Paul Ricoeur

First published Mon Nov 11, 2002; substantive revision Thu Dec 15, 2022

Paul Ricoeur (1913–2005) is a distinguished French philosopher of the twentieth century, one whose work has been widely translated and discussed across the world. In addition to his academic work, his public presence as a social and political commentator, particularly in France, led to a square in Paris being named in his honor on the centenary of his birth in 2013. In the course of his long career he wrote on a broad range of issues. In addition to his many books, Ricoeur published more than 500 essays, many of which appear in collections in English. The Ricoeur Archive in Paris has made many of those originally published in French available online through its website.

A major theme that runs through Ricoeur’s writings is that of a philosophical anthropology. Ricoeur came to formulate this as the idea of the “capable human being”. With it he seeks to give an account of the fundamental capabilities and vulnerabilities that human beings display in the activities that make up their lives, and to show how these capabilities enable responsible human action and life together. Though the accent is always on the possibility of understanding human beings as agents responsible for their actions, Ricoeur consistently rejects any claim that the self is immediately transparent to itself or fully master of itself. Self-knowledge only comes through our understanding of our relation to the world and of our life with and among others in time in the world.

In the course of developing this anthropology, Ricoeur made several major methodological shifts, partly in response to changes in his intellectual setting as new developments came to speak to the topics he was dealing with, sometimes in ways that challenged his own approach, partly as he pursued questions that had arisen as a result of his published work or that had not yet been considered there. His early academic training was in the tradition of French reflexive philosophy, a tradition that seeks to understand how the “I” comes to be aware of itself and of its thought and action starting from the lived experience of reflexive consciousness, our being aware of ourselves as existing, thinking, and acting. This focus on reflexive consciousness always played a role in organizing Ricoeur’s thinking. His first major publications after World War II, though, were written using existential phenomenology and the French tradition of reflexive philosophy, reflecting not just his study of Husserl, which had begun prior to World War II but also of Karl Jaspers, Gabriel Marcel, Jean-Paul Sartre, and Maurice Merleau-Ponty. By 1960, however, Ricoeur had concluded that to study human reality properly, particularly given the existence of evil, he had to combine phenomenological description and analysis with hermeneutic interpretation. This shift led to an increasing focus on a theory of interpretation that could be grafted to phenomenology, an approach which he came to see was in fact called for by phenomenology. For this hermeneutic phenomenology, whatever is intelligible comes to us in and through our use of language to talk about our lived experience. While philosophical language and the categories it uses always aim at being founded on univocal concepts, as actually used language is always polysemic; it can have more than one meaning, more than one translation, so all uses of language necessarily call for interpretation. This hermeneutic or linguistic turn in Ricoeur’s thought did not require him to disavow the basic results of his earlier investigations. It did, however, lead him not only to revisit that work but also to see more clearly its broader implications, particularly in relation to and in response to the development of structuralism which he saw as a challenge to such a hermeneutic approach. In his later work, this led to an increasing emphasis on the fact that we live in time and in history. He took up this insight through the philosophy of discourse that he developed on the basis of the increased emphasis on language in his philosophy. His late writings also reflect a more direct concern for making sense of selfhood and personal identity as something that goes beyond the epistemological subject, and for ethics at the individual as well as the societal and political levels, leading to his essays on the idea of the just and his last book on the possibility of mutual recognition and states of peace.

1. Biographical Sketch

Paul Ricoeur was born on February 27, 1913 in Valence, France. His mother died shortly thereafter and his father was killed in the Battle of the Marne in 1915, so Ricoeur and his sister were reared by their paternal grandparents and an unmarried aunt in Rennes. They were devout members of the French Reformed Protestant tradition. He was later to speak of the role of faith in his life as “an accident transformed into a destiny through an ongoing choice, while scrupulously respecting other choices.” As a war orphan his schooling was paid for by the French government. He studied philosophy first at the University of Rennes and then at the Sorbonne. From the earliest years of his academic life he was convinced that there is a basic, irreducible difference between things and human beings as persons and as agents. Unlike things, persons can engage in free, thoughtful action. But Ricoeur never accepted any version of a substance dualism in the person as the Cartesian cogito and the Kantian transcendental subject can be read to require. He did, however, accept Kant’s doctrine regarding the antinomies of reason and the necessary distinction between theoretical and practical reason. Ricoeur was studying in Germany when World War II broke out. Soon after being called up for service in the French army in 1939 he was captured and spent the rest of the war in prison camps in Germany. There he was able to study the work of Karl Jaspers and to prepare a translation of Husserl’s Ideas I in the margins of the book which he had to conceal from his jailers. After the war, he completed his doctorate and was appointed lecturer, then professor of the history of philosophy at the University of Strasbourg, where he succeeded Jean Hyppolite. He remained there until 1956, when he was named to the chair of general philosophy at the Sorbonne. In 1965, he joined the faculty of the new University of Paris at Nanterre, now Paris X, whose establishment he had supported in light of the rapid growth in the number of university students at that time. He served a difficult year as Dean of the faculty of letters following the student uprising of 1968. Except for three years he then spent at Louvain, he continued to teach a seminar at the Husserl Archive in Paris until he reached the mandatory retirement age in 1980. From 1954 on, Ricoeur also lectured regularly in the United States and Canada. In 1970 he was named to succeed Paul Tillich as the John Nuveen professor of philosophical theology at the University of Chicago, with a joint appointment in the Divinity School, the Philosophy Department, and the Committee on Social Thought. He taught there regularly for a portion of each year until 1992. In 1986 he gave the Gifford Lectures in Edinburgh, Scotland. Ricoeur’s work has been translated into more than twenty-five languages and he was honored by a volume in the Library of Living Philosophers series. Among his many honorary doctorates are ones from Chicago (1967), Northwestern (1977), Columbia (1981), Göttingen (1987), and McGill (1992). He was the recipient of numerous awards, among them the Hegel Prize (Stuttgart, 1985), the Dante Prize (Florence, 1988), the Karl Jaspers Prize (Heidelberg, 1989), the Leopold Lucas Prize (Tübingen, 1990), the French Academy Grand Prize for Philosophy (1991), the Kyoto Prize (2000), and the Pope Paul VI International Prize (2003). In 2004, he was co-recipient of the John W. Kluge Prize in the Human Sciences awarded by the Kluge Center at the Library of Congress.

2. Pre-hermeneutic Anthropology

Ricoeur’s first major work was meant to appear in three volumes that would lay out a philosophy of the will starting from an eidetic phenomenology of the voluntary and the involuntary. The second volume would then turn to questions dealing with the empirical reality of the will. The third volume would address the misuse of the will and the existence of evil which cannot be explained through either a pure phenomenology of the will or its empirical existence. The projected third volume was announced as intending to present what Ricoeur called a poetics of the will and a vision of innocence in light of what Ricoeur, following Karl Jaspers, called Transcendence. This latter volume never appeared. It was delayed, then set aside when Ricoeur discovered new problems he had not foreseen and when he sought to respond to new challenges to philosophy coming especially from structuralism.

The first volume of this projected trilogy, Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary (1950), proposes a phenomenology of the will, while bracketing the reality of evil. It draws on the method of phenomenology developed by Edmund Husserl. In it one finds an expression of a theme central to Ricoeur’s anthropology, namely, the polar subjective/objective character of the constituent features of lived human existence. Contrary to Sartre’s claim that there is radical difference between consciousness (or the for-itself) and materiality (or the in-itself), a difference that pits the freedom of the for-itself against the sheer facticity of the in-itself, Ricoeur argues that the voluntary and involuntary dimensions of human existence are complementary. This can be seen through a phenomenological description of the three structures that constitute the voluntary pole of human existence: deciding, choosing and moving to action, and our necessary consent to the involuntary as that which is acted upon through our will, whose organ is our body. There is no seamless harmony between these dimensions of what is finally a finite freedom. Human beings have to struggle with the tension between them and ultimately to consent to their embodied lives and the world as something they do not fully create. It is the always fragile resolution of this conflict that ultimately makes human freedom genuinely human, and that gives us our distinctive identities both as individuals and as members of larger historical communities and ultimately of humanity.

Ricoeur extends his account of freedom to take up the topic of evil in Fallible Man and The Symbolism of Evil, both published in 1960. In these works he addresses the question of how to account for the fact that it is possible for us to misuse our freedom, a question that had been bracketed in the initial phenomenological volume. In Fallible Man he argues through a transcendental analysis that this possibility is grounded in the basic disproportion that characterizes human existence as located between the finite, perspectival nature of experience and the infinite, rational dimensions of taking up that experience in perception, practice, and feeling, leading to the concept of fallibility. This disproportion shows up in every aspect of human existence, from perceiving to feeling to thinking. It is evident in the human desire for possessions, power, and prestige. By reason of this disproportion, we are never wholly at one with ourselves and hence we can go wrong. We are fallible, yet evil, the misuse of our freedom, is neither original nor necessary, only always possible.

Nor does this disproportion render our existence meaningless. Rather, the very disproportion that makes us fallible and makes human evil doing possible is also what makes goodness, knowledge, and achievement possible. It is what distinguishes us from one another—each one of us has his or her unique spatiotemporal location and perspective but we can know ourselves as one human among many and we can seek to know the world beyond our individual perspective on it. Our fallibility also makes it necessary and possible for us to communicate with each other through our use of the logos which seeks to transcend our localized points of view.

Though the unity of humanity is never more than a unity founded on communication, precisely because we can communicate, the differences among us are never absolute. Furthermore, no one of us alone could be a person. Though each of us has an individual identity, our identities show that we are bound up with others: “Man is this plural and collective unity in which the unity of destination and the differences of destinies are to be understood through each other” (Fallible Man, 138).

The kind of unity that binds people to one another even though they differ is found in their desire for esteem and recognition. This desire seeks genuine mutuality that expresses esteem for the worth that each of us has by reason of both our common humanity and our individual uniqueness. This esteem positively values the disproportion constitutive of every person. This theme of mutual recognition is developed more fully in Ricoeur’s final book The Course of Recognition, where he argues that it goes beyond mere reciprocal recognition, like that found in commercial or other transactions reducible to an exchange of goods with no regard for who the other party involved might be.

The study of history which acknowledges the temporality of our existence confirms our desire for such mutual esteem. Such attention to history, in turn, further clarifies the finite nature of human freedom. For Ricoeur, there is an order and structure to history conveyed through the narrating of history. Otherwise history would be unintelligible. But this narrated history also recounts events and deeds that disrupt the prevailing order and reorder it, leading to the question whether forgiveness for the wrongs that have occurred and debts that have been incurred might be possible, however difficult to achieve.

These reflections reinforced Ricoeur’s conviction that what humans say and do presupposes both a finite freedom that allows us to intervene in natural processes and a dependence on these same processes for the efficacy of such actions. What we say and do would be meaningless if it did not fit into some antecedent structure or pattern established by natural processes, on the one hand, and into what we say about such doings which intervene in those processes, on the other. Our words and deeds are intended to express the meaning of what exists, if only because they give meaning to things as they now stand. In this sense, our words and deeds get their significance from being responses to contexts not wholly of our own making. What we say and do in such contexts can also aim beyond things as they now stand and sometimes does give expression to new meanings and values, as well as to unintended and as yet unrealized possibilities. In a word, our exercising of our finite freedom has worth and efficacy only by reason of our embodiment in a natural and cultural setting that is largely not of our own making, but this is a world that we seek to appropriate through our words and deeds—and our use of a productive imagination.

Ricoeur saw that this conception of the disproportion that characterizes human beings was insufficient to account for actual occurrence of a bad will and evil deeds. No direct, unmediated inspection of the cogito, like that he saw in Descartes and Husserl, can show why these evils, contingent as each of them is, in fact came to be. Recognizing the opacity of the cogito in this respect confirmed his belief that all self-understanding comes about only through “signs deposited in memory and imagination by the great literary traditions” (Ricoeur, “Intellectual Autobiography”, in Hahn 1995: 16). This conclusion was a major motivator for his hermeneutic and, at the same time, “linguistic turn”.

Ricoeur next explored the problem of how then to account for the existence of evil and its possible solution in The Symbolism of Evil. There, he argued that we should consider how people have sought to come to terms with their inability to make sense of the existence of evil by using language that draws on the great symbols and myths that speak of its origin and end. This is language that conveys more than a single meaning, language that can always be understood in more than one way; hence it needs always to be interpreted. This study concluded by saying that philosophy must learn to make sense of such language and learn to think starting from it, something Ricoeur summed up in a famous phrase: “the symbol gives rise to thought” (The Symbolism of Evil, 1967: 247–57). If philosophy is to take seriously this lesson taught by reflection on the symbolism of evil, it has to take up the problem of the “fullness of language”. This means considering those uses of language that extend beyond a single word or sentence, as well as those which cannot be interpreted as simple logical propositions that say S is P. Like the primary symbols of evil‐stain, sin, and guilt—these are forms of discourse that can have more than one meaning. To make sense of the fullness of language, therefore, philosophy has to develop a theory of interpretation since actual discourse is not always, if ever univocal and its meanings do change over time when acts of discourse outlive the speakers and situations in which they were originally produced.

In working out this theory of interpretation in terms of a theory of language as discourse, Ricoeur saw that what he now called the hermeneutic field to which interpretations applied was itself divided internally between an approach such as that used in The Symbolism of Evil which sought to recover meaning that was assumed to be already there and what he now called a hermeneutics of suspicion, like that found in Marx, Nietzsche and Freud, which held that nothing ultimately means what it first seems to say. The rise of structuralism in the 1960s and 70s, drawing on developments in linguistics, contributed to this emphasis on suspicion by holding that it was an underlying impersonal structure or structures that gave rise to the apparent surface meaning. Structuralism also introduced the idea that the identifying of such underlying structures could count as a reductive explanation of any surface-level meaning. Ricoeur’s philosophical project therefore turned to showing that while structuralism could be incorporated as a method of inquiry—look for and learn from the proposed generative structures—it went astray when it proposed itself as a theory of objectivity without subjectivity, what Ricoeur called a transcendental philosophy without a transcendental subject. Over time, he came to see that this limiting of structural analysis to a method of interpretation can be shown to follow from the fact that structuralists always presupposed the surface meaning they were trying to explain away. Moreover, because they ignored time and discarded any notion of change, because the deep structures they discovered were understood to be static and atemporal, they could not really account for how structures generated surface meanings, that is, how one structure could change into a different structure.

This critique is found in the essays collected in The Conflict of Interpretations (1969) and in Ricoeur’s detailed philosophical reading of Freud, Freud and Philosophy (1970). Freud’s own philosophy, according to Ricoeur, turns out to be an archaeology of the subject meant to provide at a theory of culture (civilization and its discontents), but it lacks the required corresponding teleology of the subject that would allow for human creativity and a capable human being. These investigations reinforced Ricoeur’s view that there is no unmediated self-understanding, leading to a turn to a more dialectical method in his work. This is an approach through which he seeks to find the middle term that can mediate between two polar terms and allow us to move back and forth between them. Locating such a mediating term leads to enhanced understanding. This understanding always comes about through interpretation but is also itself open to critique. In other words, for Ricoeur hermeneutics works with a method that mediates and negotiates rather than removes the conflict of interpretations.

Besides recognizing the fruitfulness of structural analyses of particular well-defined fields of experience, Ricoeur resisted those structuralists and post-structuralists who sought to reduce language itself to a closed system of signs having no reference to anything outside itself. Following clues found in the works of Emile Benveniste and Roman Jakobson, he defined discourse as the use of such sign systems by someone to say something about something to someone, using existing but malleable phonetic, lexical, syntactic, and stylistic rules. That is, discourse always involves a speaker or writer and a hearer or reader as well as something said in some situation about some reality, ultimately a world that we might inhabit. It follows that any interpretation of a form of discourse requires both the objective sort of analysis for which structuralism provides a tool and an acknowledgment that there is always a surplus of meaning that goes beyond what such objective techniques seek to explain. There is a surplus of meaning because we apply objective techniques to things we already understand as having a possible meaning without fully exhausting that meaning. The meaning of acts of discourse is moreover always open to new interpretations, particularly as time passes and the very context in which interpretation occurs itself changes.

3. Interpretation and the Fullness of Language

On this basis Ricoeur’s work after The Conflict of Interpretations addressed a number of related topics. On one level, he explored the practice of methods of interpretation as an arc leading from an initial situation and understanding to broadened understanding, both of the interpreter and the world as a world we can imagine ourselves as inhabiting. On a second level, he explored the broader notion of the fullness of language through investigation of different forms of extended discourse. These are uses of language that are longer than a single sentence and whose truth and meaning is not simply reducible to the sum of the truth values of the individual sentences which make up such extended discourse. On the basis of these two interwoven levels, he could also take up the questions of selfhood and responsible human action, allowing him to spell out in greater detail the ethical theory that had always been implicit in his philosophy. His discussion of ethics starts from a focus on person to person relations, the self and just one or only a few nearby others, characterized in the best case by solicitude for the other person and the possibility of friendship, then subsequently moved on to the question of justice and living with others beyond those we may meet every day or face to face. Here the question of rights and respect for the faceless other arises. The specific question what is a just relation in such situations (The Just, 2000; Reflections on the Just, 2007), developed out of Ricoeur’s participation in a seminar for judges, and led to his reflections in the last work published during his lifetime on the idea of mutual recognition (The Course of Recognition, 2005). In those final years, he also continued to explore other dimensions of the fullness of language, for example, through some significant essays on the notion of translation as occurring not just between languages but also within them (On Translation, 2006).

Ricoeur’s investigation of practices of interpretation did not propose a single general theory applicable in each and every case. His approach was rather to formulate his theory of discourse as a use of language meant to say something to someone about something using examples of such discourse and their interpretation. But language as spoken is ephemeral, it disappears. Ricoeur’s genial insight was to turn to examples that fixed such discourse by inscribing it in texts or what might be treated as analogous to a text. The event of speaking might disappear but the text remains for anyone who knows how to read. Hence it is the meaning of the text rather than the original author’s intention or the originating situation that becomes the object of interpretation. Structuralism was correct that texts have a structure. But this structure varies depending on the kind of discourse inscribed in the text, so discerning that structure and how it contributes to shaping that discourse helps one identify the discourse as being of a certain type or genre. Initially recognizing this genre is something like a guess that has to be confirmed through interpreting the text, but a good reading also opens interpreters to being questioned about their initial assumptions by the text in question. What one discovers through such investigations, Ricoeur believed, is that there is something like a world of the text that lies not behind the text but metaphorically in front of it as something to be explored by the interpreter’s imagination. This is a world that we can think of ourselves as inhabiting. Interpretations, of course, need to be checked against and challenged by other interpretations and they will sooner or later need to be redone as situations change over time. So there is a possibility of both internal and external critique: is a text coherent in terms of its generic form, can it be confirmed or falsified by other similar documents or subsequent data? Explanatory techniques also play a role, particularly when understanding breaks down. In a nice turn of phrase, Ricoeur liked to say one then seeks to explain more in order to understand better. He also agreed with Hans-Georg Gadamer’s theory of hermeneutics that what is finally at stake in interpretation is a kind of appropriation, although Ricoeur saw this as more oriented to action in the present than to what Gadamer called the appropriation of tradition, although tradition always did have a role to play, even when criticized or rejected. He agreed with Gadamer, moreover, that the goal of interpretation was to enable us to make sense of our embodied existence with others including our predecessors and successors in the world.

Ricoeur did not produce a general theory of interpretation. His reflections on hermeneutics were themselves an instance of the philosophical practice of interpretation leading to insight into what ultimately underlies and enables such activity: the need to interpret in order to make sense of human life; the move from an initial understanding to greater understanding on the basis of critical reflection and an appeal to the imagination; interpolating explanatory techniques and procedures where understanding breaks down; appropriation of the meaning of discourse in terms of the world it projects, as a world one might inhabit. And finally: increased self-understanding.

4. Forms of Extended Discourse

Ricoeur examined a number of different forms of extended discourse, beginning with metaphorical discourse. Like the talk about symbols he had explored earlier a live metaphor is a kind of discourse that says more than one thing at the same time. Live metaphors are the product of sentences, not the result of substituting one word for another for decorative or rhetorical effect. They presuppose a kind of odd predication, a “metaphorical twist”. Unlike propositions which say something is or is not the case, a live metaphor says “is” and “is not” at the same time, leading possibly to a redescription of reality. As creative instances of the use of language, live metaphors can die and be absorbed into the dictionary (a watch runs). Live metaphors can also extend beyond a single sentence as in the case of poetic discourse. Poetic discourse is thus a use of language that redescribes reality. Its truth is more a matter of manifestation than of coherence or correspondence with what is assumed to be external reality. In an important sense, this experienced truth is the basis for talk about coherence and correspondence, yet paradoxically metaphorical discourse always presupposes an already existing language that it can make use of. In this sense, we are never at the origin of language. We can question back toward this origin but never reach it, since we always must begin by making use of existing language to question language. Philosophers of the fullness of language therefore always begin as having already begun.

Narrative discourse is another form of extended discourse investigated by Ricoeur. It is a use of language that allows us to make practical sense of human action and time. Ordinary language already contains concepts that apply to action—those of intentions, motives, causes, reasons, acts, consequences, agents and patients, for example—just as it contains concepts applicable to time: past, present, future, now, then, when. Narrative discourse configures such heterogeneous concepts into a discourse that locates actions in a time where one thing happens not just after something else but because of something else in a followable story or history. It refigures physical events as narrative events, events which make sense because they tell what happens in a story or history. But because narratives have endings or must end, they never fully exhaust time or the possible long-term meaning of action. Through their plots they are always a synthesis of heterogeneous concepts into a kind of discordant concordance which configures the episodes of the story into a told story. In so doing they resolve practically if not theoretically the conflict between time understood as a lived now—this present which has a past and a future—and cosmic time conceived of as a sequence of points, where any point can be a now point defined not in terms of its past and future but merely in terms of points that come before and after it. Narrative interweaves these two perspectives on time into human time without ever fully resolving the aporias raised by thinking about time in time.

Religious discourse, at least as found in the Hebrew and Christian biblical tradition takes many forms: hymns, laws, narratives, parables, prophecy, wisdom sayings. What they have in common that specifies them as religious discourse is that they are all forms of poetic discourse and they all in their own way “name” God. Within their setting within the biblical canon they do so through their constituting a polyphony that enables the religious traditions that use these texts both to identify and to legitimate themselves through a kind of hermeneutic circle. That is, such texts are sacred to traditions which take them as legitimating the tradition founded on these texts, through their reading and interpreting of such texts.

Political discourse is a particularly fragile form of extended discourse since the political dimension of human existence is one realm among others like commerce or the arts and also the one that contains all the others. It is an especially rhetorical form of discourse in the sense of being discourse that aims at persuasion. Persuasion is necessary because there is no final resolution of the conflicts that can arise over questions about the best form of government or whether there should be, say, a law, what that law ought to be, or whether laws are required in this case at all. That politics also is about power, the power to make decisions and command others adds to the fragility of such discourse in that politics is always based on a revocable willingness to live together. This leads to a dialectic of ideology and utopia in Ricoeur’s political philosophy. Ideologies both claim to legitimate the positions of those in power or those seeking power and cover the gap between what they assert and the way things actually are. Utopian thinking, in return, imagines a world without or beyond ideology. It sometimes enables people to overthrow particularly ruinous forms of ideology, only to fall back into a dependence on ideology since utopia exists “nowhere”. Yet politics is necessary because it makes possible life together. That it always takes place between these two poles of ideology and utopia is another example of a mediating term between opposed poles in Ricoeur’s hermeneutics.

5. Narrative Identity and the Turn to Selfhood

At the end of his three volume study of narrative (Time and Narrative, 1984–88) Ricoeur realized that what was said there pointed to the importance of the idea of a narrative identity. This has to do not just with the identity of the characters in a story or history, but with the larger claim that personal identity in every case can be considered in terms of a narrative identity: what story does a person tell about his or her life, or what story do others tell about it? In effect, narrative identity is one of the ways in which we answer the question “who?” Who is this? Who said that? Did that? Who is that? Who are we? In his 1986 Gifford Lectures (published as Oneself as Another, 1992) Ricoeur expanded this investigation to the broader question of what it is to be a self. This discussion was meant to reply to interpretations of the Cartesian cogito which either made it too strong (one can immediately be in touch with the self as certain of itself) or too weak (a merely abstract truth) or even said the self does not exist. Against this latter idea of a “shattered cogito” Ricoeur proposed a hermeneutics of selfhood and a “wounded cogito”. This was the idea and reality of a person capable of attesting to his or her own existence and acting in the world, a self that both acted and was acted upon who could recount and take responsibility for its actions. Insofar as we can speak metaphysically of such a self it has to be in terms of act and potentiality rather than substance.

Ricoeur’s argument regarding selfhood proceeds through a sequence of stages. He begins from the philosophy of language and the question of an identifying reference to persons as selves, not simply things. This leads to consideration of the speaking subject as an agent, passing through the semantics of action Ricoeur had learned from analytic philosophy during his time in North America. Next comes the idea of the self as having a narrative identity which is then is followed by the question of the ethical aim of being such a self. This hermeneutics of selfhood culminates in the conclusion that one is a self as one self among other selves, something that can only be attested to through personal testimony or the testimony of others. Selfhood is thus closely tied to a kind of discourse that says “I believe-in”. Its certainty is a lived conviction rather than a logical or scientific certainty.

Along the way to this conclusion Ricoeur introduces a key distinction between two kinds of identity in relation to selfhood. Idem identity is the identity of something that is always the same which never changes, ipse identity is sameness across and through change. Self-identity involves both dimensions: I am and am not the person I was ten years ago. It is the existence of ipse identity that indicates that a self is better thought of in terms of the question “who?” than in terms of the question “what” is a self.

Since the self is an agent the question of its ethical aim arises, allowing Ricoeur to introduce what he calls his “little ethics”. This introduces new predicates for the self and another path toward the self, one that shifts the argument from description toward prescription. Ricoeur presents this little ethics through what he calls its ethical intention: “aiming at a good life lived with and for others in just institutions” (Oneself as Another, 1992: 172). This formula indicates that there is a priority of ethics (understood as teleological) over morality (understood as normative practice). In fact, the structure is threefold: the ethical aim has to pass through the sieve of the norm, which is meant to realize the ethical intention, to be applied in specific situations on the basis of phronesis or practical wisdom that will apply the norm appropriately. It is also possible to read the sequence backwards: for example, when a disaster, say a new disease, leads to new normative practices growing out of the response to it, thereby throwing new light in turn on the ethical intention. At the level of relations between a self and nearby or intimate others, the ideal of reciprocity entailed here is best expressed as solicitude that enables both self-esteem and self-respect on the parts of those involved. At the level of the distant other or others, the question of justice arises and with it new notions of respect and of institutions such as the rule of law that establish and help maintain or restore a just distance between those involved in them. Underlying both levels is the idea expressed by the golden rule that one ought not do to others what one does not want done to him- or herself. And beyond every institutionalized system of rules lies the transformative possibility of love which transcends the fragile and provisory practical meditations established by every ethical system through applying and, if necessary, reinterpreting the golden rule. Love is a way of responding not just to the limits of any such system but to the tragic dimension Ricoeur sees as inherent in all human action, which never fully achieves what it intends, another reminder that human freedom is always a finite freedom.

6. Memory, History, Forgetting

All these threads in Ricoeur’s philosophy come together in Ricoeur’s last big book (Memory, History, Forgetting, 2004) pointing to the final revised lectures on recognition. This three part work first takes up the question of memory and recollection in response to questions about uses and abuses of memory in contemporary society. Ricoeur lists these as occurring on a pathological-therapeutic level as the problem of blocked memory; on a practical level as manipulated memory, and on an ethical-political level as obligated memory. He then asks whether history is a remedy for or a hindrance to these problems. This leads him back to the question of the epistemology of historical research and writing, a topic he already had addressed in History and Truth (1965) and Time and Narrative. Now the question is to what extent history depends on memory. Historians know more about the past than individuals remember, but can history completely break with an appeal to memory as a kind of testimony? I was there, believe me. The problem here is suspicion not simply falsification. What is new to Ricoeur’s account is that he sees at work a closer tie between explanation and understanding than he had considered in his earlier work where explanation aids understanding. He now speaks of what he calls explanatory understanding. It runs through what, following the French historian Michel de Certeau, he now calls the historiographical operation that characterizes the whole process of historical documentation, research, and writing. This shift in Ricoeur’s thinking leads him to consider the question of historical representation as an image based on both narration and rhetoric. History as written, he suggests, “stands for” the past as “having been”.

On this basis, he can again ask about human existence as historical, as being within time and ultimately uncanny. He seeks particularly to address the problem of forgetting in relation to the three problems listed earlier. Traces of the past can be lost, and that past will be forgotten in the sense of being beyond memory. But what of forgetting where the traces remain? Here is where the problems of blocked, manipulated, or commanded memory remain, especially in the latter case with attempts to order forgetting either through amnesty or censorship. This problem leads to an epilogue on the possibility of forgiveness, something Ricoeur admits is left incomplete. Along the way though, he shows that the idea of guilt, historical guilt necessarily runs up against the limit of the imprescriptible and that forgiveness, which is difficult but not impossible, is something like a gift, one that unbinds the agent from the act. Beyond the distinction of a happy memory and an unhappy one in other words lies the possibility of a forgetting held in reserve. To forgive is not to forget. It is this idea of forgiveness as a gift, but not one requiring or expecting a gift in return but as something received and passed on as a second gift that leads the discussion of mutual recognition and states of peace in Ricoeur’s last book, The Course of Recognition.

Ricoeur’s argument there starts from the surprising fact that there has been no recognized theory of recognition similar to what exists for theories of knowledge. In fact, when he looks in the dictionary he finds that the word (which in French carries as strong a sense of gratitude as of what English calls recognition) has numerous lexical senses. Ricoeur therefore proposes to construct a chain of conceptual meanings that runs from recognition in the active voice to its use in the passive voice, to being recognized. The demand for recognition that runs through this sequence can only be answered, he claims, by mutual recognition, “where this mutual recognition either remains an unfulfilled dream or requires procedures and institutions that elevate recognition beyond the friendship of face-to-face relations to the political plane” (The Course of Recognition, 19). This sequence of concepts of recognition runs from identifying something to identifying oneself to recognizing and being recognized by others. In the process the concept moves away from simply being identified with knowledge. Instead it opens the way to knowledge as it relates to self-knowledge and genuine community for which one is and can be grateful in that recognition “lightens the weight of obligation to give in return and reorients this toward a generosity equal to the one that led to the first gift [of being recognized]” (243).


Books by Ricoeur

  • Karl Jaspers et la philosophie de l’existence, written with Michel Dufrenne, Paris: Seuil, 1947.
  • Gabriel Marcel and Karl Jaspers: Philosophie du mystère et philosophie du paradoxe, Paris: Temps Present, 1947.
  • Philosophie de la volonté I. Le volontaire et l’involontaire, Paris: Seuil, 1950; translated as Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary by Erazim Kohák, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1966.
  • Histoire et Vérité, Paris: Seuil, 1955, second expanded edition 1964, third expanded edition 1967; translated as History and Truth by Charles A. Kelbley, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1965.
  • Philosophie de la volonté. Finitude et CupibiltéI. L’homme faillible, translated as Fallible Man, by Charles A. Kelbley, New York: Fordham University Press, 1986.
  • Philosophie de la volonté, Finitude et Culpabilité II. La symbolique du mal, translated as The Symbolism of Evil, by Emerson Buchanan, New York: Harper and Row, 1967.
  • Husserl: An Analysis of His Phenomenology, translated by Edward G. Ballard and Lester E. Embree, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1967.
  • De l’interprétation. Essai sur Freud, Paris: Seuil, 1965; translated as Freud and Philosophy: An Essay on Interpretation, by Denis Savage, New Haven: Yale University Press, 1970.
  • Entretiens Paul Ricoeur — Gabriel Marcel, Paris: Aubier, 1968; translated as Gabriel Marcel, Tragic Wisdom and Beyond, by Stephen Jolin and Peter McCormick, Evanston: Northwester University Press, 1973.
  • Le conflit des interprétations. Essais d’herméneutique, translated as The Conflict of Interpretations: Essays in Hermeneutics, by Willis Domingo et al., edited by Don Ihde, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1974.
  • Political and Social Essays, edited by David Stewart and Joseph Bien, Athens: Ohio University Press, 1974.
  • La métaphore vive, Paris: Seuil, 1975; translated as The Rule of Metaphor: Multi-Disciplinary Studies in the Creation of Meaning in Language, by Robert Czerny with Kathleen McLaughlin and John Costello, SJ., Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1978.
  • Interpretation Theory: Discourse and the Surplus of Meaning, Fort Worth: Texas Christian University Press, 1976.
  • The Philosophy of Paul Ricoeur: An Anthology of his Work, edited by Charles E. Reagan and David Stewart, Boston: Beacon Press, 1978.
  • Essays on Biblical Interpretation, edited by Lewis S. Mudge, Philadelphia: Fortress Press, 1980.
  • Hermeneutics and the Human Sciences: Essays on Language, Action and Interpretation, edited and translated by John B. Thompson, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1981.
  • Temps et récit. Tome I, translated as Time and Narrative, by Kathleen McLaughlin and David Pellauer, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1984.
  • Temps et récit. Tome II. La configuration dans le récit de la fiction, translated as Time and Narrative (Volume 2), by Kathleen McLaughlin and David Pellauer, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1985.
  • Temps et récit. Tome III. Le temps raconté, Translated as Time and Narrative (Volume 3), by Kathleen Blamey and David Pellauer, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1988.
  • Lectures on Ideology and Utopia, edited by George H. Taylor, New York: Cambridge University Press, 1981; translated as L’idéologie et l’utopie, by Myriam Revault d’Allones and Joël Roman, Paris: Seuil, 1997.
  • Du texte à l’action. Essais d’herméneutique, II, Paris: Seuil, 1986; translated as From Text to Action: Essays in Hermeneutics II, by Kathleen Blamey and John B. Thompson, Evanston: Northwestern University Press, 1991.
  • À l’École de la phénoménologie, Paris: Vrin, 1986.
  • Soi-même comme un autre, Paris: Seuil, 1990; translated as Oneself as Another, by Kathleen Blamey, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1992.
  • A Ricoeur Reader: Reflection and Imagination, edited by Mario J. Valdes, Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1991.
  • Lectures I: Autour du politique, Paris: Seuil, 1991.
  • Lectures II : La Contrée des philosophes, Paris: Seuil, 1992.
  • Lectures III : Aux Frontières de la philosophie, Paris: Seuil, 1994.
  • Figuring the Sacred: Religion, Narrative, and Imagination, edited by Mark I. Wallace, translated by David Pellauer, Minneapolis: Fortress Press, 1995.
  • La critique et la conviction. Entretien avec François Azouvi et Marc de Launay, Paris: Calmann-Lévy, 1995; translated as Critique and Conviction, by Kathleen Blamey, New York: Columbia University Press, 1998.
  • Réflexion faite. Autobiographie intellectuelle, Paris: Éditions Esprit, 1995; translated as “Intellectual Autobiography” by Kathleen Blamey, in The Philosophy of Paul Ricoeur, Lewis Edwin Hahn (ed.), Chicago: Open Court, 1995, 1–53.
  • Le Juste, Paris: Éditions Esprit, 1995; translated as The Just, by David Pellauer, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2000.
  • Ce qui nous faith penser. La nature et la règle, with Jean-Pierre Changeux, Paris: Odile Jacob, 1998; translated as What Makes Us Think? A Neuroscientist and a Philosopher Argue about Ethics, Human Nature, and the Brain, by M. B. DeBevoise. Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2000.
  • Penser la Bible, with André LaCocque, Paris: Seuil, 1998; translated as Thinking Biblically: Exegetical and Hermeneutical Studies, by David Pellauer, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1998.
  • La mémoire, l’histoire, l’oubli, Paris: Seuil, 2000; translated as Memory, History, Forgetting by Kathleen Blamey and David Pellauer, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2004.
  • Le Juste 2, Paris: Éditions Esprit, 2001; translated as Reflections on the Just, by David Pellauer. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2007.
  • Sur la traduction, Paris: Bayard, 2004; translated as On Translation, by Eileen Brennan. New York: Routledge, 2006.
  • Parcours de la reconnaissance. Trois études, translated as The Course of Recognition, by David Pellauer. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2005.
  • Vivant jusqu’à la mort. Suivi de Fragments, edited by Catherine Goldenstein, translated as Living Up To Death, by David Pellauer, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2009.
  • Écrits et conférences 1: Autour de la psychanalyse, edited by Catherine Goldenstein, translated as On Psychoanalysis, by David Pellauer, Cambridge: Polity Press, 2012.
  • Écrits et conférences 2: Herméneutique, translated as Hermeneutics, by David Pellauer, Cambridge: Polity Press, 2013.
  • Écrits et conférences 3: Anthropologie Philosophique, translated as Philosophical Anthropology, by David Pellauer, Cambridge: Polity, 2016.
  • Écrits et conférences 4: Politique, Économie et Société, translated as Politics, Economy, and Society, by Kathleen Blamey. Cambridge: Polity Press, 2021.
  • Écrits et conférences 5: La Religion pour Penser, Paris: Seuil, 2021.
  • Être, essence et substance chez Platon et Aristote. Cours professé à l’ de Strasbourg en 1953–1954, translated as Being, Essence and Substance in Plato and Aristotle, by David Pellauer and John Starkey, Cambridge: Polity Press, 2012.
  • Ricoeur and Castoriadis in Discussion: On Human Creation, Historical Novelty, and the Social Imaginary, edited by Suzi Adams, New York: Rowman and Littlefield, 2017.
  • Méthode réflexive appliquée au problème de Dieu chez Lachelier et Lagneau, Paris: Cerf, 2017.
  • Plaidoyer pour l’utopie ecclésiale, Geneva: Labor et Fides, 2017.
  • Philosophie, Éthique et Politique: Entretiens et dilalogues, translated as Philosophy, Ethics, and Politics, by Kathleen Blamey. Cambridge: Polity Press, 2020.

Selected Secondary Literature

  • Amalric, Jean-Luc, 2013, Paul Ricoeur, l’imagination vive : Une genèse de la philosophie ricoeurienne de l’imagination, Paris: Hermann.
  • Arel Stephanie N. and Dan R. Stiver, 2019, Ideology and Utopia in the Twenty-First Century: The Surplus of Meaning in Ricoeur’s Dialectical Concept, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
  • Arthos, John, 2019. Hermeneutics after Ricoeur, London: Bloomsbury Academic.
  • Blundell, Boyd, 2010, Paul Ricoeur between Theology and Philosophy: Detour and Return, Bloomington: Indiana University Press.
  • Clark S. H., 1990, Paul Ricoeur, London and New York: Routledge.
  • Cohen, Richard A., and James L. Marsh (eds.), 2002, Ricoeur as Another, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Dauenhauer, Bernard P., 1998, Paul Ricoeur: The Promise and Risk of Politics, Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield.
  • Davidson, Scott (ed.), 2018, A Companion to Ricoeur’s Freedom and Nature, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
  • ––– (ed.), 2019, A Companion to Ricoeur’s Fallible Man, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
  • ––– (ed.), 2020, A Companion to Ricoeur’s The Symbolism of Evil, New York: Lexington Books.
  • de Leeuw, Marc, 2022. Paul Ricoeur’s Renewal of Philosophical Anthropology: Vulnerability, Capability, Justice, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
  • de Leeuw, Marc, George H. Taylor, and Eileen Brennan (eds.), 2021. Reading Ricoeur Through Law, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
  • Deweer, Dries, 2017, Ricoeur’s Personalist Republicanism: On Personhood and Citizenship, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
  • Dierckxsens, Geoffrey, 2018, Paul Ricoeur’s Moral Anthropology: Singularity, Responsibility, and Justice, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
  • Dosse, François, 2008, Paul Ricoeur: Les sens d’une vie (1913–2005), édition revue et augmentée. Paris: La Decouverte.
  • Dosse, François, 2012, Paul Ricoeur: Un philosophe dans son siècle, Paris: Armand Colin.
  • Gregor, Brian, 2019, Ricoeur’s Hermeneutics of Religion: Rebirth of the Capable Self, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
  • Greisch, Jean, 2001, Paul Ricoeur : L’itinérance du sens, Paris: Millon.
  • Gutting, Gary, 2001, French Philosophy in the Twentieth Century, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Hahn, Lewis E. (ed.), 1995, The Philosophy of Paul Ricoeur, Chicago and La Salle: Open Court.
  • Hall, W. David, 2007, Paul Ricoeur and the Poetic Imperative: The Creative Tension Between Love and Justice, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Halsema, Anneemie and Fernanda Henriques (eds.), 2016, Feminist Explorations of Paul Ricoeur’s Philosophy, New York: Lexington Press.
  • Helenius, Timo, 2016, Ricoeur, Culture, and Recognition: A Hermeneutic of Cultural Subjectivity, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
  • Ihde, Don, 1971, Hermeneutic Phenomenology: The Philosophy of Paul Ricoeur, Evanston: Northwestern University Press.
  • Jervolino, D., 1990, The Cogito and Hermeneutics: The Question of the Subject in Ricoeur, Dordrecht: Kluwer.
  • Johnson, Greg S. and Dan R. Stiver (eds.), 2013 Paul Ricoeur and the Task of Political Philosophy, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
  • Joy, Morny (ed.), 1997, Paul Ricoeur and Narrative, Calgary: University of Calgary Press.
  • Kaplan, David, 2003, Ricoeur’s Critical Theory, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Kearney, Richard (ed.), 1996, Paul Ricoeur: The Hermeneutics of Action, London: Sage.
  • –––, 2004, On Paul Ricoeur: The Owl of Minerva, Aldershot: Ashgate Publishing.
  • Kemp, T. P., and D. Rasmussen (eds.), 1989, The Narrative Path: The Later Works of Paul Ricoeur, Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.
  • Klemm, David E., and William Schweiker (eds.), 1993, Meaning in Texts and Action: Questioning Paul Ricoeur, Charlottesville: University Press of Virginia.
  • Mann, Molly Harkirat, 2012, Ricoeur, Rawls, and Capability Justice, London and New York: Bloomsbury.
  • Michel, Johann, 2015, Ricoeur and the Post-Structuralists: Bourdieu, Derrida, Deleuze, Foucault, Castoriadis, Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littlefield
  • Montiel, Pierre-Olivier, 2013, Ricoeur politique, Rennes: Presses Universitaires de Rennes.
  • Mootz III, Francis J. and George Taylor (eds.), 2011, Gadamer and Ricoeur: Critical Horizons for Contemporary Hermeneutics, New York: Continuum.
  • Pellauer, David, 2007, Ricoeur: A Guide for the Perplexed, New York: Continuum.
  • Reagan, Charles E., 1996, Paul Ricoeur: His Life and Work, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • ––– (ed.), 1979, Studies in the Philosophy of Paul Ricoeur, Athens: Ohio University Press.
  • Reijers, Wessel, Alberto Romele, and Mark Coeckelbergh (eds.), 2021. Interpreting Technology: Ricoeur on Questions Concerning Ethics and Philosophy of Technology, Lanham, MD: Rowman and Littefield.
  • Ritivoi, Andreea Deciu, 2006, Paul Ricoeur: Tradition and Innovation in Rhetorical Theory, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Simms, Karl, 2003, Paul Ricoeur, New York: Routledge.
  • Savage, Roger (ed.), 2015, Paul Ricoeur in the Age of Hermeneutical Reason: Poetics, Praxis, and Critique, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
  • ––– (ed.), 2020, Paul Ricoeur and the Lived Body, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books.
  • Shenge, Adrien Lentiampa, S.J., 2009, Paul Ricoeur : La justice selon l’espérance, Brussels: Lessius.
  • Stiver Dan R., 2001, Theology After Ricoeur: New Directions in Hermeneutical Theology, Louisville: Westminster John Knox Press.
  • Thompson, John B., 1981, Critical Hermeneutics: A Study in the Thought of Paul Ricoeur and Jürgen Habermas, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Treanor, Brian and Henry Isaac Venema (eds.), 2010, A Passion for the Possible: Thinking with Paul Ricoeur, New York: Fordham University Press.
  • Vansina, F. D., 2008, Paul Ricoeur: Bibliography 1935–2008, Leuven/Paris: Peeters.
  • Venema, Henry Isaac, 2000, Identifying Selfhood: Imagination, Narrative, and Hermeneutics in the Thought of Paul Ricoeur, Albany: State University of New York Press.
  • Wall, John, 2005, Moral Creativity: Paul Ricoeur and the Poetics of Possibility, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Wall, John, William Schweiker, and W. David Hall (eds.), 2002, Paul Ricoeur and Contemporary Moral Thought, New York and London: Routledge.
  • Wiercinski, Andrzej (ed.), 2003, Between Suspicion and Sympathy: Paul Ricoeur’s Unstable Equilibrium, Toronto: Hermeneutic Press.
  • Wong, Michael T., 2019. Ricoeur andthe Third Discourse of the Person: From Philosophy and Neuroscience to Psychiatry and Theology, New York: Lexington Books.
  • Wood, David (ed.), 1991, On Paul Ricoeur: Narrative and Interpretation, New York: Routledge.

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