Reid on Memory and Personal Identity
Thomas Reid held a direct realist theory of memory. Like his direct realism about perception, Reid developed his account as an alternative to the model of the mind that he called ‘the theory of ideas.’ On such a theory, mental operations such as perception and memory have mental states—ideas or impressions—as their direct objects. These mental states are understood as representations that encode information about their causes. The mind is directed towards and reads off from these representations, information about extra-mental items. By contrast, Reid holds that the direct objects of memory and perception are extra-mental. In the case of perception, the mind is directed to present material objects and properties; in the case of memory, the mind is directed towards past events to which the person was agent or witness. In other words, according to Reid, when we remember, we do not recall previous experiences. In memory, the mind is directed neither towards an idea experienced previously nor towards an idea of a previous experience. Rather, we recall events, experienced previously.
Reid is interested in the notion of memory not only for its own sake but also because of its conceptual connection to the notion of personal identity. Reid criticizes Locke’s theory of personal identity for inferring a metaphysical hypothesis now called the Memory Theory from the conceptual connection between memory and personal identity. On this theory, personal identity consists in memory; sameness of memory is metaphysically necessary and sufficient for sameness of persons. According to Reid, memory is neither necessary nor sufficient for personal identity, metaphysically speaking. Indeed, Reid holds that it is impossible to account for personal identity in any terms other than itself. Personal identity is simple and unanalyzable. Though memory is not the metaphysical ground of personal identity, according to Reid, it provides first-personal evidence of personal identity. I know that I was present at my graduation because I remember being there. Memories do not make one the same person over time. Rather, memories allow one to know one’s own past, immediately and directly.
- 1. Criticizing the Storehouse Model of Memory
- 2. A Direct Realist Theory of Memory
- 3. Objecting to Locke on Personal Identity
- 4. Personal Identity as Simple and Unanalyzable
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Reid traces the target of his criticisms back to the Ancients, whom he depicts as holding that the mind is a sensorium—a repository of past ideas and impressions (Essays, 280). On this theory, perception, memory and imagination are causal processes beginning with purely physiological events: impressions on the brain. These physiological states are taken to have mental correlates—sensations or ideas of sense or sense impressions—which are the objects of perception, memory and imagination. These ideas or impressions are representations in the sense that they preserve, or re-present information from their physiological correlates. According to Reid, this view recognizes no distinction between imagination and memory. Each consists in having a picture-like impression that remains after the object that impressed upon the senses is gone. The only difference between the two is in the fidelity of the imagistic impression to its cause. Memory consists in the preservation of images imprinted in the mind from previous experiences, while imagination consists in constructing images that lack a duplicate in experience.
Reid offers two criticisms of the ancient theory, as he understands it. First, the theory falls afoul of one of Reid’s own methodological strictures, namely, that a theory must adhere to Newton’s regulae philosophandi, or rules of philosophizing (Inquiry, 12). The first rule is to posit no merely theoretical causes and in Reid’s view the second rule forbids positing causes insufficient to explain the phenomenon in question. According to Reid, there is no observational evidence of the existence of impressions on the brain—they are merely theoretical entities (Essays, 281). Furthermore, even if we granted the otherwise theoretical existence of impressions, such entities would not be sufficient to explain memory. We might establish a correlation between impressions and memories, but it would remain at best just that: a correlation, not a causal explanation. Having learned Hume’s lessons about causation, Reid denies any necessary connections between impressions and memories sufficient to regard the former as a cause of the latter. Reid also considers whether resemblance could ground such a causal explanation, but, having learned Berkeley’s lessons about resemblance, he denies that any mental states can resemble material states such as impressions on the brain. Reid’s second criticism is that even if we were to grant that impressions remain after the objects that impressed upon the senses are gone, this would entail that we should continue to perceive objects rather than remember them, since on the ancient theory, impressions are the immediate causes and objects of perception (Essays, 282).
Though Reid identifies his target as having ancient origins, his primary concern is with what he regards as its modern equivalent. This modern theory was introduced by Locke and, according to Reid, extended to its inevitable idealist and skeptical conclusions by Berkeley and Hume. Reid excerpts passages from Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding to illustrate the misleading metaphors Locke inherits from the ancient theory—metaphors of the mind as a storehouse and of ideas and impressions as pictures.
The other way of Retention is the Power to revive again in our Minds those Ideas, which after imprinting have disappeared, or have been as it were laid aside out of sight…This is Memory, which is as it were the Store-house of our Ideas…But our Ideas being nothing but actual Perceptions in the Mind, which cease to be any thing, when there is no perception of them, this laying up of our Ideas in the Repository of the Memory, signifies no more but this, that the Mind has a Power, in many cases, to revive Perceptions, which it once had, with this additional Perception annexed to them, that it has had them before. And in this Sense it is, that our Ideas are said to be in our Memories, when indeed, they are actually no where, but only there is an ability in the Mind, when it will, to revive them again; and as it were paint them anew on it self, though some with more, some with less difficulty; some more lively, and others more obscurely (Locke, Essay, Book II.x.1–2).
As this passage illustrates, Locke himself acknowledges that the notion that the mind is a kind of repository or storehouse is metaphorical. According to Locke’s own theory, ideas and impressions cannot be stored. Locke is committed to the thesis that ideas are momentary and non-continuous and to the thesis that identity over time requires continuous existence. These two theses jointly entail that numerically identical ideas cannot be stored over time. Nevertheless, Reid criticizes Locke for being unable to extricate himself from metaphor when Locke claims that in memory, “the mind, as it were, paints ideas anew on it self.” On what model does the mind paint the idea anew? In order to use a previous idea as its model, the mind must remember it. But then the ability to paint ideas anew upon itself presupposes rather than explains memory.
Locke offers a non-metaphorical account of memory when he claims that memory consists of two perceptions: a present perception and a belief about that present perception, namely that one has enjoyed the perception before. Because Locke is committed to the thesis that numerically identical ideas cannot be stored over time, the belief must be the belief that one has previously enjoyed a perception qualitatively similar to the present perception, rather than numerically identical with it. Reid criticizes this account as circular, once more. A first-personal belief that one’s present perception is qualitatively similar to a perception one had in the past requires remembering having had that previous perception and recalling its quality and character. As before, Locke’s account presupposes rather than explains the phenomenon of memory (Essays, 285).
Reid criticizes Hume’s account of memory for duplicating Locke’s mistakes. He quotes from Hume’s Treatise of Human Nature:
We find by experience, that when any impression has been present with the mind, it again makes its appearance there as an idea; and this it may do after two different ways: Either when in its new appearance it retains a considerable degree of its first vivacity, and is somewhat intermediate betwixt an impression and an idea; or when it entirely loses that vivacity, and is a perfect idea. The faculty by which we repeat our impressions in the first manner, is call’d the MEMORY, and the other the IMAGINATION (Hume, Treatise, 220.127.116.11).
Like Locke, Hume holds that ideas have no continued existence. And so, Reid argues, Hume cannot claim that a numerically identical idea can reappear. In addition, Hume’s account faces the same circularity objection as Locke’s. Hume accounts for memory by appealing to an idea that is qualitatively similar to, but less forceful and vivacious than a previous idea. But the ability to judge qualitative similarity and degrees of force and vivacity between present ideas and past impressions presupposes memory.
Reid provides additional criticisms of Hume’s account of memory. First, Reid interprets Hume’s account of memory as committing him to the position that we have the power to repeat ideas (though notice that Hume does not commit to this in the quoted passage). Reid argues that this position is inconsistent with Hume’s claim that impressions are the efficient causes of ideas. Reid’s second criticism is more insightful; he argues that differences in degrees of force and vivacity are insufficient to sustain the distinctions between perception, memory and imagination. Reid interprets Hume as holding that these three faculties do not differ in kind, but rather in the degree of force and vivacity of the ideas that are their objects. Ideas with the greatest degree of force and vivacity are perceptions, those with a lesser degree are memories, and those with the least degree of force and vivacity are imaginings. Reid criticizes this taxonomy on phenomenological grounds. Some perceptions are less forceful and lively than some memories, as when lost in reminiscence, and some memories are less forceful and lively than imaginings, as when lost in reverie. Furthermore, increasing the degree of force and vivacity does not transform a memory or an imagining into a perception. Reid compares striking one’s head against the wall to lightly touching it to the wall. The latter has much less force and vivacity than the former, yet lightly touching one’s head to the wall is neither a memory nor an imagining (Essays, 289).
Reid grants that perceptions, memories and imaginings often differ in degree of force and vivacity, but, he argues, this difference is insufficient to account for the special quality of presentness represented in perceptions, the special quality of pastness represented in memories, and the special quality of atemporality represented in imaginings (Inquiry, 197). While memories may be faint, or weak, these features are not necessary to these states being memories, and so cannot be used to individuate them. In addition, a present idea—whatever its degree of force and vivacity—cannot ground judgments about events in the past because present ideas represent events as present.
For according to that theory, the immediate object of memory, as well as every other operation of the understanding, is an idea present to the mind. And, from the present existence of this idea of memory I am led to infer, by reasoning, that six months ago or six years ago, there did exist an object similar to this one…But what is there in the idea that can lead me to this conclusion? What mark does it bear of the date of its archetype? (Essays, 476)
Present ideas contain no information, qualitatively or representationally, that could serve as the basis of judgments about past events. As a result, no reflection on present ideas and their quality or character is sufficient for a representation of events in the past, as past.
Contemporary philosophers and cognitive scientists recognize that memory is a diverse phenomenon and they draw some useful distinctions among varieties of memory. For example, Endel Tulving distinguishes between episodic memory, semantic memory and procedural memory. Remembering how to ride a bike is an example of procedural memory. Remembering that Napoleon was defeated at Waterloo is an example of a semantic memory. Remembering one’s tenth birthday party is an example of an episodic memory.
The distinction most relevant to the issues Reid, Locke and Hume raise for memory and personal identity is between semantic and episodic memory. Henri Bergson and Bertrand Russell developed a similar distinction, and Russell’s distinction between factual and personal memory accords with that between semantic and episodic memory. Semantic memories are properly reported using a factive complement—a that-clause—after the verbs ‘remember’ or ‘recall’, as in ‘Jane remembers that Napoleon was defeated at Waterloo’. In particular, a semantic memory cannot be reported using the form ‘S remembers/recalls [x] f-ing’, as in ‘Jane recalls her tenth birthday party,’ or ‘John remembers falling off his bike.’ Only episodic memories may be properly reported using this form. No one today can properly report ‘I remember Napoleon being defeated at Waterloo,’ though many may properly report ‘I remember that Napoleon was defeated at Waterloo.’ On the other hand, an episodic memory can be reported using the same form by which semantic memories are reported because episodic memories may ground semantic memories under certain circumstances. It is legitimate to state both ‘I recall my tenth birthday party,’ in reporting an episodic memory of that event and to state ‘I remember that I had a tenth birthday party’, in reporting a semantic memory, whose justification would appeal to the previous episodic memory.
Episodic memories are further distinguished from semantic memories by the Previous Awareness Condition on episodic memory. The Previous Awareness Condition has been developed and examined by Sydney Shoemaker (1970), among others. Put simply, one has an episodic memory of an event only if one was agent or witness to the event remembered. The Previous Awareness Condition is a necessary but insufficient condition on episodic memory. If one has an experience as of being lost in a store as a child, but one was not in fact lost in a store as a child, such an experience is not an episodic memory. On the other hand, each of us has been agent or witness to many events of which we have no episodic memory. For example, one may not remember one’s third birthday party and so lack an episodic memory of an event to which one was surely witness.
Reid is most interested in episodic memory. Though Reid does not use the contemporary terminology, his theory draws upon both the distinction between episodic and semantic memory and the Previous Awareness Condition on episodic memory. As he puts the matter:
Things remembered must be things formerly perceived or known. I remember the transit of Venus over the sun in the year 1769. I must therefore have perceived it at the time it happened, otherwise I could not now remember it. Our first acquaintance with any object of thought cannot be by remembrance. Memory can only produce a continuance or renewal of a former acquaintance with the things remembered (Essays, 255).
Though Reid uses the term ‘acquaintance,’ the things retained through memory are things previously perceived or experienced. The term ‘acquaintance’ has acquired a technical sense that it did not have in Reid’s day, so it is better to see Reid as holding that memory preserves contact with events previously apprehended through perception and thereby known by acquaintance. Acquaintance presupposes apprehension, and prior episodes of apprehension are necessary for retained acquaintance.
According to Reid, episodic memory is not a current apprehension of a past event, nor is it a current apprehension of a past experience. These theoretical options were ruled out by Reid’s criticism of Locke and Hume. Rather, according to Reid, memory is an act that preserves a past apprehension. Reid characterizes memory as exhibiting what we now call the Previous Awareness Condition. He holds that reports of episodic memory are true only if the person reporting satisfies the condition, and that experiences that otherwise appear to be episodic memories, but which fail the condition, are not episodic memories (Essays, 264).
Reid does not count what we term ‘semantic memories’ as memories in the proper sense. He discounts them not because they fail to meet the Previous Awareness Condition, but because he holds that semantic memories are better classified as beliefs or knowledge rather than memories. For example, he would hold that a person today who reports remembering that Napoleon was defeated at Waterloo expresses a belief or knowledge rather than a memory. He holds this because he requires a distinction between two sorts of beliefs that would otherwise be obscured by the fact that each sort can be expressed in the form of a semantic memory report. The distinction is between beliefs that play a role in preserving past apprehension (and which are constituents of episodic memory), and those that do not play a role in preserving past apprehension (and which are not, strictly speaking, memories). For example, Jane believes that she dined with a friend last night. Jane has an episodic memory of this event, and according to Reid, her belief ‘that I dined with a friend last night,’ plays a role in preserving Jane’s past apprehension of dining with her friend. On the other hand, Jane’s belief that she had a third birthday party does not play a role in preserving her past apprehension of her third birthday party; she has no episodic memory of her third birthday party. The difference between these two sorts of belief is obscured by the fact that each may be expressed by using the factive compliment: ‘Jane remembers that she dined with a friend last night,’ and ‘Jane remembers that she had a third birthday party.’
According to Reid, a memory consists in a conception of a past event and a belief about that past event, that it happened to the person who is represented in that memory as agent or witness (Essays, 228, 232, 254, 257). This conception-belief structure mirrors Reid’s accounts of perception and consciousness, each of which also consist in a conception and belief. Folescu (2018a) examines whether memorial conception differs from or is the same as the kind of conception ingredient in perception, consciousness, and other intentional mental states. The belief that is a constituent of memory, on Reid’s view, is a belief of some past event, that it happened. In particular, it is a belief that it happened to me, where the pronoun is indexed to the person who is represented in the memory as agent or witness to the event (Essays, 255, 262). The belief is about or of the event because the other constituent of memory—the conception—supplies the event, which is the object of the belief. On Reid’s view, the objects of memory are the events presented in past apprehensions. Memory preserves past apprehensions by relating us to the events originally presented in perception—memory preserves past apprehension through conception and belief. In particular, the objects of memory are not the past apprehensions themselves but that which is presented in the past apprehensions, namely, the original event (Inquiry, 28). Folescu (2018b) examines a tension in Reid’s accounts of memory and perception. According to Reid, we remember events that were apprehended in the past by perception. But Reid insists that perception is confined to the present. Because perception is confined to the present, we cannot perceive events, which have a duration. How, then, can we remember what we cannot have perceived?
Reid holds that memory is not a current apprehension of an event already presented in a past apprehension. In other words, we do not remember events by re-apprehending them. Rather, the past apprehension is itself preserved by the act of remembering the event apprehended. Memory is an act of preservation through conception and belief. Such preservation does not itself constitute an additional apprehension over and above the apprehension preserved. Indeed, according to Reid, it is impossible to currently apprehend any events in the past; apprehension is confined to perceiving present objects or being conscious of present mental operations (Essays, 23, 253). Reid does not deny that memory is itself a current mental state, nor does he deny that memory presupposes a past apprehension. He denies only that memory is a current apprehension, and that the object of a memory is a past apprehension (Essays, 253). Memory preserves past apprehension by conceiving of an event previously apprehended and believing, of this event, that it happened to me.
Reid holds that memory, like perception, is immediate. Neither the conception nor the belief that are the ingredients of memory are formed on the basis of reasoning or testimony. Memory is an original faculty of our constitution governed by what Reid calls “the first principles of contingent truths.” In the case of memory, the governing principle is that “those things did really happen which I distinctly remember” (Essays, 474). On Reid’s view, a normally functioning human does not and need not infer to a past event in episodic memory. In order to infer to a past event, one must have some prior, non-inferential relation to the event if it is to be a memory rather than a belief or knowledge. But then this prior, non-inferential relation would be an episodic memory. In addition, if episodic memory involved an inference to the effect that the event happened to me, the inference would be otiose because, as Reid claims, such a belief is already an immediate, non-inferential component of episodic memory. In principle, one could infer from the conception and belief that are ingredients in memory to a further belief that the event happened. But if such a belief plays a role in preserving past apprehension then it is superfluous—such a belief, subject to the Previous Awareness Condition, is already embedded in episodic memory. If the belief does not play a role in preserving past apprehension then it is a semantic memory, which, according to Reid, is among the species of belief or knowledge rather memory.
The distinction between beliefs that are ingredients in episodic memories and beliefs that are based on, but not ingredients in, episodic memories allows Reid to account for cases in which a memorial experience continues to represent an event as having happened, even when the person who seems to remember the event has what she regards as an overriding reason to believe that the event did not occur. The belief that is an ingredient in the experience represents the event as having happened to the person who seems to remember it. Further, the belief will continue to represent the event as having happened to the person, even under conditions in which she forms a separate belief, not embedded in the memorial experience, to the effect that it did not happen to her.
The distinction also allows Reid to satisfy a constraint on any adequate theory of memory; namely, that it explain why memory represents events as having the special quality of being in the past. If belief were not an ingredient in episodic memory, then though we might believe that the events we remember are in the past, memory could not represent events as past. If belief were not an ingredient in memory, then memory alone would relate us to an event previously apprehended. But the apprehension preserved is an apprehension of an event that was, at that time, represented in that apprehension as present. The pastness of the event apprehended is not part of the content of the past apprehension. But because a belief that the event happened to me is embedded in the memory itself, memory represents not merely past events, but past events as having occurred. In other words, the belief that is partly constitutive of episodic memory is tensed.
One might wonder whether Reid’s account of memory is subject to the same criticisms he levels against Locke and Hume. Does Reid appeal to the storehouse metaphor when he claims that memory is preserved past apprehension? Reid criticizes Locke and Hume for begging the question. Yet by holding that memory is in part constituted by a belief, does Reid not also assume the very phenomenon to be explained? Reid can avoid the criticisms to which the theory of ideas is vulnerable by insisting that memory is not a current apprehension, but rather a preserved past apprehension. His theory of memory is a direct realist theory because, according to Reid, memory is not directed towards any present perceptions, ideas, or impressions—stored or otherwise. Neither is memory directed towards any past perceptions, ideas, or impressions—stored or otherwise. Memory is directed towards the events presented in past apprehensions. Because apprehensions, perceptions, ideas, and impressions are never the objects of memory, they do not need to be stored for use by memory. Likewise, the belief that is an ingredient in memory is not about any present or past apprehensions. If it were, Reid’s theory would be subject to the same circularity objection he presses against Locke and Hume.
On Reid’s theory of memory, an apprehension establishes a direct relation to an event, which relation is preserved in memory by the acts of conceiving the event and believing of the event conceived that it happened to the person who remembers. It is a direct realist theory of memory because it departs from the model on which memory is a current apprehension of a past event or a current apprehension of a past apprehension. On the direct realist view, memory preserves past apprehension of an event through conception and belief. Reid’s theory captures how memory, like perception, represents the world, rather than our experiences of the world.
Reid, Locke and others are interested in the notion of episodic memory not only for its own sake, but also because of its conceptual connection to the notion of personal identity. If Joe remembers, episodically, winning the World Series, then Joe must have existed at the time of his winning the World Series. This is why the Previous Awareness Condition characterizes episodic but not semantic memory. Unlike Joe’s memory that Napoleon was defeated at Waterloo, his memory of winning the World Series logically entails Joe’s existence at the time of the event remembered. In other words, episodic memory is logically sufficient for personal identity: if S remembers at time tn (episodically) an event at time t1, then S existed at time t1. In addition, memory reports are often taken to be prima facie evidence for statements about the past history of the person reporting.
Reid’s main criticism of Locke’s theory of personal identity is that Locke moves from these truisms concerning the conceptual and evidential relations among the notions of memory and personal identity to a hypothesis concerning the metaphysical relations among them (Essays, 277). In this, Reid follows Butler’s influential dissertation “Of Personal Identity,” appended to The Analogy of Religion in 1736.
Reid interprets Locke as holding what is now called the Memory Theory of personal identity (Essays, 277). On this theory, personal identity consists in memory; sameness of episodic memory is metaphysically necessary and sufficient for sameness of persons. In other words, on the Memory Theory, what makes a person identical with herself over time is her remembering or being able to remember the events to which she was witness or agent. If she cannot episodically remember an event, then she is not identical with any of the persons who was witness or agent to the event. In such a case, she would bear the same relation to that event as any other person for whom a memory of the event could rise at best to the level of a semantic memory. If she can episodically remember an event, then her recollection or ability to recall that event makes her identical with the person represented in that memory as agent or witness to the event.
But there is a secondary, more subtle line of disagreement between Reid and Locke. Much of Locke’s chapter Identity and Diversity is dedicated to establishing that the self is not a substance, material or immaterial. By contrast, Reid holds that the self is a simple, unanalyzable immaterial substance with active powers. Reid argues that Locke cannot sustain both the thesis that the self is not a substance and the thesis that self remains identical over time. While Reid’s criticisms of the Memory Theory are more well known, his criticism of Locke’s insistence that the self is not a substance reveals two very different accounts of the metaphysics of identity. While Locke argues that the identity conditions for different kinds of things differ, so that the conditions under which a mass of matter, and an animal, and a person are not the same, Reid holds that identity is confined solely to substances that have a continued, uninterrupted existence and which do not have parts. In other words, according to Reid, strictly speaking the only real identity is personal identity (Essays, 266–267). “The identity…we ascribe to bodies, whether natural or artificial, is not perfect identity; it is rather something which, for the conveniency of speech, we call identity” (Essays, 266).
Reid begins his interpretation and criticism of Locke’s theory by noting that Locke defines the term ‘person’ as meaning “a thinking intelligent Being, that has reason and reflection…” (Locke Essay, Book II.xxvii.9). Reid is friendly to this characterization of the self. But, Reid notes, Locke appears to equivocate between the notion of a person as a ‘thinking Being,’ and the notion of a person as that which is preserved through consciousness and memory. Reid paraphrases a passage from Locke’s Essay Concerning Human Understanding:
Mr LOCKE tells us however, “that personal identity, that is, the sameness of a rational being, consists in consciousness alone, as, as far as this consciousness can be extended backwards to any past action or thought, so far reaches the identity of that person. So that whatever hath the consciousness of present and past actions, is the same person to whom they belong” (Essays 275–276).
The passage in Locke differs from Reid’s paraphrase:
…personal Identity, i.e. the sameness of a rational Being: And as far as this consciousness can be extended backwards to any past Action or Thought, so far reaches the Identity of that Person; it is the same self now it was then; and ‘tis by the same self with this present one that now reflects on it, that that Action was done (Locke, Essay, Book II.xxvii.9).
Reid’s first criticism rests on his interpreting Locke’s definition as committing him to the position that a person is a subject of thought, which Reid regards as implying that a person is a thinking substance. At the same time, Locke appears to be committed to an analysis of personal identity in terms of memory, or, as Locke would put it, consciousness of the past. Reid notes that Locke is aware of some of the consequences of the Memory Theory: if sameness of consciousness or memory is necessary and sufficient for sameness of person, then it is possible for there to be sameness of person without sameness of thinking Being. In other words, it is logically and metaphysically possible for a person to be “transferred from one intelligent being to another,” or for “two or twenty intelligent beings to be the same person” (Essays, 276). Locke’s response to these worries, as well as worries about periods of interrupted consciousness, as in sleep, highlights Reid’s criticism: “…[I]n all these cases…doubts are raised whether we are the same thinking thing; i.e. the same substance or no. Which however reasonable, or unreasonable, concerns not personal Identity at all. The Question being what makes the same Person, and not whether it be the same Identical Substance…” (Locke, Essay, Book II.xxvii.10). Reid’s criticism is not that cases of transfer or fission are incoherent, though he thinks they are. Rather, his criticism is that the possibility of sameness of person without sameness of thinking Being that the Memory Theory allows is inconsistent with Locke’s characterization of a person as a ‘thinking Being’. Given that Reid thinks that this initial characterization is correct, he regards this as a reductio of the Memory Theory.
Reid’s second criticism is his most famous and is often referred to as the case of the Brave Officer:
Suppose a brave officer to have been flogged when a boy at school, for robbing an orchard, to have taken a standard from the enemy in his first campaign, and to have been made a general in advanced life: Suppose also, which must be admitted to be possible, that when he took the standard, he was conscious of his having been flogged at school, and that when made a general he was conscious of his taking the standard, but had absolutely lost the consciousness of his flogging.
These things being supposed, it follows, from Mr LOCKE’s doctrine, that he who was flogged at school is the same person who took the standard, and that he who took the standard is the same person who was made a general. When it follows, if there be any truth in logic, that the general is the same person with him who was flogged at school. But the general’s consciousness does not reach so far back as his flogging, therefore, according to Mr LOCKE’s doctrine, he is not the person who was flogged. Therefore the general is, and at the same time is not the same person as him who was flogged at school (Essays, 276).
According to the Memory Theory, personal identity consists in memory; that is, sameness of memory is metaphysically necessary and sufficient for sameness of person. On this account, given that sameness of memory is sufficient for sameness of person, if a person at time tn remembers (episodically) an event that occurred at time t1 then the person at time tn is identical with the person who was witness or agent to the event at time t1. If the brave officer who has just taken the flag of the enemy remembers being beaten at school, then the brave officer is identical with the boy who was beaten. So too, if the general remembers taking the enemy’s flag, then the general is identical with the brave officer. If the general is identical with the brave officer, and the brave officer is identical with the boy, then by the transitivity of identity, the general is identical with the boy.
However, on this account, given that sameness of memory is a necessary condition for sameness of person, if a person at time tn does not remember (episodically) an event that occurred at time t1, then the person at time tn cannot be identical with any person who was witness or agent to the event at time t1. If the general cannot remember being beaten at school, he cannot be identical with the boy who was beaten. Thus, the Memory Theory is committed to mutually incompatible theses: that the General is identical with the boy and that he is not.
Reid’s third criticism is terminological: he argues that Locke confounds consciousness with memory—elsewhere Reid also argues that Locke confounds consciousness with reflection (Essays, 58). Consciousness and memory are distinct phenomena, according to Reid. The former is directed towards present mental acts and operations, while the latter is directed towards past events to which one was agent or witness. If consciousness could extend to past events, then memory would be redundant (Essays, 277).
According to Reid, memory is neither necessary nor sufficient for personal identity, metaphysically speaking, despite the conceptual and evidential relations memory bears to personal identity. It is not a necessary condition because each us has been agent or witness to many events that we do not now remember. “I may have other good evidence of things which befell me, and which I do not remember: I know who bare me, and suckled me, but I do not remember these events” (Essays, 264). It is not a sufficient condition, for, as Butler showed, while having an episodic memory of an event entails that one existed at the time of the event remembered, it is not the recollection or the ability to recall that makes one identical with the person who was witness or agent to the event. “It may here be observed…that it is not my remembering any action of mine that makes be to be the person who did it. This remembrance makes me know assuredly that I did it; but I might have done it, though I did not remember it” (Essays, 265). Reid’s fourth criticism is that while memory is tied to personal identity conceptually and evidentially, such ties do not entail a metaphysical connection that would license analyzing the latter in terms of the former (Essays, 277).
Reid’s final criticism is that the Memory Theory is committed to the absurdity that identity consists in something that has no continued existence (Essays, 278). Reid and Locke agree that memory, consciousness, thought, and other mental operations have no continued existence. They are fleeting and non-continuous. But they also agree that identity, and in particular personal identity, requires a continued existence over time. As Locke puts it, “one thing cannot have two beginnings of Existence, nor two things one beginning” (Locke, Essay, Book II.xxvii.1). But these commitments are jointly inconsistent with the thesis that personal identity consists in memory.
A theory of personal identity is intended to account for how a person remains identical over time. When analyzed in terms of items that are fleeting and non-continuous—ideas, memories, thoughts—identity is reduced to diversity; that is, it is eliminated. By contrast, if one locates personal identity in that which thinks and remembers, and which has a continued, uninterrupted existence, one purchases personal identity at the cost of admitting that the self is a substance. Reid captures Locke on the horns of a dilemma: either the self is a substance, in which case it remains identical over time, or the self is not a substance, in which case there is no personal identity. Reid holds that this dilemma applies with equal force against any reductionist account of personal identity that employs the theory of ideas, for example Hume’s bundle theory of the self (Essays, 473–474).
Those familiar with the contemporary literature on personal identity, with its emphasis on the necessary and sufficient conditions under which a person remains identical over time, may wonder: if Reid holds that memory is not the criterion of identity, and if Reid’s substance dualism rules out bodily identity as a criterion of personal identity, in what does personal identity consist? Reid’s answer is that identity cannot be accounted for in any terms other than itself. This is neither quietism nor epistemic humility on Reid’s part. Rather, Reid argues that the nature of personal identity—its simplicity and indivisibility—rules out any reductive account that appeals to notions other than identity in explaining how a person persists over time.
Reid holds that numerical identity is, strictly speaking, indefinable, but it can be contrasted with other relations, such as diversity, similarity and dissimilarity (Essays, 263). It requires a continued existence over time—a duration—and requires that there be no two beginnings of existence. Because mental states are fleeting and non-continuous they cannot remain identical over time. A mental state may be indistinguishable from a previous mental state, but because mental states do not have a continued existence, no mental state at one time can be numerically identical with another at a different time. As a result, persons cannot be identified with their thoughts, actions or feelings (Essays, 264). However, according to Reid, thoughts, actions, feelings and all other mental operations are had or performed by a subject that has a continued existence and that bears the same relation to all them. The subject is an immaterial substance that thinks, acts and feels. According to Reid, this substantial self has no parts—it is indivisible—which contributes to its resistance to reductive explanation. Reid appeals to Leibniz’s notion of a monad to describe the indivisibility of this immaterial, substantial self (Essays, 264).
Though memory is not the metaphysical ground of personal identity, it provides first-personal evidence of it. Reid notes that the evidence we use to make judgments about our own pasts is different from the evidence we use to make judgments about other people and their pasts (Essays 266). Memory justifies first-personal reports about one’s own witnessed past, while judgments of qualitative similarity justify third-personal statements about the identities of other persons. I know that I was present at my wedding because I remember being there. I know that the man I live with was at my wedding because he looks like the man I married.
First-personal, memorial reports about one’s own past are either true or false: if the memorial experience is a genuine episodic memory, then it is impossible for it to testify falsely concerning one’s presence at the event remembered. This aspect of episodic memory reports is often expressed by saying that they are immune to error through misidentification. If the memorial experience testifies falsely concerning one’s presence at the event remembered, then it cannot be an episodic memory. For example, if I have an experience as of having been lost in a shopping mall as a child, but I was never lost, I cannot be said to remember having been lost, strictly speaking. The upshot is that first-personal memorial reports, if they are episodic memory reports, provide certainty concerning one’s presence at the event remembered. Because third-personal judgments about the pasts of other persons are based on judgments of qualitative similarity rather than episodic memory, they are never certain; they are only ever more or less well justified (Essays 264–265).
It is important to notice that while Reid uses the term ‘evidence,’ when describing the role that memory plays in first-personal knowledge of one’s own past, memory is not used by persons to justify judgments or beliefs about their own pasts. In other words, people do not remember events and then conclude from having remembered them, that it was they who were witness to the events. Rather, memory itself represents one’s presence at the event remembered. According to Reid, a memory consists in a conception of an event and a belief, about the event conceived, that it happened to me, where the pronoun is indexed to the person who is represented in the memory as agent or witness. In other words, memory consists in part in a judgment that represents one’s presence at the event. Any further judgment, justified by memory, to the effect that I was the person who was there would be superfluous—memory already testifies to my having been there. This is why Reid calls the evidence of memory immediate: first-personal statements about one’s own past are memory statements, not statements made on the basis of memory.
Reid’s picture is one on which each of us is immediately and justifiably aware of our own past because each of us remembers having been there. This is the moral of the story concerning the logical relationship between the concept of memory and the concept of personal identity. Memories do not make me the same person as the person represented in my memories. Rather, memories allow me to know my own past, immediately and directly.
- Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man, Brookes, Derek R. (ed.), University Park, Pennsylvania: Pennsylvania State University Press, 2002.
- An Inquiry into the Human Mind on the Principles of Common Sense, Brookes, Derek R. (ed.), University Park, Pennsylvania: Pennsylvania State University Press, 1997.
- Bergson, H., 1911, Matter and Memory, London: Allen and Unwin.
- Butler, J., 1736, The Analogy of Religion, Natural and Revealed, to the Constitution and Course of Nature, London: J. and P. Knapton, 2nd corrected edition.
- Copenhaver, R., 2006, “Thomas Reid’s Theory of Memory”, History of Philosophy Quarterly, 23(2): 171–187.
- –––, 2017, “John Locke and Thomas Reid,” in The Routledge Handbook of Philosophy of Memory, S. Bernecker and K. Michaelian (eds.), London: Routledge.
- Folescu, M., 2018a, “Reid’s View of Memorial Conception”, Journal of Scottish Philosophy, 16(3): 211–226.
- –––, 2018b, “Remembering Events: A Reidean Account of (Episodic) Memory”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 97(2): 304–321.
- Hamilton, A., 2003, “‘Scottish Common Sense’ about Memory: A Defense of Thomas Reid’s Direct Knowledge Account,” Australasian Journal of Philosophy, 81: 229–245.
- Lesser, H., 1978, “Reid’s Criticism of Hume’s Theory of Personal Identity,” Hume Studies, 4: 41–63.
- Loptson, P., 2004, “Locke, Reid, and Personal Identity,” Philosophical Forum, 35(1): 51–63.
- Locke, J., 1690, Essay Concerning Human Understanding, P.H. Nidditch (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1975.
- Malcolm, N., 1977, Memory and Mind, Ithaca, N.Y.: Cornell University Press.
- Martin, M.G.F., 2001, “Out of the Past: Episodic Recall as Retained Acquaintance,” in Time and Memory, C. Hoerl and T. McCormack (eds.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Parfit, D., 1985, Reasons and Persons, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
- Robinson, D., 1978, “Personal Identity: Reid’s Answer to Hume,” The Monist, 61: 326–339.
- Russell, B., 1921, The Analysis of Mind, London: Allen and Unwin.
- Shoemaker, S., 1997, “Self and Substance,” Philosophical Perspectives, 11: 283–304.
- –––, 1970, “Persons and their Pasts,” American Philosophical Quarterly, 7(4): 269–285; reprinted in Shoemaker (1984), Identity, Cause and Mind, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 19–48.
- –––, 1959, “Personal Identity and Memory,” The Journal of Philosophy, 56, 868–902.
- Stewart, M.A., 2004, “Reid and Personal Identity: A Study in Sources,” in Thomas Reid: Context, Influence and Significance, J. Houston (ed.), Edinburgh: Dunedin Academic Press, pp. 9–28.
- Tulving, E., 1983, Elements of Episodic Memory, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
- Van Woudenberg, R., 2004, “Reid on Memory and the Identity of Persons,” in The Cambridge Companion to Thomas Reid, T. Cuneo and R. Van Woudenberg (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 204 –221.
- –––, 1999, “Thomas Reid on Memory,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 37: 117–133.
- Ward, A., 2000, “Reid on Personal Identity: Some Comparisons with Locke and Kant,” Reid Studies, 3: 55–64.
- Yaffe, G., 2010, “Beyond the Brave Officer: Reid on the Unity of Mind, the Moral Sense, and Locke’s Theory of Personal Identity,” in Reid on Ethics, S. Roeser (ed.), Basingstoke: Palgrave Macmillan.
How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up topics and thinkers related to this entry at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.