Notes to Rule-Following and Intentionality

1. We’re following Paul Boghossian (1989) in this respect. We won’t address the issue of the extent to which Kripke’s interpretation is faithful to Wittgenstein’s text. Note that Kripke does not actually endorse either the sceptical argument or the sceptical solution, but rather “expounds Wittgenstein’s argument as it struck Kripke, as it presented a problem for him” (1982: 5). For ease of exposition, we largely ignore this in the text. For recent discussion of what is at stake in Wittgenstein’s rule-following considerations, see, among others, Stroud 2011, Goldfarb 2012, Ebbs 2016, and Ginsborg 2020. Other works that foreground the importance of the rule-following investigations in Wittgenstein’s later philosophy include Wright (1980) and Fogelin (1976 [1987]). A discussion of the rule-following considerations that locates them in a philosophical tradition going back to Kant can be found in Haase (2009).

2. In his 1989, Boghossian appears to suggest that, for the sceptical arguments to get going at the level of content, we need to assume that mental content properties are carried by linguistic-bearers, although it is left open whether we need to view these bearers as, in Fodorian Language of Thought fashion, syntactically and semantically structured; we agree with the more liberal line taken in Boghossian 1990, where Boghossian recognizes that we don’t need to exploit any facts about the putative bearers of content in order to get the sceptical arguments going.

3. We use the singular pronoun when explaining the sceptical challenge, even though the entry is co-written, as the challenge is supposed to be faced from the perspective of the individual speaker.

4. Among the commentators who resist reading the second condition as requiring that meaning facts are categorically prescriptive are Kusch 2006, Verheggen 2000, 2011, and Bridges 2014. (Note that in his 2021 CUNY seminar on rule-following, attended by the authors, Kripke himself said that he had only hypothetical prescriptivity in mind.)

5. For example, in the “two soldiers” variant of the Prisoners’ Dilemma that Mackie outlines (1977: 115), the judgement that one ought not to desert one’s post in the face of the enemy—where the “ought” in question is categorical—although false, is such that its acceptance helps to make probable the best possible outcome for the group (in a non-moral sense of “best”).

6. Another example of a non-eliminativist error theory is arguably provided by Hartry Field’s nominalism about arithmetic (Field 1980, 1989). In Field’s account, the subsidiary norm is cashed out in terms of the notion of conservativeness. (We take the term “subsidiary norm” from Wright 1995. Wright goes on to argue that non-eliminativist error theories are inherently unstable.)

7. Kripke himself thinks that the mention of agreement here requires a departure from fully individualistic conceptions of meaning and content. See also sections 12 and 13 of Boghossian 1989 (and the references therein to McGinn 1984 and Goldfarb 1985) for more discussion.

8. For what it’s worth, Gibbard’s reply strikes us as unconvincing. In the course of defending and developing his account of moral judgement, the ethical expressivist can help herself to facts about what is and what is not pleasurable. But she cannot assume that such facts are moral facts without compromising her claim to be providing an alternative account of moral judgement to that given by the moral realist. Likewise, although the expressivist in the case of meaning and content may help herself to facts about speakers’ dispositions, or facts about biological function and the like, she cannot assume that such facts are semantic or intentional facts without compromising her claim to be providing an alternative account of ascriptions of meaning and content to that provided by the semantic realist. However, in helping herself to facts about plans or planning states with determinate satisfaction conditions, she does precisely that. For further useful discussion of Gibbard’s view, see Wikforss (2018), and Boghossian (forthcoming).

9. Some philosophers have viewed the sceptical solution proposed by Kripke’s Wittgenstein as hospitable to a form of non-reductionism, albeit one that is different from the non-reductionist position rejected by him in his brief discussion in Kripke (1982: chapter 2). Over the course of that discussion, Kripke says of the non-reductionist strategy that if “taken in an appropriate way Wittgenstein may even accept it” (1982: 51). Consequently, some have argued that the sceptical solution illustrates the appropriate way to take non-reductionism, a way that rejects some of the sceptic’s assumptions. According to Kusch, for example, Kripke proposes a meaning-sceptical variety of primitivism. The view is a form of primitivism insofar as it takes our linguistic inclinations to be primitive (2006: 38, 199), but it is sceptical insofar as it rejects the conception of meaning targeted by the sceptical argument, which Kusch calls “low brow meaning determinism” (see 2006: 11–12 for an enumeration of its basic tenets). In a nutshell, according to meaning-determinism, an agent means something by an expression in virtue of having a particular mental state that is immediately known by the agent, is intrinsic to her, guides and justifies her uses of the expression, and somehow contains all the possible correct applications of the expression. Indeed, meaning determinism is closely related to Wilson’s classical realism. In a similar vein, David Davies argues that we should view the sceptical solution as claiming that

there are semantic facts, but they cannot play any significant explanatory role with respect to our dispositions to go on in similar ways with respect to our expressions. (1998: 133; cf. Byrne 1996)

and Sultanescu and Verheggen argue that

Kripke’s non-reductionism [as manifested in the sceptical solution] is ultimately a capitulation to quietism, (2019: 16)

for it

sheds little light, if any, on the question what makes it possible for there to be a distinction between correct and incorrect applications of expressions. (2019: 15)

10. If this is scepticism about a disposition, it is not epistemological scepticism of the sort put to one side in Kripke’s discussion. The claim is not that we don’t know what Jones’s extended dispositions in the relevant cases are, but that there are no such dispositions.

11. These considerations effectively rule out a response to the finitude problem that utilizes the notion of an idealized disposition. We’ve so far tacitly assumed that ascriptions of dispositions can be analysed in terms of counterfactual or subjunctive conditionals, as follows:

S is disposed to A in C” is true iff if S were in conditions C, she would A.

Say we assume also that the conditional on the right-hand side is true iff in every nearby possible world in which S is in conditions C, she As. We could try to deal with the finitude problem by including within the ideal conditions C some stipulation that would ensure that S’s cognitive capacity is sufficiently enhanced to allow her to answer arithmetical queries that are inaccessible given her actual cognitive equipment. In some cases, though, this will involve S having a brain the size of the universe, and since there are no nearby possible worlds in which S has a brain the size of a universe (for the sorts of reason outlined above), the conditional

If S had a brain the size of the universe (etc.), she would respond with the sum

will not be true in a way that can underwrite the ascription to S of the disposition to respond with the sum.

Some philosophers (e.g., Martin and Heil 1998) have attempted to use the fact that (CA) is problematic (Martin 1994) in order to ward off Kripke-style objections like those outlined above. Handfield and Bird (2008) provide a powerful critique of Martin and Heil’s defence of the dispositional theory of meaning (see Boghossian 2015: 342–3 for a useful summary).

12. In Warren’s terminology, Jones has an M-general and stable disposition to produce the sum in normal situations (see Warren 2020: 271).

13. The argument in this paragraph might be criticised for conflating logical and metaphysical notions of consistency and determination, as follows. Consider again the claim that possession of disp is consistent with multiple hypotheses about what Jones means. If the notion of consistency at play is logical, then this is surely correct. But, the thought goes, Warren’s idea must be that disp constitutes or determines or grounds the meaning fact; this kind of metaphysical relationship between disp and the meaning fact does not require that the ascription of disp be logically inconsistent with alternative hypotheses about what Jones means.

However, it seems to us that the criticism misses the dialectical force of the argument. For the argument isn’t simply that, since possession of disp is consistent with Jones’s meaning quaddition, it can’t be constitutive of his meaning addition. (If this was the argument, it would indeed be susceptible to the criticism.) Rather, the argument concerns the way in which disp is characterised or specified. Given that Jones’s possession of disp is logically consistent with her meaning any one of an infinite set of functions by “+”, how do we characterise the normal situation involved in the specification of disp in such a way that, of all the functions in that infinite range, it is addition that is metaphysically determined by it? On what grounds does dispositionalist claim that an adequate characterisation can be given in wholly non-semantic and non-intentional terms, that is, without presupposing that addition is what is in fact meant by Jones?

14. We’ve oversimplified here, glossing over the fact that Warren’s solution to the finitude problem utilizes the notion of a composite disposition (itself consisting of what Warren calls “singular” dispositions) and that the solution to the error problem upon which it depends focuses on the singular dispositions out of which the composite disposition is composed. Nothing crucial turns on this oversimplification, though.

15. Scott Soames also seems to neglect Kripke’s discussion of non-reductionism when he claims that the challenge posed by Kripke’s sceptic is “to locate non-content-bearing (i.e. nonintentional) facts that determine the content-bearing ones” (1997: 216n16).

16. More specifically, Wright’s project is to show that the proponent of non-reductionism might be able to avoid the “flagrant … philosophical stone-kicking” that he claims to find in other non-reductionist views, such as Colin McGinn’s (Wright 1989 [2002: 113]). Wright argues that we can account for the intuitive first-person epistemology and “disposition-like theoreticity” (Wright 2001: 87) of intentional and semantic properties by relying on a judgment-dependent account of the sort outlined. Such an account takes for granted the contents of the judgements on which meaning facts allegedly depend, which is what makes it a variety of non-reductionism. (See Wright [1992: 138]. Boghossian [1989 [2002: 184–85]] argues that judgement-dependent accounts of content are problematic in a way that does not apply to judgement-dependent accounts of traditional secondary qualities.)

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Alexander Miller <>
Olivia Sultanescu <>

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