Notes to Underdetermination of Scientific Theory

1. For example, if the evidence we have supports the generalization “all donuts are delicious”, then it will equally well support the generalization “all donuts are shmelicious”, where ‘schmelicious’ means “delicious if made and eaten before the year 2028 and inedible if made or eaten afterwards”. But we will have very different expectations about the taste of the first donut we bite into in 2028 if we believe that what we’ve been accumulating all these years is evidence for the schmeliciousness rather than the deliciousness of donuts. Goodman recognizes the temptation to dismiss predicates like “schmelicious” as artificial or contrived, but insists that such artificiality is simply a consequence of the “entrenchment” in our language of other predicates we accept, rather than a language-independent fact about the world. For more details see his (1955).

2. Donald Gilles (1993) and Larry Laudan (1990) have each also suggested that multiple, distinct theses have been mistakenly conflated as “the” thesis of underdetermination, but each proceeds to divide up the terrain much differently than I have. Perhaps most importantly, in these discussions their attention is confined almost exclusively to versions of what I am calling holist underdetermination.

3. Actually, the outcome of the experiment was simply that a greenish spot of light appeared to the right of a whitish spot of light, which helps to illustrate the problem: without further background information or auxiliary hypotheses this does not even show anything about the speed of light in water or air, much less the particulate or wave nature of light.

4. In later work (1990) Quine would revise this to the view that the unit of testing is a “critical semantic mass” of claims, but would continue to insist that this is a perfectly general feature of knowledge claims or beliefs.

5. This shows, incidentally why there is something misleading about the oft-voiced complaint that Quinean underdetermination rests upon a crude hypothetico-deductive view of confirmation: on Quine’s view, any account of confirmation we might embrace is itself just another feature of the web of our beliefs, and our continued adherence to it rather than some alternative (including, but certainly not limited to, a crude hypothetico-deductivism) is itself part of what stands in need of explanation.

6. Because the two problems are so tightly linked in Quine’s epistemology, it is perhaps understandable that he gives no independent argument for taking contrastive underdetermination seriously: in what is usually cited as his most famous defense of contrastive underdetermination (though not usually distinguished from the holist variety), he simply announces, “Surely there are alternative hypothetical substructures that would surface in the same observable ways” (1975, 313). Those who do not share Quine’s radical holism must therefore start from scratch in deciding whether contrastive scientific underdetermination is worth taking seriously.

7. Here again holist and contrastive versions of underdetermination make historical contact, as the prospect of empirically equivalent webs of knowledge or “systems of the world” was first raised by Quine in a holist context (1975). Note also that while one might respond to van Frassen’s example by treating such empirically equivalent rivals as evidence that both have “surplus structure” and trying to find an alternative formulation that preserves their common commitments and eliminates any such surplus, (1) there is no general guarantee that this will be possible and (2) this would only eliminate (rather than simply ignore) empirical equivalence between these various formulations of the theory (i.e. making them “notational variants” of a single theory, c.f. below) given some very strong assumptions about how theoretical scientific claims acquire their meaning (c.f. Sklar 1982).

8. This line of thought closely parallels, of course, Laudan’s appeal to further “ampliative standards” of reasoning in response to holist underdetermination in Section 2, above.

9. John Norton (2008) has argued, however, that this example simply involves two notational variants of a single theory. Considerable attention has been devoted to investigating the grounds on which we should or should not hold empirical equivalents to be different ways of expressing one and the same theory; classic work includes Glymour (1970, 1977, 1980) and Sklar (1982), while more recent work includes Halvorson (2012, 2013) and Glymour (2013).

10. John Manchak (2009) has argued that this example is even stronger than it appears, as underdetermination persists even if we permit ourselves the assumption that all physical laws we determine locally apply throughout the universe as a whole.

11. Stanford argues that a similar analysis applies to some famous examples of empirical equivalents, such as the notorious prospect of a continuously shrinking universe whose physical constants are also changing so as to make this undetectable to us. And a further change of fundamental subject arises with the suggestion that a theory’s “Craigian reduction” (essentially, a statement of all and only that theory’s observable consequences) serves as an empirical equivalent to it: the challenge posed by contrastive underdetermination was supposed to be that there might be more than one account of the otherwise inaccessible workings of nature behind the phenomena that were well confirmed by the evidence, not simply (as we already knew) that it is open to us to believe only a theory’s observable consequences (as van Fraassen’s constructive empiricism recommends) rather than also believing its further claims.

Copyright © 2023 by
Kyle Stanford <>

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