Notes to Religious Language

1. The rejection of (a*) goes along with the rejection of (b*) and (c*).

2. Brathwaite’s disagreement with Ayer’s emotivism has certain parallels with the contrasting non-cognitive accounts of ethics proposed by Simon Blackburn and Allan Gibbard (see Scott 2013: 49–50).

3. The nature of assertion is a matter of debate (Brown & Cappelen 2011); we assume here that assertions conventionally express beliefs in the content of what is said.

4. Note that we are treating analogy (and metaphor) and linguistic phenomena produced by the use of language. Analogical expressions could alternatively be understood as additional senses of religious terms, i.e., distinct standard meanings of “good”, “wise”, etc., and that the use of these terms is therefore ambiguous.

5. The idea that religious language is metaphorical, however, appears to be much earlier. Turner suggests that Dionysius construed talk of God’s nature as metaphorical. Maimonides (c.1135–1204) treats much of what we say about God as non-literal (The Guide of the Perplexed, ch. 52), although he is not explicit on the way in which it is non-literal.

6. This view was developed by pragmatists Charles Peirce ([BJ]) and John Dewey (1938) and cognate accounts of truth as warranted assertibility or superassertibility are defended by Tennant (1995) and Wright (1992). For the interconnections between truth and other realism-relevant concepts such as reference and descriptiveness see Wright (1992).

Copyright © 2017 by
Michael Scott <>

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