Notes to Jean-Paul Sartre

1. In similar fashion, Jacques Derrida expressed some bemusement about Sartre’s fame, asking:

…What must a society such as ours be if a man [that is Sartre], who in his own way, rejected or misunderstood so many theoretical and literary events of his time—let’s say, to go quickly, psychoanalysis, Marxism, structuralism, Joyce, Artaud, Bataille, Blanchot—who accumulated and disseminated incredible misreadings of Heidegger and sometimes of Husserl, could come to dominate the cultural scene to the point of becoming a great popular figure? (Derrida 1992 [1995: 122])

It is an interesting question that Derrida poses, but it is also of its time (1983) and does not engage at all with what is significant and singular about Sartre’s own work.

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