require the investigation of individuals running for election, serving in the military, or working in government agencies, universities, or the media. Individuals found to have connections to past injustices or perpetrating groups may then be publicly exposed or excluded from serving in public roles (David 2011). Such measures are frequently adopted during postwar occupations or in countries transitioning to democracy. Lustration is sometimes conceived of as a punitive measure, which opens practitioners up to charges of engaging in collective forms of punishment that ignore individual desert and violating prohibitions on retroactive law (Cohen 1995, Meierhenrich 2006). Lustration has also been defended in forward-looking terms as a means of securing peace or a political transition as well as reestablishing trust in government by assuring the public that past wrongdoers will no longer be in power (Chiu 2011). Criticisms of lustration as a means of pursuing political reconciliation highlight the potential for biased application of the law (Cohen 1995), warn of the difficulties of re-establishing a functional government when much of the experienced and educated workforce is excluded from participation (Hollywood 2007), and worry that lustration encourages the continuation of suspicion rather than cooperation among former enemies (Govier 2006).

3.7 Reparations

The term ‘reparations’ has been used more and less broadly to refer to efforts to repair the harm that results from a wrong or conflict. A narrow use of the term refers to a transfer of land, goods, or wealth that is intended to directly compensate for goods that were taken, damaged or destroyed. The payment is made either by the party who was responsible for the harm, by the wrongdoers’ descendants or other beneficiaries, or potentially by a third party acting on the wrongdoers’ behalf. This sort of transfer is perhaps better labeled ‘restitution.’ Transfers made in response to losses that are not literally replaceable or monetizable, such as deaths or injuries, are also referred to as restitution or reparation. A still broader use of the term includes material transfers that have a more purely symbolic function. These payments are meant to send a conciliatory message of some sort rather than to suggest that the wrong or harm is being paid back. One friend’s gift to another after a quarrel could be an example of a symbolic reparation in everyday life. So could investments in the economy of a former foe. The term ‘reparations’ is also used even more broadly to include acts other than material transfers, such as apologies or instances of truth-telling (Torpey 2003, Walker 2010).

As we will discuss further in section 4, arguments for material transfers may appeal directly to principles of corrective justice. Those commentators who defend material reparations in the name of reconciliation frequently interpret such payments as acknowledgements of responsibility, expressions of respect for the moral status of the victims, acts of remorse or caring, evidence of increased trustworthiness or a recommitment to the norms of justice (Thompson 2002, Brooks 2004, Gray 2010, Walker 2010). Yet the meanings of reparations can change, be undermined or repudiated, depending on the manner and context in which they are offered (Brooks 1999, Barkan 2000, de Greiff 2006). Still, when combined with apologies, truth-telling, and other measures, reparations have the potential to improve relations. Perhaps more importantly, leaving identifiable harms uncompensated may undermine the effectiveness of apologies and other efforts to reconcile.

Reparations for historical injustice are particularly controversial. One ongoing debate concerns the guilt or liability of those who would pay, the claim-rights and connection to the victims of those who would receive payment, and the difficulty in calculating the proper sum of restitution (Waldron 1992, Wheeler 1997, Boxill 2003). Such debates suggest that reparations are being interpreted as restitution, where the legalistic logic of property rights and inheritance are paramount, rather than under the broader project of repairing relationships (Thompson 2002, Brooks 2004).

Victims and their descendants, for their part, sometimes worry that accepting reparation payments may be seen as drawing a line under the past, as implying the moral debt is paid or that all is forgiven (Barkan 2000). They also object to the suggestion that the people and other valuable things lost could be repaid by money or other material goods.

3.8 Forgiveness

There is considerable disagreement, especially in the political literature, on the relationship between forgiveness and reconciliation. Can parties be reconciled if forgiveness is refused? Is forgiveness genuine if the victim refuses to restore her relationship with the wrongdoer? In part, differences of opinion on these matters are traceable to the sorts of disagreements about defining reconciliation that have been surveyed here (namely, regarding the kinds and degrees of improvement that must be made before a specific kind of relationship may be described as reconciled). Similar disagreements over the nature of forgiveness complicate matters even further.

In the literature on interpersonal forgiveness, definitions of forgiveness commonly focus on the overcoming or forswearing of resentment (or similar negative attitudes) that were the result of wrongdoing, and (some would add) the reestablishment of positive attitudes, such as goodwill, toward the wrongdoer (J. Murphy 2003, Pettigrove 2012). Where such changes in attitude do not occur, but where the parties to the wrong manage to reestablish peaceful coexistence, cooperation or even trust, talk of reconciliation seems reasonable. This would be a case of reconciliation without forgiveness. Similarly, a victim might let go of her resentment of someone who mistreated her and yet take steps to avoid future contact with that person out of concern for her safety. Such a case exhibits forgiveness without reconciliation. Forgiveness and reconciliation, on this account, appear to be distinct and independent phenomena.

Still, the attitude-centered account of forgiveness is compatible with the view that forgiving is a powerful means to reconciliation. The sorts of negative attitudes that are overcome by forgiveness are powerful obstacles to good relations. When those attitudes are resolved, reconciliation is an unsurprising result. It also makes sense, given this view of forgiveness, to argue that a case of reconciliation that does not include forgiveness is less complete than one that does include forgiveness. Depending on the circumstances, an improvement in relations that leaves resentment and ill will in place may not seem worthy of the label ‘reconciliation.’ In these cases, one might say that forgiveness is necessary for reconciliation.

When commentators work with a different conception of forgiveness, the discussion of reconciliation is also different. One alternative view of forgiveness, which appears to be more popular in political than interpersonal contexts, places emphasis on the actions of victims rather than their internal mental states, suggesting that when a person or group forgives they gives up their moral right to hold the wrong against the wrongdoer (Digeser 2001, Wolterstorff 2013). Such views have been labeled ‘relational’ or ‘commissive’ accounts of forgiveness (Blustein 2014, Pettigrove 2012). Exactly how much one gives up in forgiving is not always specified and opinions seem to differ. At a minimum, the victim forswears his right to personally retaliate against the wrongdoer. But does forgiving entail that he also forswears calling for punishment by the proper authorities, or reparations for the harms he suffered, or his right to remind the wrongdoer and others of the wrong? If one thinks of forgiveness as relinquishing a (more or less broad) right to hold a wrong against a wrongdoer, then it seems forgiveness may well be productive of reconciliation. However, depending on how much victims give up in forgiving, this kind of reconciliation may be purchased at the cost of justice (Blustein 2014). In contrast, those who think of forgiving as the overcoming of resentment often argue that victims can forgive yet also call for punishment, reparations and remembrance of the wrong (J. Murphy 2003).

However one defines forgiveness, the claim that victims should forgive in order to bring about valuable reconciliation is likely to be controversial because it asks the very people who were most deeply insulted, wronged and harmed by the past conflict to bear the burden of repairing it. Another point of concern is whether the victims are being asked to forgive unconditionally (that is, without any prior, ameliorative response from the wrongdoer) or conditionally (that is, in response to a morally significant change in or act by the wrongdoer) (Garrard and McNaughton 2011). Furthermore, whether or not a particular act of forgiveness would be morally appropriate, virtuous, or even prudent for the victim, pressuring a victim to forgive is widely regarded as problematic (Govier and Verwoerd 2002b).

Efforts to make forgiveness central to reconciliation also run into questions about who has the standing to forgive. To forgive on behalf of a living victim is morally unacceptable, if not simply impossible (Govier and Verwoerd 2002b). Some theorists also hold that it is impossible to forgive on behalf of deceased victims, from which it follows that wrongs such as murder will be unforgivable (Jankélévitch 2005). In these cases, the possibility of a reconciliation that is distinct from forgiveness offers a way to conceive of a positive resolution of the past. Theorists debate whether states or other groups might have the standing to forgive on their own behalf, independent of the choices of individual victims. Those who think of forgiveness as primarily a change in attitudes must make sense of attributing such mental states to groups, perhaps by explaining how attitude changes in representative persons (such as leaders or spokespeople) qualify as group forgiveness (cf. Griswold 2007). The claim that groups can forgive is easier to make for those who think of forgiveness as the waiving of a set of rights (Wolterstorff 2013).

3.9 Participation in Deliberative Processes

At this point, a wide variety of processes that promise to repair relationships in the aftermath of wrongdoing or conflict have been reviewed. Perhaps one of the greatest factors in determining whether reconciliation efforts will be successful is the manner in which they are selected. A number of measures (e.g., apologies, truth telling) are aimed at restoring a sense of dignity and inclusion to formerly mistreated or disempowered parties. This effect may be magnified if those parties also have a say, for example, in choosing criminal trials or truth commissions, determining the form reparations would take, or designing memorials.

Restorative justice approaches to criminal sentencing place a premium on victims’ participation (Johnstone 2002). In practices such as sentencing conferences and victim-offender mediation, the victim plays an active role in determining the manner in which the offender will make up for her crime. In this way, the victim has a greater chance of receiving a form of satisfaction that he will value more (e.g., restitution payments rather than the imprisonment of the offender). The victim’s active participation may also provide him with an opportunity to exorcise his resentments or fears, restore his sense of control over his life, and reaffirm his status as a valued member of the community who should not have been mistreated (Johnstone 2002).

Restorative justice models also value the active participation of offenders in finding a resolution to wrongdoing (Zehr 1990). For example, offenders may be asked to propose forms of reparation they could offer to victims. In being allowed an opportunity to play a role in building a better future, the offender may avoid a dangerous rage-shame spiral and regain a sense of self-worth (Braithwaite 2000).

In political cases, the roles of victim and perpetrator are often not clear-cut or agreed upon. Here, incorporating input from the various parties to the conflict in designing reconciliation processes will increase the chances that those measures will be viewed as legitimate across the entire community (Barsalou and Baxter 2007). Inclusive deliberative processes for the selection, design, and interpretation of reconciliation efforts can also provide a valuable model for the future of the community (Crocker 1999, Anker 2016). The future will never be free of conflict, so an appropriate goal of reconciliation processes is to establish norms for resolving disagreements in a peaceful, just and equitable manner.

4. Reconciliation and Justice

Wrongdoing has implications for multiple moral values, including, most fundamentally, justice. Justice-based concerns traditionally dominate philosophical discussions of responding to wrongdoing. What is the relationship between justice and reconciliation? Discussion of this question occurs most explicitly in the political context, especially in debates about the moral justifiability of non-punitive responses to wrongdoing such as truth commissions. This section provides an overview of the various positions that have been advanced concerning the relationship between justice and reconciliation.

Whether reconciliation is compatible with justice turns, of course, on how one conceives of justice. In some parts of the literature, the question concerns corrective justice. For example, critics object to calls for reconciliation that are not accompanied with restitution for harms suffered, such as the appropriation of land (Alfred 2009). In section 3.7, we describe how, in other cases, restitution and reparation are defended as a means to reconciliation. However, as Howard McGary (2010 argues, here too there is a tension between justice and reconciliation. Principles of restitution are generally taken to be backward-looking, in the sense that the past action of wrongful taking itself provides sufficient grounds for making the victims whole. Bringing in the rhetoric of reconciliation suggests instead that the reason for the transfer of goods is to secure better future relations among wrongdoers and victims. McGary argues that this forward-looking goal of reconciliation can insultingly suggest that a concern for corrective justice is an insufficient reason to compensate the victim--that justice for these victims is only worth securing when it is also in the interest of the wrongdoers.

For many other theorists, especially those writing about transitional contexts, justice is assumed to be ‘retributive justice’ (see the entry on retributive justice). The core claim of retributivists is that perpetrators of wrongdoing deserve to suffer a proportional punishment. Justice is a matter of holding wrongdoers accountable by giving them the negative treatment they deserve.

Against this background, one view is that reconciliation and retributive justice are in tension with one another. Whereas retributive justice focuses on delivering a punishment that fits the past crime, reconciliation is concerned with bringing about future good relations. The conflict between justice and reconciliation is visible when individuals or communities choose non-punitive responses in hopes of securing peace. According to one view, insofar as transitional societies do not punish wrongdoers, they promote reconciliation at a significant moral cost: they sacrifice justice. Authors debate whether this sacrifice may be all-things-considered morally justified, given the exigencies of transitional societies (Mendez 1997, Dwyer 1999, Greenawalt 2000).

Another way of framing the relationship between retributive justice and reconciliation is to see doing justice, conceptualized as punishment, as contributing to reconciliation (Verdeja 2009, C. Murphy 2010). From this perspective, retributive justice and reconciliation are not fundamentally or necessarily in conflict. Justice may even be a precondition for reconciliation in cases where allowing impunity for serious wrongdoing would fuel resentment and undermine trust in institutions. Even if individual wrongdoers are further alienated by punitive measures, holding them accountable may be productive of a broader reconciliation among victims and other members of the community, as well as among future generations.

Instead of conceptualizing the relationship between justice and reconciliation through the processes that promote each value, a different set of views consider instead the core moral concerns constitutive of each value. According to some scholars, reconciliation and justice are compatible, though distinct, moral values, and a variety of processes can respond to the moral concerns each value takes up (Allen 1999, Allais 2012). That is, responses to wrongdoing can be just and conducive to reconciliation in different degrees. Responses to wrongdoing may promote some aspects of justice (such as demands for recognition of victims and accountability for perpetrators), but not others. For example, this view can accommodate the claim, made during the South African TRC, that wrongdoers are held accountable when they are required to undergo the shaming experience of testifying publicly to their crimes (Final Report, 1998, vol. 1, ch. 1, para 35). Similarly, they may foster some dimensions of reconciliation (such as epistemic or attitudinal changes), but not others.

A final view is that reconciliation is (part or all of) justice (Llewellyn and Howse 1999, Philpott 2012). Theorists who adopt this position regard it as a mistake to equate justice with retributive justice. In the view of advocates of restorative justice, justice is fundamentally about repairing damaged relationships. Chairman Rev. Desmond Tutu famously responds to the criticism of the TRC’s decision not to pursue retributive justice by saying, “We believe, however, that there is another kind of justice – a restorative justice which is concerned not so much with punishment as with correcting imbalances, restoring broken relationships – with healing, harmony and reconciliation” (Final Report, Vol. 1, Ch. 1, para. 36). It is difficult to provide a definitive account of restorative justice. However, the emphasis is on achieving a morally appropriate state of relations, where victims’ needs for recognition, security and reparations are given special emphasis (Kiss 2000, Walker 2006). Thus, to promote reconciliation is to promote justice. Insofar as holding wrongdoers accountable through punishment helps restore morally appropriate attitudes, norms and interactions among the victim, the wrongdoer, and the community, punishment is compatible with restorative justice. However, retribution is not valued for its own sake.

5. Conclusion

This entry has explored the various ways that the repair of relationships is conceptualized in the literature, and the processes that are claimed to foster such repair. One lingering question remains: what value is there in the pursuit of relational repair? The section on justice suggests two, not incompatible, answers. The process of repairing relationships is most obviously valuable and important because of the other goods it enables individuals and communities to achieve. In the political context, the cessation of violence, the prevention of future violence, and the attainment of democracy are some values that may be promoted. In more interpersonal contexts, the benefits of relational repair include the avoidance of further harms to one’s interests, including the psychological burden of resentment, or the goods that continued interaction bring, such as material profit through ongoing trade. But in addition to these sorts of instrumental value, one might also argue that reconciliation is valuable for its own sake. Insofar as a relationship is intrinsically valuable or morally appropriate, the repair of a relation that has been ruptured acquires derivative intrinsic value. Insofar as wrongdoing violates and damages the relationship that ought to exist between two morally motivated parties (namely, a relationship of mutual respect and a reasonable degree of trust in the other’s ability and willingness to abide by appropriate norms of behavior), reconciliation sets things to right.


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