Notes to Redistribution

1. Even if a term is understood as purely descriptive, it may still be the case that it usually, or always, goes along with a positive or negative moral assessment. That a term is purely descriptive means only that one can decide whether or not it applies without recourse to evaluative judgments. On the other hand, even if a term does not have an evaluative component, its correct application may not be decisive for moral assessment. For example, that an act constitutes treachery, murder, or cruelty counts as a reason against it, but this reason may not always be decisive.

2. It should be emphasized that a mere shift in patterns of holdings is not typically taken to involve redistribution. No one would say that an epidemic in China simultaneous with good weather in North America caused a redistribution of income between these two places in the 10th century.

3. One might therefore distinguish between policies and changes in social institutions that have redistributive effects — which include the entire class of socially caused pattern changes over time — from redistributive polices — which include only those policies that are adopted (at least in part) for the reason that they will bring about such changes.

4. As noted above, one important element in redistribution as taking is that it always involves rigidly identifiable persons or groups.

5. Though this is not the case with all income tax, even the present scheme in the U.S. conforms to this picture in most respects. Having in one’s physical possession one’s gross income is of course consistent with not having a legal or moral claim to it.

6. These statistics are corrected for inflation and include state-provided welfare benefits for the poorest fifth. See Modigliani and Solow [1989] For more on redistribution as change in the patterns of holdings in the 1980s see Hale [1989].

7. Whether the government acted unjustly in granting possession to the Matuas rather than some other family (or no one) would of course depend on a distinct set of considerations, such as whether they had an antecedent claim to the property or if the process by which they were chosen to receive it was fair.

8. See Pogge, [1989] p.72 for further discussion of this point.

9. For one thing, the counterfactual itself admits of multiple interpretations. Are we to imagine the income distribution that would have obtained had there never been an income tax, the distribution that would have obtained had existing income taxes been repealed at some specified point in time, or some other situation?

10. As mentioned above, the fact that there is no non-arbitrary way of identifying contribution to production is the deepest problem associated with the use of this baseline. I am assuming away this problem for the purposes of discussion.

11. In the jargon of economics, Pigouvian taxes are levied to correct the effects of negative externalities.

12. This should not be taken to suggest that there is some closed list of obligations that directly correspond to the right. For discussion, see Raz [1986], esp. pp. 168-71

13. “It is far less plausible to maintain that taking some of an innocent man’s property is an impermissible means for the prevention of a serious evil, than it is to maintain that killing him is impermissible. These rights vary in importance and some are not absolute even in the state of nature.” Scanlon [1982]

14. In other words, the ‘object’ of their income rights is net and not gross income.

15. This is not to say that the right-holder has no claims regarding her gross income. She has, for example, the right that her employers not take the difference between her net and gross income and hold onto it. It might be tempting to say that the employee has not rights that are violated in this case, but rather the state does. But this doesn’t seem right. The only right the state has is to the payment of the tax on the appointed day. Should the employee have voluntarily offered the difference to her employer, no rights would be violated. I think we should rather look at employee rights to gross income as being understood in the same way as joint ownership of a timesharing condominium. The part owner has certain claims regarding the property that endure year-round (no one can paint it without his consent), and some that he has only at certain times (exclusionary use of the condominium for two weeks).

16. See, however, the discussion of this claim in section 2.2.2 of this article.

17. G.A. Cohen has offered the following explanation of the ‘naturalness’ of this presupposition: “There is a tendency to take as part of the structure of human existence in general any structure around which, merely as things are, much of our activity is organized. In capitalist society, the institution of private property is such a structure. It is treated as so given, that the obstacles it puts to freedom are not perceived, while any impingement on it is readily noticed.” See Cohen [1982], p. 14.

Copyright © 2018 by
Christian Barry <>

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