Notes to Ruth Barcan Marcus

1. We are concerned with logical systems that meet contemporary standards of formality and systematicity. Lewis and Langford (1932: 178–198) put forward a postulate which quantifies over propositions, but do not develop first-order modal systems. Carnap 1946, which was published just a few months after Barcan’s paper, fully develops a first-order quantified modal system.

2. This entry adopts \(\rightarrow\) for material implication in place of Lewis’s and Barcan’s horseshoe, \(\Rightarrow\) for strict implication in place of their fishhook sign, \(\leftrightarrow\) for material equivalence in place of the triple bar, \(\Leftrightarrow\) for strict equivalence in place of the quadruple bar, and \(\land\) in place of \(\cdot\) for conjunction. Additional divergences from various authors, including Barcan, won’t be signalled unless needed to avoid confusion. With a few exceptions, the formal symbols are also used to refer to themselves, as in this note.

3. Barcan does not write down this theorem, so it is not numbered.

4. We set aside the question that if in the forties Barcan’s interpretation of strict implication is in terms of deducibility, then also the definition of identity should be read in terms of deducibility. In any case, the notion of necessity at stake is logical.

5. In what follows Barcan’s proofs are reported without the detailed formal justifications of the steps. Justifications are discussed informally. Barcan does not informally discuss her proofs.

6. In this paragraph talk of two objects is useful to keep track of the two variables in the theorems. But it is also not trivial that indiscernibility, even necessary indiscernibility, should hold only between an object and itself.

7. In her early writings, when her focus is on logical necessity, Barcan like most philosophers at the time, does not explicitly distinguish the notions of logical truth, logical necessity, tautology, and analyticity.

8. So does Carnap (1946) who explicitly assumes one unique denumerable domain.

9. This is a slightly reformulated version of the principle. In the rest of this discussion we drop all qualifications (reflective, sincere etc.) but they remain in place. In our discussion we greatly simplify Kripke’s account, which is not the focus of this entry.

10. Kripke appeals also to a principle of translation which justifies our reporting that Pierre believes that London is pretty based on his assent to the French sentence.

11. This too is a slightly rephrased version of Marcus’s formulation.

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