Children are young human beings. Some children are very young human beings. As human beings children evidently have a certain moral status. There are things that should not be done to them for the simple reason that they are human. At the same time children are different from adult human beings and it seems reasonable to think that there are things children may not do that adults are permitted to do. In the majority of jurisdictions, for instance, children are not allowed to vote, to marry, to buy alcohol, to have sex, or to engage in paid employment. What makes children a special case for philosophical consideration is this combination of their humanity and their youth, or, more exactly, what is thought to be associated with their youth. One very obvious way in which the question of what children are entitled to do or to be or to have is raised is by asking, Do children have rights? If so, do they have all the rights that adults have and do they have rights that adults do not have? If they do not have rights how do we ensure that they are treated in the morally right way? Most jurisdictions accord children legal rights. Most countries—though not the United States of America—have ratified the United Nations Convention on the Rights of the Child which was first adopted in 1989. The Convention accords to children a wide range of rights including, most centrally, the right to have their ‘best interests’ be ‘a primary consideration’ in all actions concerning them (Article 3), the ‘inherent right to life’ (Article 6), and the right of a child “who is capable of forming his or her own views … to express these views freely in all matters affecting the child” (Article 12) (United Nations 1989). However it is normal to distinguish between ‘positive’ rights, those that are recognised in law, and ‘moral’ rights, those that are recognised by some moral theory. That children have ‘positive’ rights does not then settle the question of whether they do or should have moral rights. However there are at least good political reasons why one might think that the UNCRC provides an exemplary statement – in the language of positive rights – of how children should be treated and regarded. Nevertheless the idea of children as rights holders has been subject to different kinds of philosophical criticism At the same time there has been philosophical consideration of what kinds of rights children have if they do have any rights at all. The various debates shed light on both the nature and value of rights, and on the moral status of children.
These matters, to be considered below, need also to be seen as closely tied to at least two other philosophical questions: what is childhood? (See the entry on childhood.) And, how do the putative rights of children stand in relation to the rights of those adults who, arguably, have rights over children? The first question is considered at length in Part I of Archard (2015). The second question broaches the issues of parental rights and responsibilities. (See the entry on procreation and parenthood.)
- 1. Children and Rights
- 2. Critics of Children's Rights
- 3. Liberationism
- 4. Arbitrariness
- 5. Children's Rights and Adult Rights
- 6. The Child's Right to Grow Up
- 7. Best Interests
- 8. The Right to be Heard
- 9. Summary
- Academic Tools
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries
Article 1 of the United Nations Convention defines a child as any human being below the age of eighteen years ‘unless,’ it adds, ‘under the law applicable to the child, majority is attained earlier’ (United Nations 1989). In what follows this definition will be assumed. Some think it obvious that children do have rights and believe that the only interesting question is whether children possess all and only those rights which adults possess. Others are sceptical believing that given the nature both of rights and of children it is wrong to think of children as right-holders.
One background worry against which such scepticism may be set is a currently oft-expressed concern at the proliferation of rights. Rights are, so it is alleged, now promiscuously ascribed in two ways. First, the list of right-holders has been extensively lengthened. Second, many more demands are expressed as rights claims. The concern is properly understood as one that the prodigality of rights attributions is damaging to the cause of rights. If you give away too many rights they may cease to have the value and significance they once had, and ought still to have. A favoured metaphor in this context is monetary: the inflation of rights talk devalues the currency of rights (Sumner 1987, 15; Steiner 1998, 233). That currency is indeed precious for it is almost universally accepted that rights, insofar as they exist, are things whose possession is of very great advantage to their owners.
This thought must trouble the defenders of children's rights since, after all, talk of children having rights has post-dated the introduction and general acceptance of rights talk as such. There are, however, more particular reasons for being suspicious of the idea that children have rights. To appreciate these it is necessary to be clearer about the language of rights. With respect to rights in general we can inquire as to what it is for someone to have a right, or, put another way, we can ask what being a right-holder consists in. There are here two competing accounts, one of which is seen as fatal to the idea of children as right-holders. We can ask a different question, namely what must be true for there to be rights. That is, we can try to specify what have been called the ‘existence conditions for rights’ (Sumner 1987, 10–11). We can also construct a taxonomy of the different kinds of rights. Finally we can ask what the moral significance of having a right is, or what weight rights have. Some for instance have viewed rights as being absolute such that the fact of a person's possession of a right is sufficient to outweigh or discount all other moral considerations (Nozick 1974). Others believe the possession of rights to be a weighty consideration but not so weighty as to outbalance every other moral claim. With regard to any acknowledged right we can identify it by means of its content (what is it a right to?) and its scope (who has it and against whom do they have it?), as well as its weight relative to other rights and to other moral considerations. Some believe that rights never conflict. But, if they do, we need to know which right should have priority. Not all of these questions are relevant when we want to focus on the particular issue of whether or not children have rights, and, if so, which ones. However the first question raised above is especially salient.
What is it for someone to have a right? Here there are two competing theories whose respective virtues and vices have been extensively debated without either gaining evident or agreed supremacy. In one camp is the will or choice theory (Hart 1973; Sumner 1987; Steiner 1994); in the opposing camp is the welfare or interest theory (MacCormick 1982; Raz 1984; Kramer 1998). The first theory sees a right as the protected exercise of choice. In particular to have a right is to have the power to enforce or waive the duty of which the right is the correlative. What it means, on this theory, for me to have the right to education is for me to have the option of enforcing the duty of some other person or persons to provide me with an education, or to discharge them from the responsibility of doing so. The second theory sees a right as the protection of an interest of sufficient importance to impose on others certain duties whose discharge allows the right-holder to enjoy the interest in question. What it means, on this theory, to have a right to education is for me to have an interest in being educated which is so important that others are under an enforceable duty to provide me with an education. It is natural to think that each theory is more appropriate for certain kinds of rights. The will theory fits rights actively to do things (to speak, to associate with others) whereas the interest theory fits rights passively to enjoy or not to suffer things (to receive health care, not to be tortured). However the distinction between the theories of what it is to have a right is not the distinction between different kinds of rights, even if there are important relations between the two distinctions.
The will and the interest theory is each alleged to have failings. But interestingly in this present context one defect of the will theory is—so its critics argue—its exclusion of some humans from the category of right-holders. This is because whilst all humans, and perhaps many classes of non-humans such as animals, have interests that ought to be protected, not all humans have the capacity to exercise choice. Children—along with the severely mentally disabled and the comatose—cannot thus, on the will theory, be the holders of rights. For at least one prominent defender of the interest theory the fact that children evidently do have rights is sufficient to display the falsity of the will theory, thus making children a ‘test-case’ for the latter (MacCormick 1982). Of course someone who is convinced of the correctness of the will theory might readily concede that the theory entails the denial of rights to children but see no reason to abandon the theory. For her the entailment is not, ‘Children have rights. Therefore, the will theory is false’. It is, ‘The will theory is true. Therefore, children cannot have rights’.
Obviously different claims are being made and the same claims are playing distinct roles in different arguments. The claims in question can be set out as follows:
- Rights are protected choices
- Only those capable of exercising choices can be right-holders
- Children are incapable of exercising choice
- Children are not right-holders
- Adults have duties to protect the important interests of children
- Rights and duties are correlative
- Children are right-holders
To explain (6). An important claim held by many is that for each and every right there is a correlative duty. To say that I have a right to something is to say that someone else has a duty to me in respect of that thing. The correlate rights and duties are, as it were, simply the two sides of one and the same single coin. This of course does not mean that there may not be some kinds of duties which do not correlate with any rights. Indeed some critics of children's rights will concede that adults have duties to protect important interests of children but deny that these interests correlate with rights held by children. Now clearly (4) and (7) contradict one another: either children are right-holders or they are not. (4) follows from (2) and (3). (2) expresses the will theory. (3) is obviously a contestable, and contested, claim. But insofar as children cannot exercise choice and are required to do so on the will theory if they are to have rights, then it follows that they cannot have rights. (7), on the other hand, follows from (5) and (6) which give expression to the interest theory, although they do so only insofar as the duties adults have in respect of children are such that they do correlate with rights held by children. If they do then as things stand either the will theory is true and children do not have rights, or the interest theory is true and they do. Or, put another way, either children have rights in which case the will theory cannot be true, or they do not in which case that theory could be true.
How might the various protagonists in these debates respond to these different claims? A will theorist who did not want to deny that children have rights might deny (2). He might say that although it is true that children are themselves incapable of exercising choice it does not follow that they cannot still be possessors of rights. For children might have representatives, such as most obviously their parents or guardians, who could exercise the choices on behalf of the children. The representatives would choose for the children as the children would choose if they were capable of choosing for themselves. This proxy exercise of choice would take place only during the period when the children were incapable of exercising choice and in acknowledgment of the fact that the children will eventually be capable of exercising their own choices. In short children still have rights but the choices, which are constitutive of these rights according to the will theory, are made by representatives of the children. The will theory's most prominent defender (Hart 1973, 184 n. 86) makes just such a modification of the will theory in respect of children.
Now such a modification must meet a number of challenges. First, how should the representatives be selected? Should those empowered to act as representatives be those who are most likely to choose as the children would choose if capable, or are there are other independent grounds on which they are selected—such, as most obviously, that they are the child's parents? Think of the representation of children as like a trust. The children entrust their decision-making to their representatives who are thus their trustees. Now, second, are the terms of the trust sufficiently clear and determinate? Is it, for instance, perspicuous and evident what a child would choose if capable of choosing? Note that the criterion is not what is in the best interests of the child for, consistent with the will theory, we must appeal to choices rather than interests. It is not easy to say what some adult who cannot currently choose—because she is, for instance, temporarily comatose—would choose if able. It is even harder in the case of someone, a child, who is for the period of childhood simply incapable of making any choices. Third, how is the trust to be enforced and by whom? The representative may be presumed to have a duty to choose as the child would choose if able. If rights are correlative with duties then someone other than the representative and the child must be in a position to enforce or waive this duty. Could this be the state or its representative?
These are formidable challenges but assuming they can be met it is within the resources of the will theory to accord rights to children. That is significant for it means that children are not a straightforward ‘test-case’ for determining which theory of rights is correct. There are, moreover, two further responses that can be made by the will theorist to the claims listed earlier that challenge the presuppositions of the interest theory. First she might accept (6)—that rights and duties are correlative—but deny or at least significantly modify (5)—that adults have duties to protect the important interests of children. She could say that the duties that are rightly specified under (5) are not the duties that correlate with rights. This is just to say, as all rights theorists will repeatedly say, that rights do not exhaust the moral domain. What we must do because others have rights against us is not everything we must morally do. There are duties beyond those rights-correlated duties. For each and every right there is a correlate duty. This how (6) should be understood. But (6) is not the claim that for each and every duty there is a correlate right. So we should, as adults, ensure that the interests of children are protected and promoted. It does not follow that they have rights against us. In just the same way we ought not cruelly and gratuitously to maltreat animals but we need not think that it follows from this that animals are right-holders.
Second a will theorist might accept (5) and (6) as they stand but say that the rights which correlate with these duties are possessed not by the children but by adults who are in the best position to protect the children. Thus even if the duties adults have in respect of children do correlate with rights it does not follow that the rights in question are held by those whose interests they protect. Indeed it might be argued that it does not matter whether the rights are possessed by those whose interests they protect. The point can be pressed home by asking whether it really matters whether the rights that correlate with adult duties to children are held by the children or by those who would act as best they could for the children (Steiner 1998, 261).
This review of the will and interest theory has not considered other reasons—independent of the implications of either theory for the question of whether or not children have rights—for favouring either theory. It has simply examined the issue of whether the denial of children's rights can be thought of as a test case for the probity of the will theory. Of course even if it is not such a test case there may be other considerations that tell against the will theory and in favour of the interest theory. Or it may be that on balance the interest theory is preferable to the will theory whether or not the latter denies rights to children.
Grant that on either account of what it is to have a right children could, in principle, be the holders of rights. We may now address the further questions Ought children to have rights? And, if so, what rights should they have? Note that the rights can be moral or legal. Children do have rights in law (under the UN Convention most notably). These need not be accepted as moral rights. However someone could believe that the best way, on balance, to protect the interests of children is by continuing to accord them the legal rights they have under something like the Convention. Someone might also believe that children should have legal rights but not those they are currently accorded. Conversely, if children do have moral rights, these need not be enshrined in law, although there would evidently be a strong presumption that they should. In the first instance the question is whether children should have moral rights. If they should then there would be a good case for thinking that these should be legally protected rights.
Should children have rights? There are those who claim that children should have all the rights that adults presently have. These are called ‘liberationists’ and include Holt, Farson and Cohen (Farson 1974; Holt 1975; Cohen 1980). We can distinguish real from rhetorical liberationists. The latter are those who see the demand for equal rights for children as a means both of drawing attention to the discrimination that children suffer by comparison with adults in their treatment and for improving their condition. A rhetorical liberationist does not actually believe that children should be the equals of adults. Rather he thinks that claiming as much is the best way of advancing their interests. A real liberationist does view children as the equals of adults. Their case will be considered in due course. Then there are those who think that children should have some but not all of the rights which adults have.
Finally there are those who think that children should not have any rights. Or, put less brusquely, they are sceptical, for theoretical and political reasons, about attributing rights to children. Their case is made in three ways. The first is to assert what liberationists deny, namely that children are not qualified as adults are to have rights. The second is to argue that the ascription of rights to children is inappropriate because it displays a misunderstanding of what childhood is, what children are like, or what relationships children stand in to adults. The third is to argue that, notwithstanding their lack of rights, children can be assured of adequate moral protection by other means.
Let me take the first claim first. The question of qualification is the question of whether children have the requisite capacity for rights. On the will theory of rights the capacity to exercise choice is a necessary condition of having a right. If children lack such a capacity they cannot, on the will theory at least, possess rights. If they do have a capacity of choice then, on the will theory at least, they can have rights. The relevant capacity qualifying children for possession of rights is that of the ability to choose. But there is a more general issue of capacity that is in dispute whatever theory of rights is defended and that follows from attention to the fact that rights have a content. Each right is a right to do, to be or to have something. Arguably only those rights can be possessed whose content can be appropriately attributed to their owners. A right to free speech cannot properly be possessed by an entity incapable of speech. One conventional way to think of rights in terms of their content is to distinguish between liberty rights (rights to choose, such as to vote, practise a religion, and to associate) and welfare rights (rights that protect important interests such as health).
Children in general lack certain cognitive abilities—to acquire and to process information in an ordered fashion, to form consistent and stable beliefs, to appreciate the significance of options and their consequences. They also lack certain volitional abilities—to form, retain and act in the light of consistent desires, to make independent choices. Children are not unique amongst humans in this respect. Those adults who are seriously mentally impaired are also disqualified in this sense. Which is of course just to say that these adults are childlike. Children are unique in the following regard. Not all humans are seriously mentally impaired, but all humans were once children. Thus every one of us was, during our early years, not qualified to be a holder of rights even if now we are so qualified.
It is worth distinguishing – as Schapiro (1999, 2003) does – between two ways in which a child is, relative to an adult, incapable. Schapiro argues that childhood is a 'normative predicament' wherein the child is in a state of nature, lacking any independent will whereby she might authoritatively and in her own voice order her desires. She is an 'instinctual wanton'. On her account the capacities a child lacks are not those of making good choices, but those of making any choices as such.
A child's incapacity, in the senses indicated above, would seem to disqualify them from having liberty rights. Someone incapable of choosing cannot have a right whose content is a fundamental choice. If, as some maintain, all human rights are best interpreted as protecting human agency and its preconditions, then it would follow that those incapable of agency, such as young children, should not be accorded human rights (Griffin 2002). On the other hand it could be maintained that whilst children lack agency they certainly have fundamental interests meriting protection and thus at least have welfare rights (Brighouse 2002). Moreover it can be important to recognise that children become beings capable of making choices and that rights may be attributed in recognition of this gradual development (Brennan 2002).
Turning now to the second claim that may be made in denying rights to children which is that the ascription of rights to children is inappropriate because it displays a misunderstanding of what childhood is, of what children are like, or of what relationships children do or ought to stand in to adults. This claim comes in various forms.
On one view we should start our thinking about what morally we owe to children by specifying our obligations as adults to them (O'Neill 1988). There certainly exist what are called perfect obligations. These are obligations that are either owed to all children or to some specified set of children. They are perfect in that it is completely specified whom they are owed to and what is owed to them. We all are obliged not to maltreat any child and parents have a particular duty to care for their children. But then there are imperfect obligations which are those of caring for children to whom we do not, as parents for instance, have specific obligations. All adults owe these but they are not owed to all children (how could they possibly be?) nor is it specified what precisely is owed to them (this will depend on circumstances).
Perhaps then we can agree that we are all under a duty to prevent the abuse of children. But clearly we cannot, as individuals, each act to stop every child being abused. Moreover what we ought to do—for instance, by reporting suspected cases of abuse—will depend on the circumstances, and also on what is in place by way of particular institutions and laws to deal with child abuse.
Crucially whilst perfect obligations correlate with rights, imperfect obligations do not. This means that anyone who starts and finishes thinking about what morally is owed to children in terms of their rights is unable to capture what imperfect obligations express. Yet this is to miss much of what is most important about the way in which, morally, we should as adults stand in relation to children. For the fulfilment of these imperfect duties of care and concern is what centrally protects and promotes the lives of children as children. Thinking ethically about children's lives in terms of their putative rights is to misperceive what is of central importance and value in these lives.
One possible response to O'Neill's argument is as follows (Coady 1992). She does not deny that perfect obligations correlate with rights. Thus to the extent that we do have perfect obligations to children they do have corresponding rights. Yet O'Neill denies that imperfect obligations correlate with rights. But why should we think that? The imperfect obligations are fundamental ones. They are not supererogatory, that is beyond duty. Adults must show consideration and kindness to children in general. So why cannot children claim such kindness and consideration from adults as their right? O'Neill does say that when imperfect obligations are institutionalised—when, for instance there are laws and institutions specifying who should act and how to detect and prevent child abuse—there are created positive special obligations to which correspond positive rights. But she adds that the obligations of, say, the social worker exceed the positive obligations associated with her job. However this is true of all our obligations, whether perfect or imperfect. A parent can have positive, that is legally recognised and sanctioned, duties to her child. She may, for instance, have no choice but to send her child to school. Yet her perfect obligations to her children are not exhaustively specified by what the law requires of her.
O'Neill's argument does not rely on any specification of the content of the obligations that might be owed by adults to children. Rather it is about the structure of our moral reasoning in respect of children, and the priority—false in the argument's view—that is given to rights. As an argument it thus bears some comparison with a view that expresses general scepticism about rights in the context of adult-child relations and which emphasises the particular character of the family (Schrag 1980; Schoeman 1980). This view draws attention to the quality and nature of the relationships within a family. These are marked by an especial intimacy and by deep, unconditional love between its members. One can grant that many families do not conform to this ideal and yet acknowledge that when the family does conform to the ideal it is a distinctive, and distinctively valuable, form of human association.
What arguably follows from this ideal of the family is the inappropriateness of asserting or claiming rights. For to do so would be to subvert and ultimately destroy what constitutes the family as the distinctive form of human association it is. Appeal is being made here to a familiar and oft-drawn distinction between two ways in which individuals engaged in a common enterprise or bound together in some enduring association can be assured of their beneficent, or at least minimally good, treatment of one another. One way is by the recognition—in law or custom or shared morality—of rights that all individuals can claim, or by rules of justice—similarly and generally recognised—which provide an assurance of fair treatment. Another way is by reliance on the dispositions or attitudes that the individuals bound together have—spontaneously and naturally—towards one another. Thus, for instance, if each is motivated by general benevolence in respect of all then no one has any need to claim or assert what is due to him as of right or rule. In the case of the family, it is argued, neither justice nor benevolence suffices but love does. Of course children may have rights against those who are not family members (a right, for instance, that their school teachers provide them with information and skills). Some rights are held against particular individuals. Others, including the most important ones, are held against everyone, including parents and other family members
A further and quite distinct allegation is that not only is there no need for any such claims, but that allowing them to be made will erode, and in due course destroy, the dispositions and attitudes that rendered the need for rights and rules of justices unnecessary in the first place. This further claim is an influential one in the general critique communitarianism makes, within political philosophy, of what is characterised as a rights-based and individualistic liberalism (see, for instance, Sandel 1982, 32–5). In the context of the family the claim is that granting its members rights will subvert and bring about the end of the love between them that made rights superfluous in the first place.
The arguments considered thus far have appealed to the role that rights generally do and should play in our moral lives. A further argument considers what would actually follow from granting rights to children (Purdy 1992). The argument is that we need as adults to have acquired certain traits of character if we are to be able to pursue our goals and lead a valuable life. To acquire these traits it is essential that we not be allowed as children to make our own choices. Granting children the liberty to exercise rights is destructive of the preconditions for the possibility of having fulfilling adult lives. The central, and empirical, premise in this argument is that children do not spontaneously and naturally grow into adults. They need to be nurtured, supported, and, more particularly, subjected to control and discipline. Without that context giving children the rights that adults have is bad for the children. It is also bad for the adults they will turn into, and for the society we share as adults and children.
The defence of the view that children should not, as the liberationist asserts, have all the rights that adults have has involved the following assertions. First, that children simply lack the capacities that qualify adults for the possession of rights. Second, that talk of children's rights does not capture the truth about their lives or about the family or that such talk encourages a destructive permissiveness that has poor consequences for adults and their society. The third step in defence of the denial of rights to children is to provide reassurance that such a denial is not bad for children.
One can thus maintain that rights do not exhaust the moral domain. There are things we ought to do which do not correspond to the obligations we have as the correlates of rights. As adults we should protect and promote the welfare of children. It need not follow that they have rights against us. To repeat, humans should not maltreat animals for no good reason but we can insist on this without giving animals rights.
But does not talk of the rights of children nevertheless still serve a political or rhetorical function by reminding of us of what must be done for them? Might not such talk also serve as a critique of the extent to which we, as adults, may maintain children in an artificial condition of dependence and vulnerability, denying them the opportunity to make their own choices? Are not children one of the last social groups to be emancipated as others—women, blacks—already have been, and is not the language of rights the appropriate mode in which to campaign for that emancipation? The reply (O'Neill 1988, 459– 463) is that such talk about rights talk misses what is distinctively different about children as a group. This is that childhood is not a permanently maintained status associated with oppression or discrimination. It is rather a stage of human development which all go through. Moreover the adults who deny that children do have rights may nevertheless also believe that it is their duty to ensure that the children for whom they have care do pass from childhood into adulthood.
The first claim in the defence of the denial of rights to children is that children are disqualified by virtue of their incapacity to have rights. Liberationists dispute this. Liberationists can allow that the key to the appropriateness of giving or not giving rights to children turns on capacity (Cohen 1980 ix). They will argue, however, that children are not disqualified from having rights by virtue of their lack of a capacity that adults do have. There are two respects in which this liberationist case might be modified or qualified. The first is in its scope. The liberationist might claim that all children are qualified to have rights, or she might claim only that some children are so qualified. The latter is the more plausible position in view of the fact that the very young infant is evidently incapacitated. Indeed some liberationists seem to recognise as much even whilst they insist that every child should have rights (Farson 1974, 31, 172, and 185). If the scope of the liberationist claim is thus limited it does not amount to the view that no line dividing human rights holders from humans who lack rights should be drawn. Rather it is the view that such a line has been drawn in the wrong place.
A second possible qualification of the liberationist view is that giving rights to children will play an important part in their acquiring the qualifying capacity. It is not thus argued that children are capable now and are illegitimately denied their rights. It is rather that they will only—or at least will more readily or will at an earlier stage—acquire that capacity if given their rights. The denial of rights to children is, on this account, one significant element in a culture that serves artificially to maintain children in their childlike state of dependence, vulnerability, and immaturity. Again the qualification can concede that children of a very young age are not capable enough to have rights, and will not acquire that capacity even if given rights. Yet it insists that the denial of rights to children of a certain age on account of their alleged incapacity is simply self-confirming. They cannot have rights because they are incapable but they are incapable only because they do not have these rights. Note that this seems most plausible when rights are legal. Children should be allowed at law to behave in ways that encourage their development into mature rights-holders.
One plausible version of the claim refers to the facts of experience. Children, or at least children of a certain age, may not differ markedly from adults in respect of their cognitive and volitional capacities. They may be as capable as older humans of making their own minds up about what to do and be as independent in their resolution to act on their choices. But they may simply not have had as much experience of the world as their adult counterparts. Being thus naïve and inexperienced in the ways of the world they will not be as able, that is as qualified, as older (and wiser) humans are to make sensible choices. Grant that such a lack of experience can be attributed to a lack of opportunities to exercise choice. If such a lack of opportunity is in turn attributable not simply to not having been around for as long but to a denial of the freedom to make their own choices, then there is a powerful case for liberty rights being extended, even if cautiously, to these young people.
There are different ways in which the liberationist claim about capacity—whether qualified or not—can be made. One is by defending a ‘thin’ definition of capacity. For example it may be said that children can make choices if what this means is expressing preferences. A child who says she wants x thereby chooses x. Of course the response is that the ability to choose, thus minimally defined, is indeed possessed by children (even fairly young children) but it is not a capacity sufficient to qualify for rights ownership. What is needed for that is more than simply the ability to express or communicate a desire; what is needed is an ability to understand and appreciate the significance of the options facing one, together with independence of choice. After all the animal who moves from one feeding bowl to another may be said thereby to ‘choose’ the food in the latter bowl. But the animal does not have a general capacity of choice sufficient to qualify it as a holder of liberty rights.
Liberationists might move in the other direction and argue that the capacity which qualifies adults to have rights is in fact not a capacity that most, or perhaps any, adults actually possess. Thus it will be said that no adult fully understands the nature of the choices she faces, nor is she consistent in her beliefs and desires, nor is she really independent of the influences of her environment and peers. Whether the liberationist urges a ‘thin’ definition of capacity—which the child satisfies as much as the adult—or argues that on a ‘thick’ definition of capacity neither adult nor child qualifies as capable, the point is the same. The point is that the alleged differences between children and adults in respect of a qualifying capacity are not sufficient to warrant the ascription of rights to the latter and their denial to the former.
This then is one way in which the charge that ‘[a]ny line which uses age to distinguish people with rights from people without can be shown to be arbitrary’ (Cohen 1980, 48) can be made. The line is arbitrary because, as a matter of fact, it does not mark a real division between capacities. However there is another way in which the charge is made. This turns on the idea that dividing lines as such—‘any’ lines—are arbitrary. Thus, either it will be said that the use of this particular age—whatever it happens to be—is arbitrary or it will be said that the use of any age is arbitrary. The two objections are as follows. This age is the wrong dividing point and this or any age is wrong. The first objection may concede that there is a better age to be used, just as the second objection may concede that there is a way, better than using age, to mark the division. The initial and obvious reply to the second objection is that age as such is not the issue but rather the reliable correlation of age with the acquisition of those capacities that qualify a person for the attribution of rights. The first objection—to the employment of a determinate qualifying age such as 18—assumes that there is some age at which the relevant capacities are acquired but maintains that it is not 18. Some liberationists might indeed qualify their claim in respect of scope. That is to say that they do not dispute that there should be a threshold age—one beyond which adult rights are acquired—but they do think that the conventional or orthodox threshold is fixed too late. Liberationists may also simply deny that there should be any threshold on the grounds that there just is no difference between children and adults in respect of their respective capacities for any threshold age to mark. This version of the arbitrariness claim concedes that if age functions as a threshold it does so only inasmuch as it correlates with the acquisition of capacities which it is agreed are necessary qualifications for the possession of rights. In sum, the arbitrariness claim amounts either to the denial that the acquisition of the specified capacities does correlate with the threshold in question or to the denial that there is any age at which the capacities are acquired.
Setting aside this version of the arbitrariness claim what remains of the charge that ‘[a]ny line which uses age to distinguish people with rights from people without can be shown to be arbitrary’? There are two ideas. The first is that although the threshold of age does serve to mark a difference within the class of human beings it is being human as such which is important. Or, relatedly, what is being distributed, namely rights, is so important that all humans should have them. It is being human which should make the difference not being of a certain age. Rights are too important to be denied to some humans on account of their (lesser) age and given to others on account of their (greater) age.
The reply is simple. Being human does matter and it is precisely because they are human beings, albeit young ones, that children are entitled to be treated in ways that non-humans, such as animals, are not. However it is rights that are being distributed and to that end a threshold age does mark a significant point. Although having rights is better than not having them, those who lack rights do not lack any moral status whatever. Children are acknowledged to be humans and yet to be young humans.
The second idea is this. The threshold age does not mark a significant enough difference. This is a point about marginal differences. A 40-year-old differs greatly from a 4-year-old. Someone who is 18 years and 1 month does not differ greatly from someone who is 17 years and 11 months. It is understandable that the 40-year-old should have rights whereas the 4-year-old should not. But this is not the case for the latter pairing. This is a point about the extent to which real differences between classes are displayed by the members of each class at the edge of these classes. The reply to this line of argument is as follows. The criticism concedes that there is a difference between being too young to have rights and being old enough to have them. These differences are not arbitrary. This difference is a real one and given that it needs to be acknowledged a threshold has to be fixed. The fact that there may not be significant—or significant enough—differences between the members of the two classes being distinguished at the edges of each class is the price one pays for having to operate with a threshold.
But is this price one that has to be paid? The problem in using age as a marker is as follows. It is not one's age as such that makes the difference. It is age insofar as it correlates with capacity, and it is one's capacity that qualifies one to have rights. The complaint is not ‘I am 17 years and 11 months. Why is one month so important?’ It is ‘I am 17 years and 11 months and may be just as capable as some who are only just 18’. The complaint is that age does not always reliably correlate with competence. Thus using age may risk unfairly penalising some who are in fact competent just as it may risk unfairly rewarding some who are in fact incompetent. Moreover the penalties and rewards in question—lacking or possessing rights—are far too important to run such risks. Why then should one not take each individual on her own and determine whether or not she is qualified be have rights?
The problems with the suggested use of a test are various. First, there is the sheer administrative scale of its employment in such a case as human rights. Second, there is the problem of agreeing a determinate procedure for testing. How exactly are we to examine someone in respect of their competence to possess rights? Third, there is the problem of fairness. Any test must not unfairly disqualify some group of putative rights-holders by, for instance, having a bias in the testing procedure which, in effect, discriminates against that group. Fourth, the administration of any official test—and especially one whose passing yields such important goods—is subject to the risks of corruption or of misuse for the self-interested ends of those administering it. Again this can not be true of the use of age as a threshold. To summarise, these problems attaching to the use of a test are large and insuperable. The charges of arbitrariness can be argued to be false or overstated. Children do differ from adults in respect of their competence to possess rights. A threshold of age may be the appropriate way to register that difference. One should, thus, acquire rights only on reaching a certain age. However, two riders to this summary are appropriate.
First, there is nothing wrong with the idea that different rights should be acquired at different ages. After all it is plausible to think that the capacities needed for, and qualifying a person to possess, different rights are themselves different. More particularly, different rights would seem to require different degrees of competence. Liberty rights entitle their possessors to make choices, and the matters in respect of which choices are made differ in their complexity, importance, and consequential impact. Those who are allowed to choose require greater or lesser amounts of maturity, independence, and deliberative proficiency in order to be able to make these different kinds of choice. The decisions to marry, consume alcohol, serve in the armed forces, undertake paid labour, vote, buy goods in a shop, travel unaccompanied, and open a bank account seem to presuppose different levels of understanding and autonomy. Assuming that these levels are progressively acquired at different ages it makes sense to accord the corresponding rights not all at once but in stages.
Second, and following on immediately from this first rider, if there is to be an ordered acquisition of rights it should display consistency. If children are assumed to display the competence required for one kind of right, they should not be refused another kind of right which presupposes the same or even a lesser degree of ability. It would not make sense, for instance, to deny a young person the right to refuse medical treatment but allow them to choose to die in the armed services of their state.
The liberationist may make one last move. He may concede that children do lack the capacities that are a prerequisite for the possession of rights. However he can suggest that children should be permitted ‘to borrow the capacities of others to secure whatever it is we are entitled to’ (Cohen 1980, 56). Child agents would advise their clients with a view to ensuring that the child's right is properly exercised. There are, however, various problems with this move. Most of these exactly parallel those discussed earlier that beset the idea of entrusting the choices of a child to a representative. First, who are to be the advisers? These may be selected by some fact, such as their biological kinship or their socially recognised role of guardianship, but this fact does not ensure that they will be the best advisers. A parent is not, by the mere fact of parenthood, qualified to give her children the best advice. On the other hand there is unlikely to be any clear fact of the matter as to who is the best adviser or what is the best advice. Indeed the various adults who might best advise a child could well give conflicting advice. Second, how is one to determine what should guide the advice? Is it what the child would herself choose if competent to choose or what is in the best interests of the child? The problems with understanding either determination will be discussed in Section 7. Third, is the child still free to act or not on the advice given? If the child is not so free then the role of the adviser is a strictly paternalist one. The ‘adviser’ is simply in a position to supplant the child's choice as to what is best for herself with her own choice as her adviser. If on the other hand the child is free to reject the adviser's advice then the child is free to do what she wants anyway. This is so even though it has been conceded that she is not competent to recognise what is in her best interests. In this case the role of adviser is beside the point.
One needs only to ‘borrow’ what one does not have. Not using what could be borrowed leaves one with the lack—and its consequences—that made the borrowing necessary. On the other hand if a child can distinguish good from bad advice then the borrowing is unnecessary. The child can give as good advice to herself as would be given to her by an adviser. But then no adviser is needed and this is precisely what Cohen denies.
If children can have at least some rights, what rights should they have? One important reason for asking, and for giving a satisfactory answer to, this question is a concern that the child's moral status should be adequately secured and protected. Some, like Onora O'Neill, believe that this is assured by discharging our obligations as adults to children. It can also be maintained that there are things we ought not to do to children, just as there are things we ought not to do to animals, without believing that animals or children have rights. But children are not animals. They are human beings. Ought they not then to have the basic rights that humans have?
One thought would be that although children are entitled to the same moral consideration as adults it does not follow that children should possess the same package of rights as adults. Since children are humans they are surely entitled to the basic human rights. But there are some rights possessed by adults which children cannot possess. This is a view defended by Brennan and Noggle (Brennan and Noggle 1997). The rights which adults possess are ‘role-dependent rights’. These are rights associated with particular roles, and possession of the relevant right is dependent on an ability to play the role. Thus doctors have rights that their patients do not, and car-drivers have rights that those who have not passed their driving test do not. This argument is interesting not least because it does not provide, in respect of their rights, a fundamental distinction between adults and children. After all some adults could conceivably possess no more than the basic rights possessed by children since they might have none of the abilities required to play any of the roles associated with the role-dependent rights.
However it is not obvious that children do have the basic human rights that adults have. Central amongst these rights is that of self-determination, that is the right to make choices in respect of one's own life. This right is the basis of derivative rights to marry, have sex, choose one's work, purse a course of education, and so on. But it is just this right that is normally denied to children, and it seems that Noggle and Brennan do deny, in effect, that children have this right. If parents can, as Brennan and Noggle think they may, overrule a child's life-choice it is hard to see how nevertheless the right of choice does not vanish (Brennan and Noggle 1997, 16–17). If one adult were to deny that another adult could choose as she wished it would be natural to describe this as a denial of the second adult's right of choice.
To say that children do not have all the basic human rights that adults do is not to deny them their status as humans. After all it makes sense to insist that children, but not animals, have a basic right to life. Vegetarians who think it immoral to kill animals for food do not—as they could—protect animals from being killed by other animals. They do not require a predatory species not to violate the rights of its animal victims. But we do think children have a right to be protected and that we should enforce the duty on adults not to harm them. It also makes sense, as suggested, to say that children do not have an adult right of self-determination. It is controversial to say that children are ‘persons’, since, following John Locke, this term denotes those possessed of moral agency and capable of being responsible for their actions. Weaker or stronger conceptions of ‘personhood’ would lead to the inclusion or exclusion of humans at various ages from the category of person. However it is not controversial to state that children are human, and in saying this to insist that they are entitled to a certain moral regard
Most who believe that adults have rights which children do not have make the cut between liberty and welfare rights. Feinberg distinguishes between rights that belong only to adults (A-rights), rights that are common to both adults and children (A-C-rights), and rights that children alone possess (C-rights) (Feinberg 1980). Thus a common position is that the A-rights include, centrally, the liberty rights, and that the A-C-rights include, centrally, the welfare rights. To repeat, liberty rights are rights of choice (how and whether to vote, what to say publicly, whether to practise a religion and which one, which if any association to join, and so on) whereas welfare rights protect important interests (such as health, bodily integrity, and privacy).
What might be included in the C-rights? Feinberg distinguishes between two sub-classes of C-rights. There are, first, those rights which children possess in virtue of their condition of childishness. Although Feinberg does not further divide this first sub-class of C-rights this can be done. There are the rights children have to receive those goods they are incapable of securing for themselves, and are incapable of so doing because of their dependence upon adults. These goods might include food and shelter. There are, second, the rights to be protected against harms which befall children because of their childlike vulnerability and whose particular harmfulness is a function of a fact that they befall children. These harms might include abuse and neglect. Finally, there are goods that children should arguably receive just because they are children. The most central, and contentious, example is a child's right to be loved. This is not an A-C-right but it is arguably a C-right, and indeed is cited by many as a C-right (MacCormick 1976, 305). Various declarations of children's rights include such a right and a respectable case can be made to meet the various objections normally raised against its attribution (Liao 2006).
These C-rights can be termed ‘protection’ rights since, in general, they seek to provide protection for children. Further they do so because the state or condition of childhood calls forth and requires this protection. We should be careful to distinguish protection from welfare rights. Children, along with adults, have welfare rights but the content of these will differ between children and adults. It will do so because of the particular form that children's needs and circumstances take. Thus grant that both children and adults have a welfare right to health care. In the case of children but not that of adults paediatric care and treatment is appropriate. But that fact is no different in its significance from the fact that amongst different adults the proper form of health care should vary in line with their various disabilities, diseases, and circumstances.
The second sub-class of C-rights are those which Feinberg characterises as ‘rights-in-trust’ and which he thinks can be resumed under the single title of a ‘right to an open future’. These are the rights given to the child in the person of the adult she will become. They are the rights whose protection ensures that, as an adult, she will be in a position to exercise her A- and A-C-rights to the maximal or at least to a very significant degree. They keep her future open. Such rights impose limits on the rights of parents, and also impose duties on the part of the state to protect these rights.
A couple of things are worth noting about these rights-in-trust. First, Feinberg refers to these C-rights as ‘anticipatory autonomy rights’, which might suggest that they are only A-rights-in-trust. But he also speaks, within a page, of rights-in-trust of class C as protecting those future interests a child will have as an adult. This implies that they are also anticipatory welfare rights (Feinberg 1980, 126–7). Hence this sub-class of C-rights ensures that the adult can later exercise both her A-rights (liberty) and her A-C-rights (welfare).
Second, there is the question of how open a child's future should be. Some interpret the demand for an education for an ‘open future’ as requiring individuals to acquire ‘to the greatest possible extent’ the capacity to choose between ‘the widest possible variety of ways of life’ (Arneson and Shapiro1996, 388). They have pointed out several objections to such a ‘maximising’ interpretation. It may not be possible to quantify in a determinate fashion the number of options open to a future adult. Furthermore some fulfilling life choices are only available at the expense of denying the child a number of otherwise possible choices. For instance, a child intensively trained to realise his considerable innate musical abilities may be unable to pursue careers that would have been open to him in the absence of such a dedicated education. The following further criticisms can be added. Requiring that a child be brought up to be able eventually to choose between as many options as possible may impose unreasonable burdens on parents. It also seems implausible to think that a child suffers if she is denied one or even several possible insignificant further options beyond some threshold number of choices. Is it really harmful to a child that she does not learn to play all of the orchestral instruments and is thereby denied the opportunity to pursue a solo career in those she does not? Finally some future options are surely morally base or in some other respect without value (Mills 2003).
Feinberg does sometimes talk only of the harms of closing off significant life choices. Yet he does also on occasion employ the language of maximisation. ‘[Education] should send [the child] out into the adult world with as many open opportunities as possible, thus maximising his chances for self-fulfillment’. (1980, 135; see also 151). However it seems much more plausible to suggest that a child should have enough autonomy to be able to make reasonable life choices. The preconditions of autonomy are both internal (a capacity to think for oneself, to acquire and appreciate relevant information, and a volitional ability to act independently) and external (the provision of a range of feasible and valuable options). In respect of both conditions it is perfectly possible to have a good sense of what counts as adequate autonomy, even if there is no clear bright line marking the point of sufficiency.
Closely related to Feinberg's idea of ‘rights-in-trust’ is Eekelaar's idea of a child's ‘developmental’ rights (Eekelaar 1986). These are the rights of a child to develop her potential so that she enters adulthood without disadvantage. Whereas Feinberg attributes the rights to the child's adult-self, the child holding them only in ‘anticipatory’ form, Eekelaar attributes the rights to the adult's child-self. Arguably this makes no difference since the child and the adult are one and the same person. Although this is a metaphysically contentious claim (Parfit 1984) grant that child and adult are merely distinct temporal stages of a single individual. Child and adult are one and the same person. Whether each temporal stage of the person has the same interest in the child developing into an adult is a further issue which will be considered shortly.
However child and adult do stand in an asymmetrical relationship to one another in a way that does not seem to be true of the different temporal stages of the same adult. After all adult Smith can now exercise her liberty rights in such a fashion that at a later time she is not able to exercise them and her welfare rights, to the same degree as she can now. Smith can, for instance, choose now to enter into a slavery contract or to engage in a dangerous sport that risks death or serious disability. A child, on the other hand, is denied the right to make choices that will fetter the adult exercise of her rights. This is justified by three thoughts. First, a child, unlike an adult, simply lacks the ability to make considered choices and should not have liberty rights. An adult can make unwise choices but is presumed to possess a general capacity which the child lacks to make wise choices. Or at least we think that an adult has a minimal capacity to make choices which the child lacks, even if a particular adult throughout her life makes suboptimal choices. Second, what is done or not done in childhood affects the whole of one's later life and does so in a way that is largely irreversible. Third, a life in which choices can be made is more valuable than one in which they cannot. So the preconditions for the possibility of such a life should be secured. That is just to say that the child must allow for the possibility of becoming its adult self.
However consider the case of a child who will not develop into an adult, say someone who is suffering from a terminal disease that will prevent her living beyond the age of majority. Such a child lacks developmental rights. Or rather she has them but her circumstances do not allow for their protection. However, she does still have welfare and protection rights whose correlate duties can be discharged. The child has an interest in not suffering harm and in enjoying a certain standard of life even if she never lives beyond her childhood.
When, for instance, we provide a child with health care or protect her from abuse we not only thereby serve her immediate interests as a child but we also ensure that she will grow into a mentally and physically healthy adult. At its simplest a child's welfare right not to be killed is a precondition of the very possibility of there being a future adult with any rights at all. Even the education of a child can be represented as not merely of instrumental worth to the future adult but of value to the child here and now. A child has an interest now in learning things and does so independently of what this might later mean for her future adult self. (Coady 1992, 51).
What kind of adult does her childhood self have an interest in developing into? The answer to this question is important not least for indicating appropriate constraints on any parental upbringing. There is a very influential and recognisably liberal view of what sort of adult a child has an interest in developing into. This is an autonomous individual, one able independently to evaluate and to choose as appropriate its own ends. On the liberal view a child is not autonomous but can with the proper upbringing become autonomous. This view is most directly contrasted with a conception of the individual as equipped with a set of values and beliefs, authoritatively acquired during its childhood as a result of its upbringing, and not open to revision, or at least not open to any substantial revision. However an emphasis upon the capacity to revise one's ends may be at the expense of a deeper understanding of autonomy as a capacity rationally to adhere to some ends (Callan 2002).
Returning to the case of the child with the terminal illness. She will not develop into an adult. If the child had a choice could we say of her that she had a warranted interest in not developing into an adult? Grant that the child-Q and the adult-Q are two stages of one and the same individual. Could we speak of a conflict between the present interest of child-Q in staying a child and the future interest of adult-Q in child-Q developing into her later adult self? The latter interest seems perfectly straightforward. However it is at least controversial whether all adults do have an interest in growing up. We do simply assume that for humans existence is preferable to non-existence. However it has been argued that it is true of human beings that it is better that they never existed than that they do exist. It would then be true that children would not regret coming into existence and that existing adults are duty bound not to procreate (Benatar 2008). That will certainly strike most people as wildly implausible. Nevertheless it may be true of some humans that not growing into adulthood and ceasing to exist is better than becoming an adult. This might be true, for instance, of somebody facing the prospect of a life of unrelieved, extreme pain and misery.There is an extensive philosophical literature on ‘wrongful life’ cases—those where we judge that it was wrong to permit a child to be brought into existence. Much turns on whether we can talk of harming someone by bringing them into existence (Feinberg 1987). However it is widely acknowledged that this kind of case—which involves comparing non-existence with the possibility of existence—is different from that in which we compare the continuation of life for someone already existent and their ceasing to exist.Given that we can make this comparison it makes sense to ask whether it would be in the interests of a person—in both their child- and adult-selves—to continue to exist. Grant that, in general, adults do have an interest in their child-selves developing into adults. What sense can be made of the child's interest in staying a child?
Such an interest cannot be physically satisfied in this world. It is satisfied in the fictional world of Peter Pan but the author of that fantasy, J.M. Barrie, clearly deprecates his eponymous hero's infantile desire to escape the realities of the world (Barrie 1995). If we mean only by the imagined interest that of remaining childish then it is hard to see how individual in our world could, if rational, have such an interest. It is one thing to be a child forever in a child's world as Peter Pan is. It is quite another to remain a child in our adult world. Childhood is something best appreciated by the child. It is also something that needs to be left behind. In the words of Paul, ‘When I was a child, I spoke as a child, I understood as a child, I thought as a child: but when I became a man I put away these childish things’ (I Corinthians 13:11).
If children are not thought to have the A-rights, and, chiefly, do not have the liberty rights to choose for themselves how to conduct their lives, nevertheless they are not morally abandoned to their own devices. In the first place it is a standard principle of child welfare law and policy that the ‘best interests’ of a child should be promoted. Article 3.1 of the United Nations Convention on the Rights of the Child states that ‘In all actions concerning children, whether undertaken by public or private social welfare institutions, courts of law, administrative authorities or legislative bodies, the best interests of the child shall be a primary consideration’ (United Nations 1989).
Second, Article 12.1 of the Convention asserts that, ‘States Parties shall assure to the child who is capable of forming his or her own views the right to express those views freely in all matters affecting the child, the views of the child being given due weight in accordance with the age and maturity of the child’ (United Nations 1989).
Section 8 discusses the right to be heard. This section discusses the best interest principle, henceforward the BIP. The principle has been given different explicit formulations. Indeed it should be noted that the principle's possible definitions vary in at least two important dimensions: what is being given weight, and how much weight it is being given. Thus we may speak of a child's ‘best interests’ or simply of a child's ‘interests’ or ‘welfare’. The former is the more familiar version of the principle and it is this understanding of the principle that will be discussed. The difficulties with this maximising interpretation will be considered in due course.
As to the weight of the principle the distinct terms ‘paramount’ and ‘primary’ have been employed, along with either the definite or indefinite article, to qualify the consideration that should be given to a child's (best) interests. There are therefore at least four possible weightings: (a) the paramount; (b) a paramount; (c) the primary; (d) a primary. A fifth—that a child's (best) interests should merely be ‘a consideration’—is otiose. Some consideration should obviously be given to a child's interests. The question however is how much. The distinction between ‘paramount’ and ‘primary’ may be understood as follows. A consideration that is paramount outranks and trumps all other considerations. It is, in effect, the only consideration determinative of an outcome. A consideration that is ‘primary’ is a leading consideration, one that is first in rank among several. But although no considerations outrank a primary consideration there may be other considerations of equal, first rank. Furthermore a leading consideration does not trump even if it outranks all other considerations. A primary consideration is not the only consideration determinative of an outcome.
So it should be evident that (a) and (b) are equivalent, and that the real contrast is between a paramount consideration that trumps all others and a primary one that need not. In effect the interesting choice is between (a) and (d). That is, one between a child's (best) interests being the only consideration and their being an important but not the sole consideration. Indeed a debate took place as to which of these two versions should be included within the UN Convention on the Rights of the Child with the weaker formulation being eventually adopted (Alston 1994 12). The difficulties with the idea that a child's (best) interests are the only consideration in the determination of any issues will be discussed further in due course.
We can speak either of ‘a’ child or, more generally, of ‘children’. There is a difference between considering how in some matter the child most directly concerned is affected and considering how any policy or action in respect of that one child may also have consequences for other children. Indeed we might consider how any policy or action at all has implications—even if very indirect and attenuated—for all children. However, it is plausible to construe a use of ‘children’ within a formulation of the BIP as requiring us to attend to the impact of a policy, practice, or activity upon those young persons most obviously and directly affected. The BIP's origins are to be found in custody disputes where the law had to make a determination in respect of a couple's children. Even if there were several children the court had to decide in respect of each individual child what was the most appropriate course of action. The provenance of the BIP shows itself in the continued use of the singular term ‘child’.
There is a still further question of how we should understand the scope of the best-interests principle. The BIP has operated in at least two important domains (Kopelman 1997a). One is in the medical context when determining which option should be selected for an ill or diseased child. The second is in custody disputes following the separation or divorce of the child's guardians. Here, where there is unresolved argument as to who should now raise the child, the court must decide. However, beyond these two specified domains, the BIP has also been given broader application in respect of all policies and laws affecting children. This is certainly what the UN Convention Article 3.1 appears to require.
There are at least two kinds of difficulty in accepting the BIP (for a summary of various criticisms see Kopelman 1997b). The first of these concerns the import of the principle, the second concerns how we should interpret ‘best interests’. Each will be considered in turn. As to its import the BIP is, in the first instance, a maximising maxim. It requires that the best shall be done for a child and not simply that good or enough must be done. One must act ‘so as to promote maximally the good’ of the child (Buchanan and Brock 1989, 10).
In some contexts where the BIP operates there appears to be a determinate number of options, and perhaps even only a pair of options. This seems to be the case in custody disputes and medical decision-making. Where each divorced parent lays claim to exclusive custody to the child, no other party has any claim, and no compromise is possible, there are only two possibilities. In this context the better option is the best. The same is true when the decision is simply whether or not to pursue or to abstain from a course of medical treatment. By contrast in the area of general policy affecting children there seem to be very many different possibilities. Yet even with custody and medical decisions we can expand the range of possible options. Thus what might be best for the child is not that she is cared for by either of the parents claiming custody, but that she is adopted by someone else entirely. Again, what might be best for the child is not that she receive the medical treatment on offer rather than not do so, though it may well be better that she does. What is best is that she is treated by the most skilled medical personnel within the finest medical facility, with no expense spared, and so on.
But then the obvious criticism of the BIP is that it is unfeasibly demanding of agencies charged with the care of children. Should we really demand that our law and policy makers do the best for children rather than charge them with doing enough for children? We do not, it seems, require parents to promote their children's best interests. Nor should we. Indeed the standard principles of child welfare policy, even when they include a version of the best-interests maxim, do not stipulate that a child's parents shall do more than ensure that the child receives a threshold of care. Beyond that parents are not normally required maximally to promote their child's interests, and indeed they have considerable discretion as to how they raise the child. So the BIP is not best interpreted as a maximising principle. We should do so much for a child; we should not be obliged to do everything that in principle we might do.
A second problem of the import of the BIP is that it does not, as it stands, take account of the interests of others. In the first place I might be able to improve the situation of child A but only at the cost of worsening that of child B. It is natural to think that the interests of all children should be weighed equally. Hence the BIP ought to be read as requiring us impartially to promote the best interests of each and every child. Of course the BIP directs courts, social workers or medical practitioners in some case to promote the interests of a particular child. But this should not be done by treating the interests of any other child who might be affected as having no value or a lesser value than those of the particular child attended to. It would not be reasonable to expect that parents should view the interests of their own children as having the same weight as that of other children. It is reasonable to ask policy makers and care professionals to do so.
In the second place we cannot be required to promote the best interests of a child over and above, and without regard to, the interests of any relevant adult. It might be in the best interests of a child that her guardian give up every waking minute to her care. But no adult should have to sacrifice her own welfare for that of her child. The BIP should thus be interpreted so as to give at least equal consideration to the interests of any adults affected by policies and actions promoting the child's welfare.
The second set of difficulties surrounding the BIP concern the interpretation of ‘best interests’. One way to understand this phrase is by reference to what a child would choose for herself under specified hypothetical circumstances. We could call this the ‘hypothetical choice’ interpretation of the BIP. The other way to understand ‘best interests’ is simply through offering an account of what is, as a matter of fact, best for the child, an account which is distinct from and independent of the child's desires, actual or hypothetical. Let us call this the ‘objectivist’ interpretation of the BIP. Each interpretation will now be examined in turn.
The ‘objectivist’ interpretation of the BIP is beset by a number of difficulties. Some urge that what is best for any child is necessarily indeterminate. There certainly is no fact of the matter in this regard for we must attach values to the options and their outcomes in respect of any choice of action towards a child. However it will be said that independently of questions of value we cannot, with certainty, determine what is best for a child. We cannot in practice make complete and accurate assessments of what will be the outcome of each and every policy option that we might adopt in respect of a child (Mnookin 1979). How can we know with certainty whether this child will flourish if raised by this set of parents rather than by some others in an alternative setting? Even where we are seeking to rank the outcomes of the options within a simple custody dispute between mother and father things may prove impossibly difficult. After all, any number of things may happen if the child is in the mother's custody, and the same is true if the child is given to the father. The BIP is indeterminate even where there are only two possible decisions to be made (Elster 1989, 134–139).
This difficulty can be spelled out in the following fashion. Imagine that indeterminacy afflicts each of the four conditions of a full decision procedure (Parker 1994, 29–31). For a decision to be made the possible options must be known, the possible outcomes of each possible option must be known, the probabilities of each possible outcome occurring must be known, and the value of each outcome must be known. Independently of the uncertainty in respect of the last condition—value of the outcomes—there is uncertainty in respect of the other three conditions. This is probably true. However, it is not clear why the problem is one that is especially or uniquely true of policies affecting children. Any political or legal determination is going to face such indeterminacy in the specification of choices and their outcomes.
Of course once we put values back into the equation there is, arguably, clear indeterminacy. Moral pluralists will hold that it is not possible to rank as better or worse different kinds of life. They will say that it is not possible, in principle, to compare the lives of the fearless adventurer, contemplative scholar, and creative artist. Each realises its own distinctive but strictly incommensurable set of human excellences. How then can we say that there is a best life for a child to grow into, rather than a range of equally possible yet incomparable lives?
The pluralist claim is not directed uniquely at the case of children. The value of some at least of the lives of adults, are for the pluralist, strictly incomparable. Grant that the pluralist claim is false and assume that there is for each and every child a uniquely best life that it could be brought to lead. There is a still further difficulty. Even if moral pluralism as a claim about what is of ultimate objective value is set aside, the fact remains that we do happen to disagree in our basic values. Indeed it is a commonplace of contemporary moral and political philosophy that equally sincere, conscientious, and reasonable individuals espouse fundamentally different, and frequently conflicting, views about morality. There is what John Rawls has termed the ‘fact of pluralism’ (Rawls 1993, xvi-xvii). As a society we may be able to agree about what is a poor, neglectful or abusive upbringing, but we are likely to be in irresolvable disagreement about what is‘good’, even what is ‘better’, parenting (McGough 1995, 375). We just cannot agree what is in a child's best interests. This is important for a further reason. An education or upbringing shapes the values of the emerging adult. Whether the adult's life goes better or worse will depend crucially on how she evaluates her life in the light of these values. Educators and parents in acting for a child's best interest are also making a difference to the kind of adult thereby formed, and, in consequence, to the goodness of the life she will lead.
The fact of extensive disagreement about what is best for children, or for a child, is often set in the context of broader cultural disagreements about morality in general. It is said that the BIP is subverted, or at least rendered deeply problematic, by the existence of these deep and pervasive cultural disagreements (Alston (ed.) 1994). Care is needed. The statement ‘what is best for a child is different in different cultures’ is ambiguous. In the first place, the phrase ‘in different cultures’ may be interpreted as meaning something like ‘in different circumstances’. Most moral philosophers will acknowledge that a universal moral principle that all are agreed upon can nevertheless have differential application in differently specified circumstances. Here we do not dispute what in general terms is best for a child. But we do recognise that what it is best to do for any individual child will depend on the particular conditions in which that child finds itself.
On the other hand what is meant by the statement ‘what is best for a child is different in different cultures’ may be that there is no general agreement across cultures about what is best for a child. Each culture has its own understanding of what is in a child's best interests. There is a BIP specific to each culture. What culture A thinks is best for any child is best for any child. What culture B thinks is best for any child—even though it contradicts what culture A thinks best—is also what is best for any child. Moral relativism, in some form, has its defenders but its attendant problems are well documented.
If the claim ‘what is best for a child is different in different cultures’ is a report of cultural difference—what each culture believes to be best for its children differs—then it is still consistent with the BIP having a single universal content. What is best for children is the same whatever the culture, and allowing for the variation in application of the same principle to different contexts. It is just that some cultures do not adhere to the BIP in this form. However things are clearly not that simple. It is one thing to acknowledge in principle that there must be a single BIP; it is quite another to find agreement on what that principle is. The discussions surrounding the formulation of international conventions of human rights have been notoriously beset by significant, and culturally based, differences of moral and political outlook. The United Nations Conventions on the Rights of the Child was no different (LeBlanc 1995).
Even within single cultures which share a broad understanding of what is in a child's best interests there will nevertheless be some measure of disagreement. For instance, within Western societies there are continuing disputes about whether it is morally proper to smack a child.
By contrast with an ‘objectivist’ interpretation of the BIP what is best for a child can be understood in terms of a child's hypothetical choices. Strictly speaking a hypothetical choice interpretation of the BIP amounts to a distinct principle. It is one Buchanan and Brock define as that of the ‘substituted judgement’—‘acting according to what the incompetent individual, if competent, would choose’ (Buchanan and Brock 1989, 10). However it is natural to think that what is best for someone is what they themselves would choose if fully informed and deliberating fully rationally. Thus a striking and influential thought in this context is that we choose what is best for the child if we choose for the child as the child would choose for herself if the child were adult. For instance John Rawls thinks the following formulation defines the acceptable paternalism of a guardian's treatment of his child: ‘We must choose for others as we have reason to believe they would choose for themselves if they were at the age of reason and deciding rationally’ (Rawls 1999, 183). This apparently simple formulation is in fact susceptible of three quite different interpretations, each of which brings with it its own problems. In each case we are seeking to specify the adult person who chooses for the child.
We might first mean that we should choose for this child as the particular adult the child will become would choose. However this does not determine a unique choice for, crucially, the nature of the particular adult that the child will become depends on the choices that are made for it whilst a child. We can conceive of each of the different adult selves the child might develop into approving, respectively, of the different choices made for its childhood self—choices which were responsible for the development of these different selves. Let us take a very basic example. Should we allow the child to go off and play football with his peers, or require him to attend his violin lessons? The child who is allowed to play football becomes a well-paid sportsman who, retrospectively, approves of the decision to free him from music lessons which hampered his ability to develop his footballing skills. On the other hand the child who is made to practise his violin progresses to a fulfilling solo career. This adult—by contrast with the footballer he did not become—approves of the enforced musical education away from football that allowed him to have such a career.
The second sense we might give to the phrase ‘choose for the child as the child would if adult’ is by thinking of the situation in which the choice confronts the child, and then choosing as an adult would. The person who chooses for the child is any adult. This will serve well enough for some choices where there is no doubt as to what a rational adult would choose. In classic adult-child paternalistic scenarios we are not unclear or undecided about what we as adults should do. Would a rational adult choose to stick her hand in the fire, walk out into the traffic, eat whatever was placed in front of her? However if the adult is confronted with other sorts of choices the answer is far less clear. Faced with our imagined choice between playing football and a music lesson how would the adult choose? This of course is wholly indeterminate since different adults will presumably choose differently in the same situation. The adult who prefers football to music will choose the former; the adult who prefers music will choose otherwise.
This leads us then to the third possible interpretation. The adult person who chooses for the child is an adult analogue of the child. This is not the child's future adult self, which as we have seen is indeterminate, but this child made into an adult version of itself. That is, we do not imagine this child developing in the future into its particular adult self. Rather we imagine a mature or grown-up version of this child now making choices. This interpretation however will still not work. The adult version of the child is one with such beliefs and desires filtered out. But, in the first place, it is not clear what remains of the child in any choice situation rendered hypothetical in this fashion. For the child just is someone who has these childish beliefs and desires. What is it to be a child if not to think and want as a child does? Second, it is entirely indeterminate what should replace these beliefs and desires.
These varying interpretations of what it is to choose for a child as an adult would, and their attendant difficulties, display the problems of construing the best interests of a child in terms of the hypothetically adult choices the child would make. The problems are in the last analysis due to the following basic fact. In the cases of adults paternalistically choosing for other adults, and where the paternalism is warranted by a temporary failure of reason, we can have a determinate sense of how the adult would have chosen in the absence of the failure. If she had known that the bridge was unsafe she would have chosen not to cross it. If she was not persuaded by the influence of the drug to think she could fly she would not have decided to jump off the tall building. And so on.
However in the case of children we cannot cash out these hypothetical conditionals. We do not know what a child would choose if possessed of adult rational powers of choice because what makes a child a child just is its lack of such powers (its ignorance, inconstant wants, inconsistent beliefs, and limited powers of ratiocination). At the same time we cannot ask how an adult would choose if in the child's situation just because an adult would not be in that situation, or would not be in a child's situation. We must, it seems, choose for a child because a child cannot choose for itself, and we must choose what is best for a child not what some imagined adult version of the child would choose for itself.
The right to be heard is a valuable right. What makes it valuable is both that there is a point to making one's views known and, further, that making one's views known makes a difference. It matters to me that I can speak out on political questions. It matters also, and probably more, if what I say leads to the changes I favour. Correlatively it is true both that I do not want to be silenced and that I do not want the statement of my views to be ineffectual. As a further general point it is clear that there will always be some issues on which it is more important that I be allowed to speak and that what I say about these issues carries weight in determining outcomes. Those are the issues that matter to me, and the more they matter the more important it is that I have the freedom to speak about them and be heard. On one account since children's views should not be ‘authoritative’, that is determinative of what is done, they have only a ‘consultative’ role (Brighouse 2003). They may influence an outcome by, most obviously, providing those who do make the decisions affecting a child's interests with a clearer picture of what in fact is in those interests. On another account encouraging and according a weight to the expression of children's views—even where this is unlikely to affect outcomes in line with the views' content—is valuable just because the child is capable of expressing a view and deserves to be listened to (Archard and Skivenes 2009).
How is it with the child's right to be heard? It will be important for the child to be listened to. But it is also important that the child is heard in the sense that her views are given due consideration and may influence what is done. Note that the child's right to be heard on matters affecting its own interests is a substitute for the liberty right to make one's own choices. The right to be heard is only a right to have the opportunity to influence the person who will otherwise choose for the child. The power to make those choices resides with the adult guardian or representative of the child. All the child retains is the right to try to motivate that adult to choose as the child herself would choose if she was allowed to.
Article 12.1 of the United Nations Convention on the Rights of the Child not only accords the child the right freely to express its views on matters affecting the child. It also, and crucially, gives the child an assurance that these views will be given ‘due weight in accordance with the age and maturity of the child’. Great emphasis is now placed on what are termed a child's ‘participation rights’ as opposed to his or her ‘protection rights’. The latter, as the name suggests, protect the child from violent, abusive, cruel or exploitative treatment. ‘Participation rights’ by contrast, give the child some entitlement to be the agents of their own lives. Article 12.1 provides a crucial underpinning justification for such rights. There are problems in understanding how practically to implement such rights (Ang et al, 2006). There are also theoretical issues in making precise sense of what a right such as that enshrined in Article 12.1 might mean. The celebrated British legal judgement in the Gillick case (Gillick ) provides a useful guide. This judgement has been extensively if not exhaustively discussed, and it has also been highly influential in matters relating to the consent of children to medical treatment.
The Gillick judgement arose from the dissatisfaction of a mother with the failure of her local health authority to withdraw an advisory circular to the area's doctors. This advised doctors that they could counsel and inform young girls under the age of 16 about sexual matters as well as provide them with contraception, and that they could do this without the consent of the child's parents. The mother, Victoria Gillick, went to court to have the circular declared unlawful. The final judgement by the British House of Lords was that the circular was not unlawful. A key issue, relevant to the present discussion, concerned the proper relationship between the child's right to decide for itself and the parent's right to decide for the child.
In deciding in favour of the health authority one of the Law Lords, Lord Scarman, made a statement crucial to his finding and one that has subsequently been much cited. It is worth reproducing:
The underlying principle of the law … is that parental right yields to the child's right to make his own decisions when he reaches a sufficient understanding and intelligence to be capable of making up his own mind on the matter requiring decision.
I would hold that as a matter of law the parental right to determine whether or not their minor child below the age of 16 will have medical treatment terminates if and when the child achieves a sufficient understanding and intelligence to enable him to understand fully what is proposed. (Gillick  186, 188–9)
Let me now discuss various issues that arise. First, what does it mean for a child to get to a particular point in their development? On what could be called the threshold interpretation once a child has achieved a certain level of competence her views as to what shall happen to her have a determinate weight, either amounting to a liberty right of choice (on a strong version) or (on a weak version) being counted in the balance against her parents' views and the state's judgement of her best interests. On what could be called the proportionality interpretation the child's views progressively increase in weight as she gains a greater competence to choose for herself. They increase up to the acquisition of a full liberty right of choice.
Second, on either the threshold or the proportionality account we need a measure of that ability that marks the threshold or is simply progressively acquired. How much intelligence and understanding, for instance, is sufficient? In the first place this measure must be taken independently of any judgement of what is in the child's best interest. That a child would choose what is taken to be in her best interests is at most evidence that she does have sufficient intelligence and understanding of the relevant issue. Her making such a choice is not a necessary condition of her having the requisite ability. Similarly the making by a child of a poor choice is not conclusive evidence of her general incapacity to choose for herself. Wise adults can occasionally make stupid decisions just as fools sometimes get it right.
In the Gillick judgement Scarman required of the child that she manifest an understanding of the ‘nature’ of the contraceptive advice offered and ‘also have a sufficient maturity to understand what is involved’ (Gillick  189). We can distinguish here a number of possible elements. There is, first, knowledge of certain facts. A child, for instance, knows that a contraceptive acts to prevent conception that might otherwise result from sexual intercourse. Another child, by contrast, could simply be ignorant of or unable to comprehend the facts of reproduction. There is, second, an understanding of what follows for the child from an act or its omission. Thus failure to use a contraceptive could lead a young person who had sexual intercourse to become pregnant. These two understandings together constitute knowledge of the ‘nature’ of the act. Finally there is what arguably comes with ‘maturity’ which is the ability to appreciate the significance both of an act or its omission and of the relevant consequences. It is one thing to know what it is to become pregnant, and another to understand what that means. This latter understanding involves realising that pregnancy brings in its wake physical changes, that any resultant birth leaves a young person with a child to care for, and so on. Scarman even insisted that the child would need to have an appreciation of the ‘moral and family’ questions involved.
Third, it is important in measuring a child's competence against that in respect of which he or she is expressing a view to distinguish between the complexity and the seriousness of the matter. A simple choice—for instance that between only two options such as whether or not to have a life-saving operation—may nevertheless be portentous, having enormous and far-reaching consequences. It may thus require much greater appreciation of what is involved than a more complex decision, one that ranges over many possibilities. Yet the latter kind of choice—consider choosing a five-course meal from a very large menu—is far less serious in its consequences. In short, the difficulty or complexity of a choice should not be confused with its importance or significance for the child.
Fourth, the English courts at least have detected a fundamental asymmetry between refusing and choosing to have treatment. A competent adult has a right both to choose to have treatment and to refuse it. Should this not also be the case with a competent child? A 15-year-old who wants to have a particular operation against her parents' wishes and even contrary to the best judgement of her doctors may be judged competent and thus have her wishes respected. However the English courts in a series of judgements after Gillick have argued that matters are somehow different when it is a case of a child refusing an operation.
Of course there is no inconsistency if a refusal requires a greater degree of understanding and appreciation of the issues than a positive acceptance. But where the choice is a simple disjunction it is hard to see how this can be the case. Are not the issues at stake the same for both disjuncts? If the courts believe that an obligation to act in the best interests of the child trumps one to respect the wishes of a competent child it needs to be shown why this obligation does not have force in all circumstances. Why would a court not deny treatment to a child it does not believe in her best interests when it judges her competent to choose? If a child is competent then she is in all significant and relevant respects the equal of an adult and should be able both to choose and to refuse treatment.
Three final comments on the child's right to choose are in order. First, what is deemed to be in the child's best interests is evidence for but not finally determinative of a judgement as to the competence of the child. Nevertheless balancing a child's right to be heard against a child's right to have its best interests promoted is difficult. Second, it is arguably enough to show a child's competence that a child understands the nature of the act. After all no more is needed for an adult's consent to be informed. In the law of contract adults need only to know what they are signing up to. They do not need a full appreciation of the contract's significance and of its import for their future lives. Third, Gillick competence as specified is very demanding. Indeed there are many adults who in making their choices fail to display the maturity and ‘understanding of what is involved’ that is dictated as necessary for the child. Why then should a child have to display a competence that many adults lack both in general and in particular cases?
One important, indeed central, manner of understanding the moral status of the child is by questioning whether or not children have rights. It is normally thought that according to the ‘will’ theory of rights children cannot have rights, whereas according to the ‘interest’ theory they can. It is, however, at least possible on the ‘will’ theory that children could have rights, albeit ones that are exercised by trustees or representatives.
Child ‘liberationists’ claim that children have all the rights that adults do. Others deny this, either believing that children have no rights or believing that children have only some of the rights which adults possess. Those who believe children have no rights deny that children are qualified as adults are to have rights. They further argue that the ascription of rights to children manifests a misunderstanding of what children are like and of the nature of family relationships. Those who deny children all or some of the rights possessed by adults nevertheless believe that children, as humans, have a certain moral status that ought to be protected.
Those who say that drawing a line between adults and children in respect of their possession of rights is arbitrary may mean different things. To deny that different capacities are progressively acquired at different ages is implausible. To insist that drawing a line as such is wrong ignores the point of doing so, and recourse to the alternative of a competency test is not appropriate or practicable. On the standard view children have welfare but not liberty rights, whereas adults have both. Adults also have the right that their childhood selves shall grow up to be adults of a certain sort. Children do not have an interest in remaining in childhood.
The best-interest principle should arguably have only limited application. It is not possible unambiguously to interpret the best interests of a child in terms of a hypothetical adult self, and any objective interpretation will be the subject of contested views. A child's right to be heard in matters affecting its interests is a substitute not a complement to the right of choosing for herself, and the Gillick competence which qualifies a child to exercise its rights of decision-making is arguably stringently defined.
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