Notes to Scientific Representation

1. Different formulations of this problem can be found in Frigg (2002: 2, 17), Morrison (2008: 70), and Suárez (2003: 230), and many contributors to the debate tacitly assume a formulation of the problem in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions. Analysing concepts in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions has had some bad press in other corners of philosophy; see Laurence and Margolis (1999) for a review and discussion. Space constraints prevent us from pursuing this issue. We want to flag, however, that, if restricted to core cases, the standard arguments against such an analysis lose much of their bite.

2. There seems to be widespread agreement on this point. Bolinska (2013) and Contessa (2007) both refer to models “epistemic representations”, and Bailer-Jones (2003: 59), Frigg (2006: 51), Liu (2013: 93), Morgan and Morrison (1999: 11); Suárez (2003: 229) and Weisberg (2013: 150) have, in different ways, emphasised that studying a scientific representation must be able to inform us about the nature of a target system. A noteworthy exception is Callender and Cohen (2006); we discuss their views in Section 2.

3. Styles can be accounted for in the ER-Scheme in at least three ways: (i) have a different scheme for every kind of representation; (ii) allow \(C\) to be a disjunctive relation where every disjunct describes a particular style; or (iii) by finding a determinable \(C\) that has the different styles as its determinates. For a discussion of these options see (Frigg and Nguyen forthcoming: sec. 2).

4. See Frigg (2006: 50). Even though the problem of style has not received much explicit attention, the literature on models is rife with notions that can be interpreted as contributions to the problem of style—analogical models, idealised models and caricature models are but some obvious examples. For a survey see the SEP entry on Models in Science.

5. Our discussion is not premised on the claim that all models are representational; nor does it assume that representation is the only (or even primary) function of models. It has been emphasised variously in the debate that models perform a number of functions other than representation; see Knuuttila (2005, 2011), Morgan and Morrison (1999), Hartmann (1995) and Peschard (2011) for discussion of different non-representational uses of models. Our question is how models represent when they represent.

6. There is, however, another sense, in which we presuppose a minimal form of realism. Throughout our discussion we assume that target systems exist independently of human observers, and that they are how they are irrespective of what anybody thinks about them. This is a presupposition constructivists (and other metaphysical antirealists) deny. Lynch and Wooglar (1990), for instance, argue that representations constitute the phenomena they represent. An assessment of the constructivist programme is beyond the scope of this review. It is worth observing, though, that at least some of the issues we discuss in what follows would reappear in a constructivist framework in the guise of the problem of how different representations relate to one another.

7. In aesthetics the term “resemblance” is used more commonly than “similarity”, but there does not seem to be a substantive difference between the notions and we use them interchangeably; see Abell (2009) and Lopes (2004) for relatively current discussions of similarity in aesthetics.

8. For difficulties in how to cash out this notion of correspondence without reference to an interpretation function see Halvorson (2012) and Glymour (2013).

9. We note that Hughes himself does not refer to his position as “inferential” or “inferentialism”. This classification is owed to Suárez (2004: 770) and Contessa (2011: 126). See Suárez (2015) for an extensive discussion about the relationship between Hughes’ account and inferentialism.

10. Many works of art do not literally instantiate the properties they exemplify. Pictures and statues cannot instantiate properties like speed and elegance; they are made of paper or bronze. Goodman and Elgin acknowledge this and say that these are examples of metaphorical exemplification (Elgin 1983: 81). A painting can literally instantiate the property of being grey; it can metaphorically instantiate sadness (Goodman 1976, 50-52).

Copyright © 2016 by
Roman Frigg <>
James Nguyen <>

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